Michael Oakeshott (1901–1990) is often described as a conservative thinker. But this description notices only one aspect of his thought and invites misunderstanding because of its ambiguities. His ideas spring from a lifetime of reading in the history of European thought, sharpened by philosophical reflection on its arguments and presuppositions. Oakeshott worked on the premise that philosophical questions are interconnected and that answering them requires wide-ranging critical reflection. A recurrent theme in his writings on moral and political life is the tension between individuality, which implies plurality, and its denial, which he calls barbarism. Individual freedom is threatened when politics is conceived as the pursuit of ideals. The recent interest of political philosophers in the republican idea of freedom as independence or nondomination suggests the continuing relevance of his thought. So does their interest in political realism as an alternative to moralism. But Oakeshott’s contribution to philosophy is not limited to political philosophy. It includes reflection on the criteria for distinguishing different modes of thought from one another, defining historical inquiry as one such mode, identifying different conceptions of rationality and their place in practical judgment, and distinguishing competing understandings of the modern state. Oakeshott also wrote on religion, morals, education, aesthetics, Hobbes, and the history of political thought. Instead of surveying all these topics, this entry will focus on his most important contributions to philosophy: his theory of modes, his criticism of political rationalism, his argument that the key distinction in modern politics concerns the character and purpose of the state, and his philosophy of history.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Modes of Experience
- 3. Rationality and Rationalism
- 4. Civil Association
- 5. History and the Human Sciences
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1. Life and Works
Michael Oakeshott’s father, Joseph Oakeshott, was a member of the Fabian Society, a socialist but not radical organization (its symbol was the tortoise), many of whose members participated in establishing the British Labor Party. The Society’s leaders, Beatrice and Sidney Webb, were among the founders of the London School of Economics. The younger Oakeshott studied history at Gonville and Caius College, Cambridge, in the early 1920s and became a life fellow in 1925. After serving in the British Army between 1940 and 1945, he returned to Cambridge, then taught briefly at Nuffield College, Oxford, before becoming Professor of Political Science at the LSE in 1951. At some point during his years at the LSE he launched an annual course of lectures in the history of political thought. Focused initially on canonical authors and texts, after the fashion of the lectures he delivered at Harvard in 1958 (Oakeshott 1993b), the course gradually became a more comprehensive examination of the political experience and thought of four peoples: the ancient Greeks, the Romans, medieval Christians, and modern Europeans (Oakeshott 2006). He also led a seminar in the history of political thought for postgraduate students and, as an emeritus professor, was active in it until 1980, contributing papers on the historical study of political thought and the philosophy of history. Brief accounts of Oakeshott’s life can be found in two memorial collections (Norman 1993; Marsh 2001) and a biographical essay (Grant 2012). The notebooks Oakeshott kept for much of his life (Oakeshott 2014) offer additional insights, as do his unpublished letters.
Although Oakeshott criticized the postwar Labor government’s belief in planning, in his youth he thought of himself as a socialist. But it was a romantic socialism concerned with spiritual transformation, not economic redistribution (L. O’Sullivan 2014). And though he later repudiated Fabianism, Marxism, and other left-wing ideologies, the late Oakeshott still sympathized with the anarchism of Pierre-Joseph Proudhon, sharing the latter’s vision of a liberal order combining community and equality with individuality and independence. His reputation as a conservative thinker was substantially shaped by his trenchant essays on the limits of reason in political life, collected as Rationalism in Politics and Other Essays (first edition 1962, cited hereafter as RP). On the basis of these essays he has been compared to a host of conservative figures from Burke to Wittgenstein. Others argue that he is better characterized as a liberal. As a theorist of the rule of law, he invites comparison with Friedrich Hayek and Carl Schmitt. But efforts to label Oakeshott as either conservative or liberal founder not only on the ambiguities of those terms but on the partisanship they imply: Oakeshott was emphatically not politically engaged. As he provocatively informed those attending the twentieth-anniversary celebration of the National Review in 1975, the Right’s differences with the Left were a petty squabble over how the spoils of the state as a corporate enterprise were to be distributed (RP 459). To grasp the philosophical significance of Oakeshott’s thought one must move beyond the vocabulary of twentieth-century political dispute.
In his first book, Experience and Its Modes (1933, cited as EM), Oakeshott barely mentions politics. But this does not mean that he was not interested in political philosophy when he wrote it. The book grew out of his Cambridge lectures from the late 1920s, “The Philosophical Approach to Politics”, now included in Early Political Writings (Oakeshott 2010). In these lectures he distinguishes different ways of thinking about politics, but in the book these different ways of thinking are detached from the subject of politics and presented as general modes of experience. By the time he wrote Experience and Its Modes, Oakeshott had come to believe that political philosophy was necessarily defective—that it was limited by its commitment to a pre-philosophically demarcated sphere of experience and therefore not genuine philosophy. The book is a highly individual performance in the style of British philosophical Idealism, written at a time when that approach to philosophy was rapidly going out of fashion. In it, Oakeshott credits the influence of Hegel, Bradley, and Bosanquet, but it was evident that he had absorbed their views “into an insistent literary personality which moved freely and suggestively in many types of literature” (Cowling 2003: 256). When Oakeshott took up politics again in the late 1930’s, it was in relation to the controversies of the day. At the urging of the Cambridge political scientist Ernest Barker, and partly motivated by the hope it would gain him a professorship, he compiled an anthology of texts expounding the “doctrines” of contemporary Europe: Representative Democracy, Catholicism, Communism, Fascism, and National Socialism (Oakeshott 1939). His first postwar publication was an edition of Hobbes’s Leviathan, with an influential introduction later published together with other essays on Hobbes in Hobbes on Civil Association (Oakeshott 1975b). In 1947 he founded the Cambridge Journal, a short-lived but critically esteemed vehicle treating politics and culture as topics for civilized conversation rather than ideological polemics or academic research. Several of the essays reprinted in Rationalism in Politics first appeared there.
Oakeshott’s magnum opus, On Human Conduct (1975a, cited as OHC) appeared late in his career. It was greeted in some quarters with incomprehension and in others with hostility, but mostly with silence. Even those who judged the book important found its style forbidding, and its impact has been muted. Also difficult are the three late essays on the philosophy of history included in On History and Other Essays (1983, cited as OH). His essays on the idea of liberal education and its practical implications, collected in The Voice of Liberal Learning (1989, cited as VLL), are more accessible and continue to receive attention (Williams 2007; Backhurst and Fairfield 2016). After Oakeshott’s death other writings appeared, first in a series of volumes published by Yale University Press (Oakeshott 1993a, 1993b, and 1996) and then in a series from Imprint Academic (Oakeshott 2004, 2006, 2007, 2008, 2010, and 2014). There has also been a steady stream of secondary works, including two companion volumes (Franco and Marsh 2012; Podoksik 2012). Comparison with philosophical contemporaries—Collingwood, Wittgenstein, Schmitt, Strauss, Hayek, Gadamer, Arendt, Foucault, MacIntyre—offers another angle from which to view his place in twentieth-century thought (Dyzenhaus and Poole 2015; Plotica 2015; N. O’Sullivan 2017). This literature, together with the attention his less accessible writings are starting to receive, suggests that Oakeshott occupies an increasingly secure place in the history of philosophy and political thought.
