Medieval Theories of Obligationes
Obligationes (literally, “obligations”) or disputations de obligationibus were a medieval disputation format that became very widespread in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Although their name might suggest they had something especially to do with ethics or moral duty, they did not. The purpose of these disputations was strictly logical. Several kinds of disputations de obligationibus were distinguished in the medieval literature. The most widely studied kind to date was called “positio” (= positing). It is difficult or even impossible to map the genre to the genres of modern logic, but issues involved include at least counterfactual and per impossibile reasoning, and dynamic commitment to remain logically consistent. Disputations de obligationibus appear to lay at the background of the modern practice of the academic “thesis defense.”
- 1. Origins of the disputations de obligationibus
- 2. Positio
- 3. The purpose of the disputations
- 4. Other kinds of obligatio
- 5. Conclusion
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Aristotle’s logical works, especially Topics, assume a disputational setting as a primary context for logical inference. In a manner closely similar to Socratic questioning procedures in Plato’s dialogues, the disputations Aristotle had in mind have two participants, and possibly an audience to serve as a judge between the participants. The opponent (questioner) leads the disputation through putting forward propositions which the respondent (answerer) typically either grants or denies.
The disputation as described by Aristotle in Topics concentrates on some thesis taken as a starting point. The opponent’s internal aim in the disputation is to build against the thesis an argument through propositions granted by the respondent, and perhaps opposites of those denied. If the opponent successfully achieves this aim, the respondent will have to grant the opposite of the discussed thesis because of the inferential force of the propositions granted during the disputation. The disputation thus becomes a refutation of the thesis, or its own starting point.
As already Aristotle recognized in Topics, finding out whether a certain thesis is true is not the only purpose for such disputations. The opponent and the respondent may well decide to undertake a disputation on a thesis that is already at the beginning known to be false or even impossible. It is this kind of disputation that is at issue in the treatises on obligationes. Disputations de obligationibus were not about finding out the facts of any matter.
The medieval disputations de obligationibus regulate the Platonic-Aristotelian structure further through considering situations where the respondent admits some specified disputational duty (obligatio) to be followed during the technical disputation. From at least the early thirteenth century onwards, independent treatises as well as discussions as parts of larger works are dedicated on how to conduct disputations de obligationibus. This literature was regarded as belonging to logic, and the study of obligationes became part of the logic curriculum followed by undergraduates.
The usual title “obligationes” means obligations in the normative sense of duties. The treatises prescribe explicitly what the respondent (and to some extent what the opponent) may and may not do in such a disputation. Treatises on obligationes are thus not works in deontic logic. What is “obligatory” is strictly limited to the general logical obligation not to contradict oneself in a disputation and to some specific logical obligation that the opponent gives to the respondent in the beginning of the disputation. Even the general moral duty to be honest and grant to one’s opponent what one believes to be true is limited to a very marginal role in these highly technical disputations.
The most important background assumption of obligational disputations is the conditional obligation that if one grants the premises of a logically valid inference, one has to grant the conclusion as well. Treatises on obligationes studied how this duty is to be applied in a context where the premises are not granted for the sole reason of granting what is true, but for some other duty, for example, an imposed duty to grant a premise known to be false or even impossible, just for the sake of examining the logical relations between certain chosen propositions.
There were several kinds or “species” of obligationes. Accepting a false or impossible proposition as something that has to be granted (or “positing”) was the most commonly discussed. But the early Obligationes Parisienses, for example, distinguishes six kinds; the same six are found also in Walter Burley and William of Ockham: positing (positio), counterpositing (depositio), “let it be doubted” (dubitetur), institution (institutio), the truth of the matter (rei veritas), and petition (petitio). Apart from “positing,” most of these kinds of obligationes have been little studied in the modern literature.
Some late-medieval authors claimed that the theoretical basis for obligationes came from two passages in Aristotle (Prior Analytics I.13.32a18–20, Metaphysics IX.4.1047b10–12), both of which say merely that when something possible is posited, nothing impossible results. These Aristotelian texts are relevant, but not crucial for the historical origins of the obligationes literature. The first treatises on obligationes are earlier than the ready availability of the Metaphysics in Latin translation, and do not mention either passage. Moreover, while it is certainly true that obligational disputations never require an impossibility to follow when a possibility is posited, that fact does not by itself account for some of the most characteristic features of obligationes. Indeed, some of the earliest discussions concern what happens not when a possibility is posited, but when an impossibility is posited. 
