Notes to Panpsychism

1. Another Presocratic philosopher who has been said to espouse panpsychism for reasons similar in form to those of Thales (that is, via analogy and indeed an analogy with motion production) is Anaximenes (whose dates within the sixth century BCE are uncertain), who identified “air” (or “breath”) with soul or mind, thus making mind ubiquitous.

2. Empedocles is sometimes regarded as a panpsychist because of the universal role of love and strife (see Edwards 1967 for example) but there seems little of the mental in Empedocles’s conceptions, which are rather more like forces of aggregation and dis-aggregation respectively (see Barnes 1982: 308 ff.).

3. The distinction was further developed later by John Locke, who came up with the names “primary” and “secondary” qualities.

4. In contrast to Descartes, Galileo conceived of the soul in Aristotelian terms, as the principle of animation in the body (corpo sensitivo). See Ben-Yami 2015: ch. 3 for more discussion of this.

5. Although philosophically marginal, an intellectually significant figure worth mentioning as an example of a twentieth century panpsychist of some influence is Teilhard de Chardin (1881–1955). This mystic Roman Catholic polymath endorsed a kind of world-soul (thus embracing what Hartshorne called a “synecological” form of panpsychism), which he called the ’noosphere’, and urged that the old conception of matter and mind be replaced with a new notion of “matter-spirit”. The noosphere is the culmination of the evolution of consciousness (which is a continuation of biological evolution). But to avoid the discontinuity of emergentism, de Chardin embraced panpsychism.

6. For a clear introduction to, and defense of, Whitehead’s panpsychism see Griffen (1998); another interpretation, and pantheistic reworking, can be found in the writings of Charles Hartshorne (1897–2000), for example, in Hartshorne 1972.

7. Most people trace this way of defining consciousness back to Nagel (1974), although it appears earlier in Sprigge and Montefiore (1971).

8. Chalmers defines constitutive panpsychism as the view that macro-level consciousness is constituted of micro-level consciousness, but this rules out cosmopsychism (discussed below) as a form of constitutive panpsychism.

9. See McLaughlin (1992) for a good discussion of non-panpsychist forms of emergentism.

10. The term “protophenomenal” comes from Chalmers 1996.

11. I am implicitly assuming a fairly standard understanding of physicalism according to which it is necessary condition for its truth that fundamental reality lacks mental or proto-mental features, see, for example, Goff 2017: ch. 2. The definition of physicalism is contested; see Ney 2008 for a good survey of options. Galen Strawson (2006a) adopts a much broader definition of physicalism, and hence refers to his panpsychism as a form of “physicalism”.

12. Shani (2015) defends a view according to which human and animal minds are partially grounded in facts about the cosmos.

13. See Nagasawa forthcoming for an examination of interconnections between panpsychism and pantheism.

14. Russellian monism has historical precedence in Schopenhauer and Leibniz, as discussed above.

15. This is a fairly standard defence of Russsellian monism, e.g., Chalmers 2015, Goff 2017: ch. 6. Howell 2014 attempts to respond to it.

16. Russellian monism is standardly taken to be a form of constitutive panpsychism/panprotopsychism. However, there are emergentist forms. In contrast to what I said in the last sentence of the main body of text, emergentist Russellian monists would be trying to account for the causal emergence rather than the grounding of human consciousness. Because of this difference, it is not clear that emergentist Russellian monists are able to reconcile mental causation with the causal closure of the physical world. For more discussion see Chalmers 2015 and Goff 2017: ch. 6.

17. For detailed philosophical explications of the problem of consciousness see Chalmers 2009 and Goff 2017.

18. If, as most emergentist panpsychists believe, the production of macro-level consciousness from micro-level consciousness is an intelligible process (in the sense that understanding the nature of the micro-level properties would allow one to predict the emergence of macro-level consciousness), then the resulting macro-level consciousness would not be “emergent” in Nagel’s sense.

19. Constitutive cosmopsychists should not be thought of as committed to radical emergence, so long as facts about the parts of the cosmos are intelligibly grounded in facts about the cosmos as a whole.

20. Paul Edwards (1967) divided arguments for panpsychism into the two broad categories of genetic and analogical.

21. Mørch (2014, forthcoming) argues that our idea of causation comes from consciousness, and then uses this as the basis for an argument for panpsychism.

22. Historical precedent for the combination problem can be found in Lucretius ([c50 BCE] 2007) and Clarke ([1707–18] 2011).

23. Basile (2010) presents a similar concern regarding the possibility of mental combination. Roelofs (2016) responds to both of these arguments. Montero (2016) and Goff (2017: ch. 7) respond to Coleman’s argument.

24. Roelofs (2015: 59–72 & 103–116) argues against the conceivability of microexperiential zombies.

Notes to the Supplement

1. Strawson is not happy to accept the existence of contingent laws, which partly motivates his argument discussed in the section The Anti-Emergence Argument.

2. This problem is arguably also faced by the emergentist panpsychism who postulates brute laws of nature. If brute laws are to explain the production of macro-level consciousness, why not just postulate brute laws connecting non-phenomenal properties to macro-level phenomenal properties?

3. See also Roelofs’ (2016) discussion of experience sharing in relation to subject-summing, a possible solution we won’t have space to discuss here.

Copyright © 2017 by
Philip Goff <>
William Seager
Sean Allen-Hermanson

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]