2. Modes of Experience
Philosophers have used the word “mode” to refer to an attribute that a thing can possess or the form a substance can take. For Oakeshott, this thing or substance is experience, by which he means both the activity of experiencing and what is experienced, understood as inseparable and therefore as a unity. Looked at from either side, experience involves thinking and therefore ideas. He has in mind the kind of mutually correlated subject-object relationship that Hegel examines in the Phenomenology (which Oakeshott read in his 20s), according to which what is experienced—the object—is itself thought. Where a body of ideas has achieved a substantial degree of integrity and differentiation, a mode of thought can be said to have emerged. Sometimes, a mode is understood to be an aspect of something larger or more real than itself (Descartes 1641: 27–28, 31). In Experience and Its Modes there are traces of the view, also discernible in Spinoza and Hegel, that this “larger thing” is everything that exists, the sum total of experience identified as God or the Absolute. Oakeshott does not use the word “mode” in later writings in a way that postulates a universal or ultimate reality. But neither is a mode of thought just any kind of thinking. It is an “autonomous” kind of thinking, one that is “specifiable in terms of exact conditions” and “logically incapable of denying or confirming the conclusions of any other mode” (OH 2). A mode constitutes a distinct and self-consistent “whole of interlocking meanings” (VLL 38), a world of ideas resting on its own criteria of truth, factuality, and reality. A puzzle, then, is how the modes can talk to one another, and the solution is that as modes they don't. There is a difference between the modes as ideal types and their instantiation in actual thoughts and actions, and therefore between philosophically differentiating them and investigating them historically or sociologically.
Thinking that is involved in acting is one such mode, which Oakeshott calls “practice”. Another is “history”, by which he means neither “the notional grand total of all that has ever happened” nor some part of it, whose makers are the participants in the occurrences that constitute it, but rather a distinct kind of inquiry into and understanding of events. Because events are not given but must be inferred from what the historian treats as evidence, history is made by the historian (OH 1–2). It is, moreover, an inquiry that aims to account for past events as intelligible outcomes of antecedent events. In contrast to history, understood in this way, “science” as a mode is defined by its search for regularities that can account for the occurrence of repeatable events and for ways to express these regularities as relationships between quantities. This way of distinguishing between history and science locates Oakeshott in the tradition of German Neo-Kantian of the previous generation, Windelband and Rickert especially, in which the Naturwissenschaften and Geisteswissenschaften were treated as distinct epistemological forms. History and science are both inherently explanatory, but the kinds of explanations they provide are different. Genuine history is also distinguished from ideas about the past that are shaped by current practical concerns (the “practical past”). The same holds for science: as a mode of inquiry, science is different from the practical application of scientific knowledge. From this perspective, we might see engineering as a practical discipline rather than a scientific one.
Modes, then, are distinct and provisionally coherent kinds of knowledge. In Experience and Its Modes, Oakeshott aims to identify the presuppositions in terms of which a mode can be made coherent and distinguished from other modes. Modal distinctions are categorial. A categorial distinction is one of kind rather than degree. Philosophers have disagreed about whether the identified kinds are natural (ontological) or conceptual (epistemological): the former are categories of being (Aristotle), the latter categories of understanding (Kant). Philosophers have also disagreed about whether a categorial scheme must be exhaustive and fixed or, alternatively, can be open and mutable. The modes that Oakeshott identifies in Experience and Its Modes—history, science, and practice, to which he later added “poetry” (aesthetic experience)—can from one angle be seen as epistemological categories, not ontological ones. But from another angle the distinction between being and knowing does not make sense (Hegel). There can be no absolute difference between what a thing is and how it is conceived in a particular context because there are no “things in themselves” in the Kantian sense that are independent of thought. And though the modes are mutually exclusive, Oakeshott does not think that they form a closed set. The modes he identifies are intellectual constructions that have appeared in the course of human experience. This suggests that they could change or even disappear, and that new modes might emerge. But here we must distinguish between a mode and its instantiation. History was a possible form of thinking before anyone started to think historically and would remain a possibility even if human beings were to cease thinking historically.
A number of other conclusions follow from this understanding of modality. First, a mode of experience implies a distinct and autonomous kind of understanding. It implies a universe of discourse with its own arguments and ways of assessing and grounding them. Because propositions in one mode of discourse have no standing in another, truth is coherence, however defined, within a given mode. To argue across a modal boundary is to commit the fallacy of ignoratio elenchi (irrelevance). If there is any relationship between the modes it is conversational, not argumentative: cross-modal encounters yield differences, not supra-modal conclusions. Oakeshott sometimes makes this point by speaking of modes as “voices” in an inter-modal conversation (RP 488–491, 497). In conversation the rules of relevance are relaxed: a conversation is not an argument. Second, because what counts as rational in discourse depends on the mode of discourse itself, there is no extra-modal definition of reason or rationality. The illusion that there is arises from privileging what counts as reasonable within a given mode and denigrating what is considered reasonable in other modes. This illusion of superiority generates the narrowness, and at times hubris, characteristic of each mode connoted by the labels “historicism”, “scientism”, “pragmatism”, and “aestheticism”. A conversational as opposed to argumentative juxtaposition of modal voices is respectful of differences and for that reason inherently civilized, which means that to insist on the primacy of any single mode is not only boorish but barbaric. And because the modes are independent of one another, and none is more expressive of an imagined mode-independent reality than any other, there can be no hierarchy of modes.
In making these points, Oakeshott differs from philosophical Idealists in Germany, Italy, and England who were proposing similar categorial schemes around the same time. These include Benedetto Croce, who distinguishes the theoretical modes of art, history, and philosophy from the practical modes of economics and ethics, and R.G. Collingwood, who in Speculum Mentis, an early work, begins with Hegel’s triad of art, religion, and philosophy, identifying philosophy broadly defined with “knowledge” and distinguishing three kinds of knowledge—science, history, and philosophy narrowly defined—to generate a fivefold hierarchy of modes. In Collingwood’s scheme, art is at the bottom, followed by religion, the former concerned to imagine or “suppose” and the latter to “assert”, and then by the three kinds of genuine knowledge, which are distinguished from art and religion in being critical. Philosophy proper is the most critical of all because it aims to transcend the other forms (Collingwood 1924; Connelly 2015). Oakeshott, partly in response to Collingwood, folds art and religion into practice, denies that modes can be ordered hierarchically, and defines philosophy as the activity of interrogating presuppositions, including its own, and therefore not itself a mode. But despite characterizing philosophy as supramodal, he severs the tie between philosophy and unqualified knowledge—“the Absolute”—that one finds in Idealist metaphysics from Hegel to Collingwood. The distinction between modal thinking and philosophy that Oakeshott asserts in Experience and Its Modes reappears in On Human Conduct as a distinction between “conditional” and “unconditional” theorizing, the former resting on assumptions that the latter questions.