It is precisely this feature, in fact, that at least two early treatises attribute to Aristotle:
And Aristotle says this. For he says, “The impossible is to be posited so that it may be seen what follows on that basis.”
That positing the impossible has to be maintained is proved as follows: For just as we say that the possible is to be conceded so that it may be seen what follows on that basis, likewise we have it from Aristotle that the impossible is to be conceded so that it may be seen what happens on that basis.
It seems thus more probable to connect obligational disputations to Aristotle’s per impossibile arguments, which had been discussed by at least Boethius and Ibn Rushd.
The most widely discussed kind of obligatio, both in the medieval literature and in recent scholarship, is no doubt positio or “positing.” In a positio the “opponent” begins by saying “I posit that p.” The proposition p is called the “positum.” The “respondent” then says either “I admit it” or “I deny it,” depending on certain conditions. For example, the treatises by Roger Swyneshed, Robert Eland, and Richard Lavenham all stipulate that in order for the positum to be “admissible,” it must be a contingent proposition. Other authors, as we have seen above, allow the positum to be an impossible proposition, provided that its impossibility is not “manifest,” so that the proposition can be entertained and believed. We shall not consider such cases here.
If the positio is admitted, the disputation is under way: The opponent then “proposes” to the respondent a series of propositions, one after another. Admitting a positio is not the same thing as conceding a proposition. By admitting a positio the respondent accepts to having the duty to concede the positum if it is put forward as a propositum, and any other duties deriving from this duty. In practice this means that the respondent must evaluate each proposition, or propositum put forward by the opponent with recognition of the duty accepted by admitting the positio. To each propositum put forward by the opponent the respondent must reply by saying “I concede it,” “I deny it,” or “I doubt it,”. The correct response is guided by rules given in the treatises, and different authors give somewhat different rules. Below we discuss the two most important approaches to the rules, called “the old response” and “the new response” by Eland. They can be identified as the rules given by Walter Burley and Roger Swyneshed. 
According to both of these sets of rules, the correct response depends in part on whether the propositum is “relevant” or “irrelevant” (pertinens/impertinens), and if it is relevant whether it is “sequentially relevant” or “incompatibly relevant” (pertinens sequens/pertinens repugnans). The specification of these notions and of how they affect the correct response to the propositum constitutes the kernel of the theory of positio, and varied from author to author.
Given the variance in the ways different authors give the rules, it may appear that the rules are stipulated, and the disputation appears like a game. On this reading, the participant would have to agree at the beginning which set of rules are followed in the incipient disputation.
- For each step n of the disputation, beginning with the first propositum as step 1, the propositum is “sequentially relevant” at step n if and only if it logically follows from the conjunction of the positum together with any proposita that have been conceded at earlier steps of the disputation, and together with the contradictories of any proposita that have been denied at earlier steps. The propositum is “incompatibly relevant” at step n if and only if its contradictory follows from that same conjunction. It is “irrelevant” at step n if and only if it is neither sequentially relevant nor incompatibly relevant there.
- For each step n of the disputation, and for each propositum p, the respondent must concede p at step n if it is sequentially relevant at n, and must deny it if it is incompatibly relevant at n. If p is irrelevant at step n, the respondent must reply according to his knowledge of the actual facts (independent of what is posited in the disputation). Thus, if p is irrelevant at n and the respondent knows it is true in fact, he must concede it; if p is irrelevant at n and the respondent knows it is false in fact, he must deny it; if p is irrelevant and the respondent does not know whether it is true or false, he must doubt it.
The disputation continues until the opponent says “Cedat tempus,” which can either mean “Time is up!” (the disputation is over) or “Time out!” In the latter case the disputation is interrupted temporarily while the opponent points out some mistake in the respondent’s replies or makes some other observation. In both senses, the point is the same: the respondent is not “obligated” by the rules of positio except when the “game clock” is running. It is a standard feature of obligations treatises that they distinguish (1) the propositions put forward, (2) their evaluation in the obligational disputation, and (3) a meta-level discussion of either the propositions (eg. of their truth values) or their intra-disputation evaluations.