The idea of a hierarchy of modes is not particular to Idealism. Where there are different understandings, someone interested in reconciling them might argue that they represent different levels of understanding, some more inclusive and in that sense higher than others. In contrast to unifying philosophies, including philosophical Idealism, Oakeshott’s position is pluralist and anti-hierarchical. In this respect he has more in common with Wilhelm Dilthey, who struggled with the issue of relativity in metaphysics and how to distinguish the human from the natural sciences, than with the British Idealists—Bradley, Bosanquet, and McTaggart among others—with whom he is often associated (Boucher 2012). For Oakeshott, all knowledge is conditional. Theorizing is “an engagement of arrivals and departures” in which “the notion of an unconditional or definitive understanding may hover in the background, but … has no part in the adventure” (OHC 2–3). In attempting to construct a coherent view of the world the philosopher “puts out to sea” (OHC 40) and is perpetually en voyage: there are no “final solutions” in philosophy any more than in practical affairs.
3. Rationality and Rationalism
What Oakeshott calls “Rationalism” is the belief, in his view illusory, that there are “correct” answers to practical questions. It is the belief that an action or policy is rational only when it rests on knowledge whose truth can be demonstrated. Its error is thinking that correct decisions can be made simply by applying rules or calculating consequences. In an early essay, Oakeshott distinguishes between “technical” and “traditional” knowledge. Technical knowledge is knowledge, whether of facts or rules, that is easily learned and applied, even by those who are without experience. Traditional knowledge, in contrast, is “knowing how” rather than “knowing that” (Ryle 1949). It is acquired by engaging in an activity and involves judgment in handling facts or rules (RP 12–17). Knowledge often involves an element of rule-following but using rules skillfully or prudently means going beyond the instructions they provide. Even a simple rule, like “no vehicles in the park” (Hart 1958), implies an element of judgment. This holds for collective as well as individual decisions and for political as well as private ones. But if technical knowledge has limits, so does traditional knowledge. We cannot conclude that experience and judgment are infallible: clearly, they are not.
Political deliberation occurs when a public decision needs to be made and a proposed course of action defended. But deciding which course of action to pursue involves more than simply applying rules or calculating costs and benefits. It requires interpretation and judgment. We must decide which rule to use and then interpret what it means in a given situation. If, alternatively, we choose an action based on its likely consequences, we must judge the expected value of those consequences, and this involves making value judgments as well as estimating probabilities. Whether we are applying rules or calculating outcomes, we must work with what we presume to be facts, though these are always uncertain in various ways. For these reasons, there is never a demonstrably correct course of action. Political arguments cannot be proved or disproved; they can only be shown to be more or less convincing than other such arguments. Political discourse, then, is a discourse of contingencies and conjectures, not of certainties or context-independent truths. It is persuasive and rhetorical, not a matter of demonstration or proof (RP 70–95).
These are familiar points, made by Oakeshott with particular clarity. What he adds to other philosophical discussions of practical reasoning, such as Aristotle’s treatment of techne and phronēsis (Nichomachean Ethics 1142a) or Kant’s remarks on judgment as the middle term between rules and applications (Kant 1793: 8:275), are reflections on how practical, and in particular political, discourse can cause disasters when these points are overlooked. His conclusions rest on a dissection of ideological politics, which, Oakeshott thought, reflects a characteristically modern disposition to substitute rules—which can be moral, historical, scientific, or divine—for judgment in practical reasoning. The rules that are thought to govern practice are not independent of practical activity but abstracted from it. They are “abridgments” of customs, habits, traditions, and skills (RP 121). To borrow language from Michael Walzer, they are interpretations rather than discoveries or inventions (Walzer 1987). And what they interpret are ways of doing things:
the pedigree of every political ideology shows it to be the creature, not of premeditation in advance of political activity, but of meditation upon a manner of politics. (RP 51)
Rationalists, unaware of the local origins of the universal principles that they imagine they have identified, reject knowledge gained through experience in favor of something they call reason or science. Whether deductive or computational, this abstract reason is thought to guarantee greater certainty than experience and judgment can provide. The fallacy of Rationalism, in other words, is that the knowledge that it identifies as rational is itself really a product of experience and judgment. It consists of rules, methods, or techniques abstracted from practice—tools that, far from being substitutes for experience and judgment, cannot be effectively used in their absence.
In his essays on Rationalism, Oakeshott discusses many examples of ideological politics. He dissects the rhetorical strategies of Locke, Bentham, and Marx and takes contemporaries to task for thinking that political conclusions can be extracted from religious or scientific principles or from what are believed to be the lessons of history. Marxism, for example, claims that laws of historical change can be discerned scientifically and practical guidance derived from them. But the claim should be understood as a rhetorical one that can persuade only those who already believe it (Oakeshott 2008: 168–177). In his Lectures in the History of Political Thought (Oakeshott 2006: 469–482) and On Human Conduct (OHC 263–316), he discusses the arguments of Francis Bacon, the German Cameralists, and others who impute some collective purpose to the state as an enterprise for promoting some particular substantive goal. This goal might be religious, economic, imperial, or therapeutic. Bacon, for example, argues that the purpose of government is to exploit nature, which implies mobilizing labor for the sake of collective welfare—an implication explored and developed by later thinkers, often but not only those identified as socialist. The “collective” and “welfare” elements of this understanding of the modern state, like the more general theme of exploiting nature for human ends, have become ubiquitous. Oakeshott examines seventeenth-century Puritanism, eighteenth-century enlightened despotism, and twentieth-century fascism and communism, all of which see the state as a corporate enterprise of some kind, as instances of what he calls “telocracy” (or “teleocracy”). In each case, the collective goal is tied to an ideology that professes to offer guidance for how to achieve the goal.