An example will help clarify the rules.
|I posit that Atlanta is the capital of Pennsylvania.||I admit it.|
| Comments: Atlanta is not in fact
the capital of Pennsylvania. But that does not prevent the opponent
from positing that it is.
|Step 1:||Atlanta is south of the Mason-Dixon Line.||I concede it.|
| Comments: From the positum
it follows neither that Atlanta is south of the Mason-Dixon Line nor
that it isn’t. (The positum says nothing at all about the
location of the Mason-Dixon Line or of Atlanta.) Hence step 1 is
irrelevant. Nevertheless, since the respondent knows that step 1 is in
fact true, he must concede it.
|Step 2:||The capital of Pennsylvania is south of the Mason-Dixon Line.||I concede it.|
| Comments: From the positum
and the already conceded step 1, step 2 follows. Hence it is
sequentially relevant and must be conceded.
|Time is up!|
Several peculiar things should be noted about these rules. First, the burden of the rules falls almost entirely on the respondent. As long as he picks an “admissible” positum to begin with, the opponent is otherwise free to propose anything he pleases at any step of the disputation.
Second, note the role of the respondent’s epistemic state. It is a factor in determining the correct replies, but only when the propositum is irrelevant.
Third, note that order counts. That is, depending on the order in which proposita are proposed, different replies to them may be required. Thus if steps 1 and 2 were reversed in the above example, both would have to be denied:
|I posit that Atlanta is the capital of Pennsylvania.||I admit it.|
| Comments: As before.
|Step 1:||The capital of Pennsylvania is south of the Mason-Dixon Line.||I deny it.|
| Comments: From the positum
it follows neither that the capital of Pennsylvania is south of the
Mason-Dixon Line nor that it isn’t. (As before, the positum
says nothing about the location of the Mason-Dixon Line or of the
capital of Pennsylvania.) Hence step 1 is irrelevant. Nevertheless,
since the respondent knows that step 1 is in fact false, he must deny
|Step 2:||Atlanta is south of the Mason-Dixon Line.||I deny it.|
| Comments: From the positum
and the contradictory of step 1 (step 1 was denied, recall),
the contradictory of step 2 follows. Hence step 2 is incompatibly
relevant and must be denied.
|Time is up!|
This set of rules guarantees that positio is “consistent” in each of the following three, progressively stronger senses:
- (1) No given disputation ever requires the respondent to concede an impossibility at any one step.
- (2) No given disputation ever requires the respondent to concede proposita of the form p and not-p at different steps.
- (3) No given disputation ever requires the respondent to concede at different steps each member of an inconsistent set of proposita.
Yet on Burley’s theory positio fails to be “consistent” in another sense:
- (4) No given disputation ever requires the respondent to give different replies to the same propositum at different steps.
As an example of this failure, let p and q be contingent propositions neither of which logically implies the other, and let the respondent know that q is false whereas he does not know the truth value of p. Then:
|I posit that p or q.
||I admit it.|
|Step 1:||p||I doubt it.|
| Comments: The positum
implies neither p nor not-p. Step 1 is therefore
irrelevant. Thus, since the respondent does not know its truth value,
he must doubt it.
|Step 2:||q||I deny it.|
| Comments: The positum
implies neither q nor not-q. Step 2 is therefore
irrelevant. (Since step 1 was neither conceded nor denied, it does not
affect whether step 2 is relevant or irrelevant.) Since the respondent
knows that q is in fact false, it must be denied.
|Step 3:||p||I concede it.|
| Comments: Step 3 follows from the
positum and the contradictory of step 2 (step 2 was
denied, recall). Hence it must be conceded, even though the same
propositum was doubted in step 1.
|Time is up!|
Clearly, positio on Burley’s theory is a very peculiar kind of disputation.
Burley’s theory of positio was not the only one. Another account seems to have originated with a certain Roger Swyneshed, who wrote an Obligationes probably sometime after 1330 and certainly before 1335 (Spade ). This alternative theory was recognized by Robert Eland, a mid-fourteenth century author about whom very little is known. Eland reports both Burley’s theory and Swyneshed’s theory, calling them the “old response” and the “new response,” respectively. He does not choose between them, but simply tells the respondent to pick whichever one he likes (Spade , §20). Richard Lavenham, on the other hand, a later-fourteenth century author contemporary with John Wyclif, accepts Swyneshed’s version of positio outright. A certain John of Wesel from mid-fourteenth century Paris also shows knowledge of Swyneshed’s views (John of Wesel ). Nevertheless, Swyneshed’s views seem to have generated some controversy. For instance, Ralph Strode, in the later-fourteenth century (roughly contemporary with John Wyclif), heatedly rejected features of Swyneshed’s theory, as did Peter of Candia and the Logica magna attributed to Paul of Venice (Spade [1982a], pp. 337–39).
Swyneshed’s theory of positio is in many respects like Burley’s, but differs in one major respect. For Swyneshed, in assessing whether a propositum is relevant or irrelevant, the responses to previous proposita do not matter. That is, for him, a propositum is “sequentially relevant” if and only if it logically follows from the positum alone; it is “incompatibly relevant” if and only if its contradictory opposite follows from the positum alone; it is “irrelevant” if and only if it is neither sequentially nor incompatibly relevant.
Swyneshed’s “new response” greatly simplifies the task of the respondent. He no longer has to keep track of what has previously been conceded or denied in the disputation. The order in which proposita are proposed no longer matters. All the respondent has to do is to make sure he responds appropriately whenever the propositum either follows from or is inconsistent with the positum alone, and otherwise just respond according to his knowledge of the actual facts. As long as he does that, he has performed correctly.
Unlike Burley’s theory, Swyneshed’s guarantees that positio is consistent in sense 4 above. On the other hand, while for Swyneshed positio is consistent in sense 1 and sense 2 above, it fails to be consistent in sense 3. For example, suppose you know you are sitting somewhere in Oxford, and then consider the following positio (Spade , §100):
|I posit that you are in Rome or you are running.||I admit it.|
| Comments: The fact that both
disjuncts are false does not prevent the proposition’s being
“admissible as positum.”
|Step 1:||You are in Rome or you are running.||I concede it.|
| Comments: This is just a repetition
of the positum, except that here it is not being posited but
proposed. It is obviously sequentially relevant, and so must be
|Step 2:||You are not in Rome.||I concede it.|
| Comments: Neither step 2 nor its
contradictory follows from the positum alone. Hence it is
irrelevant. Since (by hypothesis) it is also known to be true, it has
to be conceded.
|Step 3:||You are not running.||I concede it.|
| Comments: Ditto.
|Time is up!|
The proposita in steps 1–3 form an inconsistent triad, and yet each of them has to be conceded in accordance with Swyneshed’s rules. Indeed, Swyneshed is clear that all members of inconsistent triads may sometimes be conceded.
Burley’s and Swyneshed’s were not the only theories of positio, although they seem to have been the most widely discussed. Other theories were suggested too, but they are not yet thoroughly studied or understood.
What was the purpose of positio? The question is not an easy one. For, oddly, although medieval authors themselves speak of positio as a kind of “disputation,” there seems at first to be nothing really in dispute! Look back at the preceding examples. They do not settle, or even try to settle, anything whatever about the capital of Pennsylvania, the location of the Mason-Dixon Line, whether you are sitting or running in Rome or in Oxford, or anything else. Unlike the medieval quaestio format, where there was a real issue being pursued and a real conflict of opposing views, there seems to be nothing like that going on in a positio. What then was its purpose?
Some scholars have suggested that these disputations were meant as “exercises” or perhaps “examinations” of students’ skills. But skills at doing what? We have just seen that it would not be their purely logical skills that would be exercised or examined. What other skills were they? Skills at arguing according to the rules of obligatio? No doubt, but without some further explanation, why would anyone want to do that?
One suggestion is that positio might be viewed as something like a theory of counterfactual reasoning. On this account, a positio would explore “what would happen” if the positum were true but everything else stayed as much as possible the same as it really is. This suggestion provides some rationale for the otherwise mysterious treatment of irrelevant proposita, where one looks away from the posited situation back to reality to guide one’s responses. In similar fashion, where a counterfactual hypothesis does not require otherwise, counterfactual reasoning typically tries to stay as close as possible to reality.