These explorations of ideological politics took Oakeshott in two directions. One, discussed in Section 4 below, was to distinguish alternative understandings of the modern European state, each of which could appear as either an analytical concept or an ideology. The other was to affirm the independence of explanatory theorizing from practical engagement by questioning the commonly affirmed “unity of theory and practice”—an argument, discernible in Heidegger and Gadamer, American pragmatism, and Frankfurt School critical theory, for the practical character of all knowledge (Neill 2013). Heidegger treats practical experience not as one mode of understanding among others but as the primordial experience from which nothing human can free itself. For pragmatists from Peirce to Rorty, ideas arise from our relationship to nature, which is how it affects us and our projects. For critical theorists, all theorizing is determined by the practical concerns that motivate it and is therefore implicitly if not explicitly prescriptive. Even philosophy is practical, at least when it deals with ethics and politics, for those who offer practical guidance under the labels of normative or applied ethics. Moral philosophy, they argue, aims primarily to judge and guide conduct and only secondarily and instrumentally to understand it. A similar point is made about political philosophy.
Oakeshott worked hard to rebut the argument that political philosophy is inherently and unavoidably practical. Not only is it possible to distinguish political philosophy from its object, political activity, but its claim to being philosophical demands that the distinction be recognized. In Oakeshott’s view, moral philosophy properly so-called is theorizing about morality (metaethics). It is concerned to understand and explain, not to prescribe. Prescriptive or normative ethics, he argued early on, is “pseudo-philosophy” (EM 331–346) because it mixes theorizing with moralising. Just as a theory of jokes is not itself a joke (OHC 10), a theory of morality is not itself a morality. The object of theorizing is a “going-on” to be reflected upon (“theorized”) by an observer (a “theorist”) whose reflections may generate conclusions (“theorems”), however provisional (Oakeshott 2004: 391; OHC 3). Theorizing is distinguished from what Oakeshott calls “doing” in that the product of theorizing is an understanding, a theorem or proposition, not, as in the case of doing, an action. In doing, whatever reflection takes place involves deliberating about what to do. The theorizing that distinguishes genuine historical and scientific inquiry from pseudo-history or pseudo-science is not action-oriented and prescriptive but explanatory. What distinguishes philosophical from historical or scientific inquiry is that philosophy is more critical in examining the presuppositions of inquiry: where scientists or historians want to get on with their work, the philosopher is concerned to problematize that work and to examine the experience of thinking itself. Political philosophy, then, is properly philosophical when it examines the presuppositions of political activity.
An objection to distinguishing theory and practice in this way is that it treats as categorial a distinction better understood as one of degree. Political theory is messy. It involves describing and judging, explaining and prescribing, and it is not always clear where one begins and the other ends. They are certainly joined in Oakeshott’s writings despite his arguments for keeping them separate (Haddock 2005). But the objection affirms rather than denies the distinction. This is not to say that it cannot be challenged, but to push the discussion further we must rethink the terms involved, for example by defining practical reasoning as reasoning that results in changes in belief as well as action (Wallace 2020). Alternatively, we might treat the theory-practice distinction as contextual: a philosopher’s theoretical argument can appear practical when read historically as a move in some debate (Nardin 2015: 318–319).
For Oakeshott, philosophy is distinctive because it questions rather than uses other kinds of knowledge. Theorizing politics is therefore not the same as engaging in politics, and to the extent that theorizing is itself political it loses its distinctive character. The irony of critical theory is that there must be things of which it is uncritical in order to do what it purports to do: one cannot question and act at the same time. The contribution of political philosophy, for Oakeshott, is not to generate ideologies or recommend policies but to understand political activity in terms of its assumptions. The knowledge it generates, moreover, is always provisional. Because scientific or historical knowledge is also provisional, this might seem to blur the distinction between philosophy and other kinds of inquiry. But philosophy is distinguished by its relentlessness in questioning presuppositions: it is an inquiry
in which questions are asked not in order to be answered but so that they may themselves be interrogated with respect to their conditions. (OHC 11)
To embrace this activity is to escape the prison of one’s current understanding. For the philosopher, it means leaving politics and even political philosophy behind to pursue other concerns. This is not intended as a description of what political philosophers do (they do many things) nor a prescription for how they should proceed; it is the product of Oakeshott’s reflections on his own experience in moving from engaging political arguments to uncovering their presuppositions.
4. Civil Association
For the study of politics to be genuinely philosophical, Oakeshott thought, it must exchange the vocabulary of political activity for one that explains politics in other terms—different terms from those to be explained. But this can lead to misunderstanding because the vocabularies are not interchangeable. The need to escape the shackles of an inherited political vocabulary explains why, in On Human Conduct especially, Oakeshott modifies that vocabulary to distinguish the kind of association he calls “civil” from association to promote a substantive purpose, “enterprise” association. If we apply the idea of enterprise association to the state, we necessarily generate a conception of it as a corporate undertaking. Civil association, in contrast, implies a state whose laws leave citizens free to pursue their own self-chosen purposes: a state premised on the independence of those associated and therefore committed to resisting the domination that occurs in private life when some impose their preferences on others and in public affairs when the state itself is organized to impose a collective purpose on everyone. For this to work there must be limits to the pursuit of individual purposes, and in civil association these are understood as limits that enjoin respect for the freedom of all. Oakeshott’s Latinate terminology—civitas for state, cives for citizens, lex for law, jus for the rightness of law, and respublica for the common good—springs from his wish to direct the reader away from the conventional connotations of the English words by using words less closely identified with the concerns of enterprise association that pervade modern politics and therefore modern political discourse. Civitas is a mode of association in which cives are related to one another as fellow subjects of common laws and in which the laws based are noninstrumental.
An obvious objection to this view is that a state needs instrumental as well as noninstrumental laws; no state can function without issuing orders and framing policies to secure compliance, raise revenue, defend itself against enemies, and so forth. Oakeshott would not disagree. Any actual state is a mixture of formal and substantive elements, procedures and policies, civil and enterprise association. But defining civil association does not mean identifying the features of an actual state; it means identifying the “postulates” of civil association as a mode of association. These are attributes of a state that determine its civil character and distinguish it from states in which that character is recessive or even suppressed, as in a despotism. Cives are united in their recognition of the authority of lex and of the obligations it prescribes. The law identified as lex constrains citizens in the same way that Hobbes said hedges constrain travelers: keeping them on the roads without prescribing their destinations (Leviathan, ch. 30). To say that the laws in a civitas are authoritative is to say that their recognition as law is independent of whether cives approve of the obligations they prescribe. Similarly, to consider the desirability of a law in civil association is to engage in an activity narrowly focused on the question of whether that law is an appropriate expression of respublica, conceived not as a substantive good, interest, or purpose but as rules, procedures, and offices governing the conduct of the associates (OHC 147–149): this is the res publica, the “public concern”, which is the proper subject for political deliberation in civil association. In an actual state, however, the public concern includes substantive goods that follow from or are needed to sustain the rule of law, for it is the rule of law that defines the civil condition. These goods, as Kant and others have observed, might include policing, roads, schools, hospitals, and social security (Ripstein 2009: chs. 8 and 9). Civil laws do not violate the premises of civil association when they redress “public bads” such as poverty, epidemic disease, or air pollution (de Jongh forthcoming). There is, in short, ample room for welfare concerns within the civil condition, once the idea of civil association is brought down to earth.