Furthermore, theories of positio bear striking formal similarities to modern theories of counterfactuals. Transitivity, contraposition and strengthening the antecedent all fail, and several other characteristics of counterfactuals seem to be mirrored in the theory of positio.
This suggestion has met considerable resistance (Stump  and , Martin ). One objection is that, at least on Burley’s “standard” theory of positio, if a positum is possible but nevertheless known to be false, the opponent can maneuver the respondent into having to concede any proposition whatever consistent with the positum. Let p be such a positum, and let q be consistent with p. Then:
|I posit that p.
||I admit it.|
|Step 1:||Not-p or q.||I concede it.|
| Comments: If p logically
implies q, then step 1 is sequentially relevant, and so has
to be conceded. If p does not logically imply q,
step 1 is irrelevant, since q is by hypothesis consistent
with p. In that case, since p is known to be false,
not-p is known to be true, and step 1 has to be conceded as
an irrelevant truth.
|Step 2:||q||I concede it.|
| Comments: The propositum
q follows from the positum and the conceded
proposition in step 1. Hence it is sequentially relevant and must be
|Time is up!|
This is a very bad result if positio is a form of counterfactual reasoning. For it means that, starting from any known falsehood, one could reason counterfactually to anything whatever consistent with it.
Another objection might be that counterfactual reasoning, at least as we are thinking of it today, does not incorporate epistemic factors in the way the theory of positio does. It is one thing to say that we do not know what would happen under a given counterfactual hypothesis; it is quite another thing to say, as the “counterfactual”-interpretation has it that the theory of obligationes does say, that what would happen depends in part on what we do know in fact.
4.2 Positio and consistency maintainance
In more recent research (e.g. Yrjönsuuri ; Catarina Dutilh Novaes ), scholars have thought that unlike twentieth century theories of counterfactual reasoning, obligationes are characteristically dynamic and dialectical. The core of the art is that the respondent must use logical skills to keep the general commitment to consistency. A particular bend to the art comes from the fact that at least in the late medieval context there was no clear universally accepted definition what it means to keep consistent in a dynamic situation. There was, from the viewpoint of this interpretation, agreement that the consistency at issue in obligationes is connected to inferential validity. In the early Obligationes Parisienses the art is explicitly connected to “knowledge of consequences” (scientia de consequentiis). Even more generally, it is clear that the kinds of inferences employed in obligationes are in most cases strictly logical.
It is notable that in early thirteenth century logic, when obligational disputations started to be discussed, the concept of consistency of a set of propositions was not a standard part of logical toolboxes. It was only towards the latter half of the thirteenth century that logicians started to use the concept compossibilitas to designate how a set of propositions could all be true together, and John Duns Scotus even introduced the concept of “logical possibility” (possibilitas logica).
To the modern reader, obligational disputations may appear to be studying consistency maintenance. However, it seems historically more accurate to say that they were practiced for some other reasons, but then proved to be an interesting platform to study what it logically means to have a consistent set of propositions. In this way, they contributed significantly to the development of the concept of logical consistency. That is, obligational disputations turned from a marginal interest into an important vehicle for the development of formal logic, to which the best logicians of the fourteenth century would pay ample attention.
Another suggestion is that positio might lie at the background of the modern academic practice of the “thesis defense.” ‘Positio’, after all, is just Latin for the Greek ‘thesis’. Furthermore, to this day, the characteristic terminology of “opponent” and “respondent” is preserved in some European academic thesis-defenses. Moreover, despite our earlier sense that there is, oddly, nothing really “in dispute” in a positio, it is relatively easy to find medieval discussions—not in treatises or other passages devoted specifically to the theory of obligationes, but in other texts—where the characteristic vocabulary and procedures of positio are appealed to in a context where some substantive view is being argued. That view, however, is not to be found in the positum or in any of the subsequent proposed steps of the positio. It is rather a view that the respondent takes himself to know (and so is prepared to “defend”), and that will therefore affect the responses he gives to irrelevant proposita. The view being “defended,” therefore, is not a view explicitly stated anywhere in the disputation, but a kind of background assumption that underlies the respondent’s replies. This suggestion has some promise, but has not yet been thoroughly explored. One objection might be that, despite the initial attractiveness of the fact that Latin ‘positio’ is the same as Greek ‘thesis,’ this view ends up divorcing the “thesis” being defended by the respondent from the positum in the disputation.
The jury is still out. It must be admitted that no one has yet explained positio, much less the obligationes-literature in general, in a fully satisfactory way. An adequate account would have to accommodate
- the variety of views of positio one finds in the medieval literature;
- the characteristic treatment of irrelevant proposita, which brings non-logical factors into play;
- in particular, the epistemic factors incorporated into most treatments.
It may be that any adequate account would in effect reproduce the genre with the terminology of modern logic. That is, perhaps obligationes are best understood as a logical genre of its own kind.
In the most recent studies of obligational disputations the interest to map this medieval genre to categories of modern logic has understandably waned. Instead, interest has turned to how specific logical issues come up in the context of obligational disputations.
Apart from positio, the other kinds of obligatio recognized in the medieval literature have not been studied nearly so much. One kind that perhaps needs little separate study is “counterpositing” (depositio). In effect, if “positing” requires the respondent to uphold the positum as true (by conceding what follows from it, etc.), “counterpositing” requires the respondent to uphold the depositum as false (by denying what implies it, etc.). In other respects, counterpositing seems, mutatis mutandis, to be a trivial variation on positing. This itself raises an interpretive problem: why treat counterpositing as a separate kind of obligatio at all?
Another kind that that probably needs only cursory recognition is “doubting.” Doubting (dubitatio), like counterpositing, is a variation on positing. In this case, the respondent is required to uphold the dubitatum as doubtful. (Recall the role of doubtful irrelevant proposita in a positio.) Again, while the complications can get confusing in practice, theoretically this seems a trivial variation on positing. One wonders again why some authors singled it out as a separate kind of obligatio.
A few words should be said about other kinds of obligatio. Even apart from the context of obligationes, “institution” (or “imposition”) was regarded as the assigning of meaning to expressions of language. Within the context of obligationes, the issue seems to have revolved around how institution or imposition affected the correct responses in an obligational disputation. Suppose we call a tail a leg (that is, “impose” the word ‘leg’ to include tails). How many legs does a lion have? Should we say five, on the grounds that we are calling tails legs? Or should we continue to say four, on the grounds that our replies are to be given according to the meanings words actually have, quite apart from whatever meanings they might (counterfactually) be assumed to have in the context of a disputation? (See Spade [1982a], pp. 339–40.)
“Petition” (petitio) has been completely ignored in the recent literature, and little can be said that is informative about it. Somewhat more has been said about “the truth of the matter” (rei veritas), but not much (Spade [1994–1997]).
The vocabulary of medieval obligationes-literature (“positing,” “conceding,” “admitting,” “relevance/irrelevance”) appears ubiquitously in late medieval scholastic writings. If not otherwise, for this reason there is need for more study of the literature and its role in medieval logic.
The most complete bibliography of primary and secondary material on obligationes up to 1994 may be found in:
- Ashworth, E. J., 1994. “Obligationes Treatises: A Catalogue of Manuscripts, Editions and Studies,” Bulletin de Philosophie Médiévale, 36: 118–47.
The items listed below include only those explicitly cited above and in the notes, together with a few other items published updating the information in Ashworth .
- Ashworth, E. Jennifer, 1992. “The Obligationes of John Tarteys: Edition and Introduction,” Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 3: 653–703.
- –––, 2015. “Richard Billingham and the Oxford Obligationes Texts: Restrictions on positio,” Vivarium, 53(2–4): 372–390.
- Boehner, Philotheus, 1952. Medieval Logic: An Outline of Its Development from 1250 to c. 1400, Manchester: Manchester University Press.
- De Rijk, Lambert M., 1974. “Some Thirteenth Century Tracts on the Game of Obligation. I,” Vivarium, 12: 94–123.
- –––, 1975. “Some Thirteenth Century Tracts on the Game of Obligation. II,” Vivarium, 13: 22–54.
- –––, 1976. “Some Thirteenth Century Tracts on the Game of Obligation. III,” Vivarium, 14: 26–42.
- Dumitriu, Anton, 1977. History of Logic, Duiliu Zamfirescu et al., trans. 4 vols. Tunbridge Wells, Kent: Abacus Press.