Oakeshott considers the implications of a “civil” understanding of the modern state in many writings, but most systematically in his essays “On the Civil Condition” (OHC Part II) and “The Rule of Law” (OH 119–164). Underlying the theory of civil association that he develops in these works is a distinction between two modes of human relationship, one moral and the other prudential. Laws in the mode of civil association, which is an idea abstracted from what might be going on in an actual state, are noninstrumental rules enabling the coexistence of independent wills, not instruments to advance a collective purpose. Such laws are “moral”, in the sense that they prescribe authoritative constraints on how individuals may go about satisfying their wants, not prudential devices for achieving substantive satisfactions. In contrast to persons transacting or cooperating to satisfy wants, those who are related morally (in this sense of the term) are related on the basis of rules as rules: noninstrumental standards of conduct whose authority is distinguished from their utility. One might question Oakeshott’s use of the word “moral” without disputing his suggestion that there is a distinction between the propriety of an act as judged by its relationship to a rule and its consequential desirability. A moral rule binds people regardless of their purposes; it binds enemies as well as friends. As a moral relationship, then, civil association unites people not as subjects compelled to pursue a collective goal but as individuals pursuing goals of their own, subject to the constraints of laws that are not the instruments of some larger purpose.
Lex is what Oakeshott calls an “ideal character”, an abstraction that is not to be confused with the actual law of any existing state. To theorize civil association is not to describe the contingent features of a particular state but to identify the presuppositions of the state as a mode of association. Having identified the modes of civil and enterprise association, Oakeshott is able to distinguish a legal order organized to advance a substantive purpose, one shaped by laws instrumental to that end, from one in which the laws are noninstrumental constraints on the choices of subjects pursuing their own purposes. Once we have grasped the distinction, we can see why he identifies the rule of law with civil association: differentiating the rule of law from other kinds of legal rule is necessary to distinguish between laws premised on the independence of citizens and laws designed to conscript them for purposes not their own and thereby to dominate them. For Oakeshott, the rule of law is a concept, not a description of any existing legal order, much less (as it is for a less philosophical thinker like Friedrich Hayek) a guiding ideal or ideology. In what has been called “the ambiguity thesis” (Friedman 1989), Oakeshott holds that any actual state—any existing legal order—is mixture of noninstrumental rules regulating interactions among citizens and rules instrumental to achieving substantive purposes: an ambiguous combination of civil and enterprise association.
There will, then, be enterprise elements even in states in which the civil character predominates. An actual state must have, in addition to rules of association, some way to recognize, alter, and apply those rules. Civil association, in other words, requires legislative and judicial institutions and an apparatus of “ruling” (policing, licensing, conscripting, and the like). Such institutions are needed to anchor the idea of civility in the real world. The government of an actual state will occupy buildings, keep records, and collect taxes. And as a necessary part of governing it will sometimes pursue substantive policies, attempt to produce particular outcomes, issue specific orders or commands, and concern itself not only with classes of persons but with named individuals. These powers can be, and often are, misused, but they must be available if the rule of law is to be more than “a logician’s dream” (OH 149). But there is a difference between the conceptual presuppositions of civil association and the conditions for realizing it in the circumstances of a particular state. In civil association the persona of the legislator, judge, or administrator is defined by the obligations of lex. A legislator is not an advocate for policies. A judge is not an arbitrator between interests, nor is an administrator the implementer of a collective project. What is to be legislated, adjudicated, and implemented is noninstrumental law, lex, not policies to advance the substantive purposes of a state conceived as a corporate enterprise. In any actual state these roles—legislator and policymaker, judge and arbitrator, ruler and manager—may not be sharply distinguished. But in the mode of civil association, they are distinct.
There is also a difference between the authority of a law and its desirability: a legal order that its subjects disapprove of might have difficulty sustaining itself. The difference is conceptual as well as practical. Oakeshott joins legal positivists in distinguishing the validity of a law as law (which he calls its “authenticity”) from its desirability or justice (its “rightness”). But as his vocabulary signals, there are subtle distinctions that he finds important. In a civil association, a law is authentic if it is the outcome of an authoritative procedure for enacting or otherwise recognizing it as part of the legal order. This leaves open questions about its utility, moral legitimacy, conformity to some standard of fair distribution, or other qualities that might bear on its desirability. For Oakeshott, the rightness of a law (or as he puts it, the jus of lex) is not a matter of its consequences. He does not agree with John Rawls, Ronald Dworkin, or other liberal egalitarians that the rightness of a law (which they call justice) depends on whether it fairly distributes benefits and burdens (OH 156). Nor does he agree that it depends on criteria that Lon Fuller (1969) calls the “inner morality” of law, which requires among other things that laws be public, general, and not retroactive. These are qualities not of justice but of legality, Oakeshott argues. A law that is secret, tailored to benefit or injure particular individuals, or designed to punish acts performed before its enactment is a disguised command, not a genuine legal rule (OHC 128). He also disagrees with those who think that a law’s rightness depends on its conformity with a higher law, whether divine or natural, with principles of human rights, or with any other universal and categorical standard (OHC 174; OH 142).
Oakeshott is less clear about what justice or rightness in civil association is than what it is not. He suggests that the most important consideration in assessing a law's rightness is whether the obligations it prescribes are appropriately imposed, in part because law is inherently coercive (OHC 160; OH 143). That an action is harmful, wrong, or otherwise undesirable is not necessarily a decisive reason to forbid it legally. Whether a state should constrain someone’s choices on such grounds depends on what Oakeshott calls the moral-legal self-understanding of a community (OH 160). If the criteria used in judging the justice of laws are not already embedded in the way a community deliberates legal changes, what is called justice becomes an arbitrary standard that can undermine the rule of law. The defect here arises when we judge a community’s laws according to abstract criteria unrelated to the self-understandings of its members. Here again, Oakeshott's view resembles that of Michael Walzer, who argues that appropriate and effective “social criticism” comes from those who are experienced in the ways of the community they criticize: they are “connected critics” who base their criticism on the community’s own standards. They stand “a little to the side, but not outside” the communities whose practices they criticize (Walzer 1987: 61). The desirability of a law, then, must be judged in relation to the practices of the community. These are not univocal, however, and so the judgments are a matter for continuing debate. Judging well requires a disciplined focus on the obligations a state can properly prescribe. A law might be found wanting, for example, if enforcing it were to require intrusive surveillance. The character of deliberation in a state bearing the character of a civil association is defined by its style more than by its conclusions in particular cases (OH 161).