- Dutilh Novaes, C., 2005. “Medieval Obligationes as Logical Games of Consistency Maintenance,” Synthese, 145(3): 371–395.
- –––, 2007, Formalizing Medieval Logical Theories: Suppositio, Consequentiae and Obligationes (Logic, Epistemology, and the Unity of Science: Volume 7), Dordrecht: Springer.
- Dutilh Novaes, Catarina, 2011. “Medieval Obligationes as a Theory of Discursive Commitment Management,” Vivarium, 49: 240–257.
- Gelber, Hester Goodenough, 2004. It Could Have Been Otherwise: Contingency and Necessity in Dominican Theology at Oxford, 1300–1350, Leiden: E. J. Brill.
- Green, Romuald, 1963. “An Introduction to the Logical Treatise De obligationibus, with Critical Texts of William of Sherwood [?] and Walter Burley,” 2 vols. Doctoral dissertation. Katholieke Universiteit Leuven. A revised version of this essential but unpublished dissertation has been widely circulated in manuscript form under the title The Logical Treatise ‘De obligationibus’: An Introduction with Critical Texts of William of Sherwood and Walter Burley.
- John of Wesel, . “Three Questions by John of Wesel on Obligationes and Insolubilia,” [Latin edition available online in PDF, with introduction and notes, by Paul Vincent Spade.]
- King, Peter, 1991. “Mediaeval Thought-Experiments: The Metamethodology of Mediaeval Science,” in T. Horowitz and G. Massey (eds.) 1991. Thought Experiments in Science and Philosophy, Savage, Md: Rowman & Littlefield, pp. 43–64.
- Kilvington, Richard, [1990a]. The Sophismata of Richard Kilvington, Norman Kretzmann and Barbara Ensign Kretzmann, ed. Oxford: Oxford University Press. (“Auctores Brittanici Medii Aevi,” vol. 12.) Latin edition. Translated in Kilvington [1990b].
- –––, [1990b]. The Sophismata of Richard Kilvington, Norman Kretzmann and Barbara Ensign Kretzmann (eds. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; this is a translation of Kilvington [1990a], with commentary.
- Kukkonen, Taneli, 2002. “Alternatives to Alternatives: Approaches to Aristotle’s Arguments per impossibile,” Vivarium, 40: 137–173.
- Kukkonen, Taneli, 2005. “The impossible, insofar as it is possible: Ibn Rushd and Buridan on logic and natural theology,” in D. Perler & U. Rudolph (eds.), Logik und Theologie: Das Organon im Arabischen und im Lateinischen Mittelalter, Leiden: Brill, pp. 447–467.
- Kretzmann, Norman, et al. (ed.), 1982. The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Kretzmann, Norman, and Stump, Eleonore, 1985. “The Anonymous De arte obligatoria in Merton College MS. 306,” in E. P. Bos (ed.), Medieval Semantics and Metaphysics: Studies Dedicated to L. M. de Rijk, Ph.D., Professor of Ancient and Mediaeval Philosophy at the University of Leiden on the Occasion of His 60th Birthday, Nijmegen: Ingenium, pp. 239–80. (“Artistarium,” Supplementa, vol. 2.)
- Martin, Christopher J., 1990. “Bradwardine and the use of Positio as a Test of Possibility,” in Simo Knuuttila, Reijo Työrinoja and Sten Ebbesen (eds.), Knowledge and the Sciences in Medieval Philosophy: Proceedings of the Eighth International Congress of Medieval Philosophy, vol. 2. Helsinki: Publications of the Luther-Agricola Society, pp. 574–85.
- –––, 1993. “Obligations and Liars,” in S. Read (ed.), 1993, Sophisms in Mediaeval Logic and Grammar: Acts of the Ninth European Symposium for Medieval Logic and Semantics, held at St Andrews, June 1990, Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 357–81. (“Nijhoff International Philosophy Series,” vol. 48.) (Revised version in Martin .)
- –––, 1997. “Impossible Positio as the Foundation of Metaphysics or, Logic on the Scotist Plan?” in Constantino Marmo (ed.), Vestigia, Imagines, Verba: Semiotics in Medieval Theological Texts (XIIIth–XIVth Century), Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 255–77. (Revised version in Martin .)
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