Oakeshott’s idea of civil association responds to a fundamental question in political philosophy: how can the nonvoluntary character of law be reconciled with individual freedom? And his answer, which self-consciously restates conclusions reached by Rousseau, Kant, and J.S. Mill, among others, is that law respects individual freedom only when it is understood as limited to regulating the activities of citizens pursuing purposes of their own. A legal order of this kind must ensure adequate compliance with its laws, but coercion for that end should be distinguished from coercion designed to advance substantive policies unrelated to maintaining the civil order. The state as a framework of laws for the coexistence of free individuals becomes a tyranny when law is used to impose the purposes of some on others who do not share them. The legal subject in an enterprise state is not an independent citizen but someone to be led, managed, mobilized, or provided for: a subordinate assigned a role in a purposive project. The dependent role-players in an enterprise state and the independent individuals in a civil one are equally “free”, in one sense of that word, because both have “agency”, the capacity to choose even when their choices are constrained. But only in civil association do those associated enjoy “individual freedom”, which for Oakeshott means freedom from being legally subjected to the purposes of others.
This is a version of the republican idea of freedom as independence or nondomination (Skinner 1998; Pettit 1997), though for Oakeshott as for Kant independence is defined in moral rather than material terms and stripped of certain other elements of republican political thought, such as that the people must make its own laws. Individual freedom, which is distinct from the freedom inherent in agency, is not compromised by law in civil association. One reason for this is that in civil association, as a mode of association, laws are general rules, not particular commands. The more nearly a state resembles an enterprise association in practice, the less it can accommodate activities “eccentric or indifferent to its purpose” (OHC 316). Participating in a purposive enterprise can express individuality only if participation is freely chosen. The subjects of an enterprise state are not independent, because the purposes they are compelled to serve have been chosen for them. And although some may contingently escape servitude, whether they are permitted to go (or for that matter to stay) is a management decision (OHC 317). Because individual freedom in enterprise association is the freedom to dissociate as well as to associate, it can exist only if the association itself is voluntary, and this cannot be assumed if the association is a state.
Oakeshott builds his account of civil association in On Human Conduct on an exploration of its presuppositions. These include the ideas of agency, agents, actions, transactions to satisfy wants, instrumental and noninstrumental practices, and the conduct of agents related in terms of such transactions and practices. And he explores ideas about the modern state in European thought and practice, a topic he also discusses in other writings (Oakeshott 1993b, 1996, 2006, 2008). He traces the distinction between civil and enterprise association to the medieval ideas of societas and universitas, terms he borrows (and redefines) for his purpose. Societas designates a relationship of agents in a practice (such as a common language), agents
joined not in seeking a common substantive satisfaction, but in virtue of their understanding and acknowledgement of the conditions of the practice concerned and of the relationships it entails. (OHC 88)
A universitas, in contrast, is a corporate undertaking (such as a partnership or school) established to advance a particular end. Societas is not identical with civil association, however; it stands for a larger class of relationships based on the noninstrumental considerations that define them. The civil condition emerges only when these considerations harden into rules (“laws”) and are supplemented with other rules for recognizing, altering, and enforcing them. Oakeshott examines reflections on the modern state, so conceived, found in Machiavelli, Madison, Constant, and Montesquieu, among others, and more philosophically (that is, in terms of its presuppositions rather than incidental features) in Bodin, Hobbes, Spinoza, Kant, Fichte, and Hegel. He also examines the ideas of thinkers who saw the state as a purposive enterprise. These include Francis Bacon, for whom the state was a productive estate, Joseph de Maistre, who saw it as “a religious corporation in the Catholic idiom” (OHC 281), and various theorists of enlightened despotism, socialism, national self-determination, and economic development. But Oakeshott’s discussion of these thinkers and their arguments is only loosely historical, inviting the charge that he is using them for his own purposes and in a way that does not meet his own standard of genuine historical inquiry.
5. History and the Human Sciences
By distinguishing between thinking to understand and thinking to act, Oakeshott aims to protect historical, scientific, and philosophical inquiry from the imperialism of practical concerns. This aim is evident in his treatment of historical inquiry, especially in his concern to distinguish the idea of a distinctively historical past from what he calls “the practical past”. Genuine historical inquiry is concerned to establish what happened, not to elicit knowledge that speaks to present concerns. It is indifferent to “the lessons of history” (EM 316) or “the living past” (OH 19). His point is not that past experience cannot guide, but that the past that is supposed to guide is not a “historical” past. Nor is it the business of historical inquiry to generate stories about the direction of history. Books about the progress of the human mind (Condorcet) or the end of history (Fukuyama) written from the standpoint of the author’s own time do not observe the modal conditions of historical thought but are instead works of what Herbert Butterfield (1931) called “Whig history”—history designed to ratify, if not glorify, the present. A similar point can be made about stories of decline. By detaching historical knowledge from present concerns, Oakeshott articulates a theory of history as a distinct mode of inquiry and understanding.
Implicit in these claims for the autonomy of historical inquiry is a distinction between naturalistic and hermeneutic ways of understanding human affairs. Oakeshott uses the word “conduct” to identify human choice and action, contrasting it with behavior explained as the outcome of natural processes. Unlike natural phenomena, human conduct involves ideas. And unlike the natural sciences, the “human sciences” (Geisteswissenchaften, the sciences of mind as a body of ideas) require interpreting ideas, especially those that shape intentional and self-conscious action. The human sciences are, in fact, doubly interpretive because they interpret human conduct, which is itself an activity that involves making and acting on interpretations. And when they go beyond generalizing about human conduct to explaining particular acts, the explanations they provide are “historical” explanations.
In making these points Oakeshott draws on late nineteenth- and early twentieth-century German thinking about the study of history, especially the anti-positivism of Windelband, Rickert, and Dilthey. Their arguments rest on a distinction between the realms of human freedom and natural necessity articulated by Vico, Kant, and Hegel, among others. Understanding human conduct in terms of thought and action can nevertheless be scientific—that is, systematic—in its own manner. Such an inquiry might focus on what Hegel called “objective spirit”, shared ideas expressed in languages, moral traditions, and other practices that require interpretation. But it might also focus on individual performances: particular acts, ideas, judgments, arguments, and other products of thinking. In either case, the disciplines of the humanities and humanistic social sciences are concerned with the content of thinking—ideas—not the natural processes that make thinking possible (VLL 23–24). This claim is at odds with how the social sciences are widely understood and especially with much in the disciplines of psychology and cognitive science.
If separating the social sciences from the humanities is a mistake, Oakeshott thinks, another is to imagine that the word “social” designates a subject for investigation. Sociology, he argues, is not a discipline with its own subject matter; it is what remains when disciplines such as economics and psychology have claimed certain aspects of human activity as their own. The study of a residual category cannot be a genuine discipline, nor is there any general science of society that grounds the conclusions of economics, psychology, and the other social sciences. What are loosely called social relationships are actually relationships in terms of specific practices—habits, customs, rules, and roles—that prescribe considerations of utility or propriety in acting. They are not, as Oakeshott thought sociologists were inclined to assume,
components of an unspecified, unconditional interdependence or “social” relationship, something called a “society” or “Society”. (VLL 24)
This is not a point about nomenclature but a claim that a proper discipline has boundaries that enable a coherent inquiry. For Oakeshott, the category that defines coherent inquiry into human conduct is not “social” but “intelligent”. Intelligence, here, is not the quality of being bright or stupid but of having agency, the capacity to think and choose. An excavated object is either a manifestation of intelligence (an inscribed tablet) or not (a rock). In making this distinction, he is not suggesting that the experienced world is made up of two kinds of things but rather that we experience the world differently according to the categories of understanding that we bring to it. For an understanding to be coherent, it must distinguish between the intelligent and the not-intelligent because these categories are mutually exclusive. Propositions about the biochemistry of thinking cannot explain the cognitive content of a person’s thoughts. No inquiry can generate a self-consistent body of knowledge if its objects are categorially ambiguous. These claims restate Oakeshott’s point that cross-modal arguments are necessarily incoherent. Much of social science is undermined by efforts to understand intelligent conduct as the product of not-intelligent physiological, psychological, or social processes seen as natural, that is, operating independently of understanding. Such efforts cannot generate genuine knowledge because they involve a categorial error. Coherent explanation is impossible when
rules are misidentified as regularities, intelligent winks as physiological blinks, conduct as “behavior” and contingent relationships as causal or systematic connections. (VLL 26)
Thoughts and actions can be explained, but only historically, not scientifically. Oakeshott is here deliberately breaking with the view that explanations are always “causal” explanations that invoke scientific laws. Historical explanations presuppose a distinctively historical conception of causation. An argument, choice, or judgment made by a particular agent at a particular moment is an individual performance, an event. Scientific psychology can generalize about how people are likely to act but it cannot explain particular choices, which may fail to illustrate the generalizations. And the reason for this limitation is not only the categorial impossibility of explaining meanings in terms of statistical patterns or natural processes but also the gap between observed generalizations and particular acts. The generalizations about human nature or social conditions found, confirmed, and relied upon by social scientists, though often illuminating, cannot explain the occurrence of particular acts, which viewed as intelligent human conduct are always performances in relation to some practice. The social sciences aim to find causal relationships between variables such as age or income, and to offer explanations in terms of these relationships rather than intelligent choice. Such explanations are possible, but what they explain is variance in the data, not particular performances.
Explaining particular acts, Oakeshott argues, is “historical” explanation, which as he understands it is categorially distinct from scientific explanation. An observed pattern in the data, a statistical generalization, identifies a type of action. A performance, in contrast, is the choice of an actual agent at a particular moment. Science as a generalizing mode of inquiry aims to explain types of events, not particular occurrences. The humanities and humanistic social sciences, in contrast, are concerned with particular acts or other individual objects. The individuality of an act is explained historically by relating it to antecedent events that led to its occurrence as an act with its particular characteristics. An individual act is one in a series of acts, each of which has meaning in relation to acts that preceded it. It is these antecedent acts, or some of them, that illuminate its unique character. Only explanations of this kind are properly historical, Oakeshott argues.
This account of historical explanation departs sharply from a positivist theory like the covering law model (Hempel 1942; Nagel 1961) because it holds that a historical explanation aims to explain not just the occurrence of an event but its cognitive significance, which Oakeshott calls its “character”. Unlike scientific explanations, which postulate repeatable events, historical explanations postulate events that are individual and unique. Positivist theories of historical explanation get things backward by assuming that the event to be explained is already understood as an instance of a type of event, but the historian cannot make this assumption. Historical inquiry is not an exercise in explaining an event whose character is known in advance of the effort to explain it. This character has yet to be established, and it can be established only by showing how antecedent events led to it rather than some other event. The relationship between an antecedent and a subsequent event is a “contingent” one in which the meaning of the subsequent is illuminated by the antecedent.
Oakeshott’s conclusion that history is central to the human sciences results from reflection on the limitations of the natural and social sciences in explaining individual performances. Scholars in the humanities and humanistic social sciences typically interpret such performances in relation to historical practices such as religious ceremonies, musical genres, culinary traditions, or legal procedures, each of which may be understood as a “language” of human performance. But the understanding thereby gained is incomplete, Oakeshott argues, because what it reveals is not the individuality of a performance but rather its “conventionality” (OHC 99–100), the type of conduct it illustrates. As explanation, this kind of interpretation help to understand contexts, situations, and types of action (practices), but it cannot explain the occurrence of particular acts (performances): why a particular person did such and such a thing on this or that occasion.
Given Oakeshott's view of the importance of history among the human sciences, the sustained attention that he devoted to it is not surprising. History is the first mode he considers in Experience and its Modes and he returns to the topic often in later writings. History as a mode of thought is not a record of past events but a distinct way of identifying and explaining them. The task of the philosophy of history, as Oakeshott sees it, is to clarify what distinguishes historical from other kinds of inquiry. Historical investigation cannot simply record historical events because what is identified as an event depends on evidence, and what counts as evidence must itself be established. The point, fundamental to the modern discipline of critical history, was made in 1852 by Gustav Droysen, who argued that
the data for historical investigation are not past things, for these have disappeared, but things which are still present here and now, whether recollections of what was done, or remnants of things that have existed and of events that have occurred. (Droysen 1893: 11)
The historian begins not with the past itself but with survivals from the past that need to be authenticated and interpreted before they can be used as evidence. A historical fact is not simply given. It is a conclusion: not “what really happened” but “what the evidence obliges us to believe” (EM 112). We identify as historical facts the conclusions that our investigations best support. The task of historical inquiry is to establish historical knowledge, according to the canons of the historian’s craft, from evidence that is always scattered, unreliable, and open to interpretation.
Historical knowledge, as Oakeshott sees it, can therefore be said to be constructed. The ideas (“identities”) that the historian uses to organize an inquiry—the Renaissance, India, the Dreyfus affair—are designated, not discovered. And they are changing, not immutable, identities that dissolve under scrutiny into collections of events, which are themselves identities. They are not givens but organizing ideas that are themselves open to reconsideration. Historical explanation means illuminating the circumstantial meaning of an event in relation to its antecedents, which in a genuinely historical inquiry are always events and never scientific laws or processes. In a historical explanation, an event to be explained is made intelligible as the outcome of what the evidence suggests are the relevant antecedents. In this theory, which Oakeshott develops in the second of three late essays on historical inquiry (OH 45–96), a particular historical past appears as a collection of contingently related events, often presented as a story. But not necessarily: he disagrees with the view, which was gaining adherents at the time he was writing, that what distinguishes historical from other kinds of explanations is that they take the form of a narrative (Ankersmit 1983; Danto 2007). Historians do frequently construct narratives, but a narrative is not the only way to present historical knowledge.
If historical knowledge is a construction, it follows that what we identify as the past is actually present because it is what the evidence supports now. Historical facts are present because all facts are present, that is, exist as conclusions within a present body of knowledge. A historical past is constructed according to what present evidence—an object, such as an axe, diary, painting, or coin, that has survived and is treated as evidence—compels the historian to believe. Nor is this historical past the only possible kind of past: if there is a historical past then there must be other, non-historical, pasts constructed in modes other than the historical (OH 9). Of these, Oakeshott is particularly concerned with what he calls the practical past because of the difficulty of distinguishing it from a past resulting from historical inquiry:
even the most severely “historical” concern with the past is still liable to be compromised by seeking the answer to questions which are not historical questions and by asides and even judgments which belong to some other mode of understanding. (OH 118)
A scientific past, such as what happened during the first three minutes of the existence of our universe, must also be distinguished from the historical past. Cosmologists might learn something about this past by running their equations backward, but historians have no equations to run.
What is distinctive about Oakeshott’s conception of historical inquiry can be brought out by comparing it with R.G. Collingwood’s claim that the historian’s proper task is to reenact the past (Collingwood 1993 : 282–302). That claim makes historical truth subjective by requiring that the historian reconstruct past events as they were experienced by those who participated in them. But this privileges the understandings of the participants, who may not have understood or even known what was happening. Their ideas are important in constructing a past but are not everything we need to know to understand it. To argue otherwise is to argue that the historian is barred from having any ideas about a given past that “would have been impossible for anyone who lived in that past” (Oakeshott 2008: 49). Oakeshott also rejects Collingwood’s claim that “all philosophy is the philosophy of history” (Collingwood 1993 : 425) because it makes philosophy, and by implication all knowledge, subservient to historical knowledge (Oakeshott 2007: 199). Collingwood’s argument for the primacy of history (historicism) is as reductionist as arguments for the primacy of science (scientism) or practice (pragmatism). The argument that one kind of understanding is the foundation of other kinds assumes the truth of what it sets out to prove. Historical inquiry constructs knowledge from what it concludes to be evidence. It does not provide knowledge of a given, pre-modal reality. If historical pasts are intellectual constructions, there is no access to these pasts except through historical inquiry.
Works by Oakeshott
- Oakeshott, M., 1933 [EM], Experience and Its Modes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, (ed.), 1939, The Social and Political Doctrines of Contemporary Europe, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 1975a [OHC], On Human Conduct, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- –––, 1975b, Hobbes on Civil Association, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, reprinted 2000, Indianapolis: Liberty Fund.
- –––, 1983 [OH], On History and Other Essays, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, reprinted with different pagination 1999, Indianapolis: Liberty Fund.
- –––, 1989 [VLL], The Voice of Liberal Learning, T. Fuller (ed.), New Haven: Yale University Press. Reprinted 2001, Indianapolis: Liberty Fund.
- –––, 1991 [RP], Rationalism in Politics and Other Essays, New and Expanded Edition, T. Fuller (ed.), Indianapolis: Liberty Fund. Original edition 1962, London: Methuen.
- –––, 1993a, Religion, Politics and the Moral Life, T. Fuller (ed.), New Haven: Yale University Press.
- –––, 1993b, Morality and Politics in Modern Europe: The Harvard Lectures, S.R. Letwin (ed.), New Haven: Yale University Press.
- –––, 1996, The Politics of Faith and the Politics of Scepticism, T. Fuller (ed.), New Haven: Yale University Press.
- –––, 2004, What is History? and Other Essays, L. O’Sullivan (ed.), Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- –––, 2006, Lectures in the History of Political Thought, T. Nardin and L. O’Sullivan (eds.), Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- –––, 2007, The Concept of a Philosophical Jurisprudence: Essays and Reviews 1926–51, L. O’Sullivan (ed.), Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- –––, 2008, The Vocabulary of a Modern European State, L. O’Sullivan (ed.), Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- –––, 2010, Early Political Writings 1925–30, L. O’Sullivan (ed.), Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- –––, 2014, Notebooks, 1922–86, L. O’Sullivan (ed.), Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- –––, in preparation, Correspondence, 1925–90, L. O’Sullivan (ed.), Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- Ankersmit, F., 1983, Narrative Logic: A Semantic Analysis of the Historian’s Language, The Hague: Nijhoff.
- Aristotle, 4th Century BCE, The Nichomachean Ethics, D. Ross (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1980.
- Backhurst, D. and P. Fairfield (eds.), 2016, Education and Conversation: Exploring Oakeshott’s Legacy, London: Bloomsbury.
- Boucher, D., 2012, “Oakeshott in the Context of British Idealism”, in Podoksik 2012: 247–273.
- Butterfield, H., 1931, The Whig Interpretation of History, London: G. Bell and Sons.
- Collingwood, R., 1924, Speculum Mentis, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 1993 , “Lectures on the Philosophy of History”, in Collingwood 1993 : 359–425.
- –––, 1993 , The Idea of History, rev. ed., J. Van Der Dussen (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Connelly, J., 2015, “Accounting for Experience: The Differing Modes of R.G. Collingwood and Michael Oakeshott”, Michael Oakeshott Association Conference, University of Hull, September 17–19, 2015.
- Cowling, M., 2003, Religion and Public Doctrine in Modern England, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Danto, A., 2007, Narration and Knowledge, New York: Columbia University Press.
- de Jongh, M., forthcoming, “Public Goods in Michael Oakeshott’s ‘World of Pragmata’”, Journal of Political Theory, first online 6 December 2019, doi:10.1177/1474885119890452
- Descartes, R., 1641, Meditations on First Philosophy, J. Cottingham (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
- Droysen, J., 1893, Outline of the Principles of History, E.B. Andrews (trans.), Boston: Ginn & Co.
- Dyzenhaus, D. and T. Poole (eds.), 2015, Law, Liberty and State: Oakeshott, Hayek and Schmitt on the Rule of Law, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Franco, P., 2004, Michael Oakeshott: An Introduction, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Franco, P. and L. Marsh (eds.), 2012, A Companion to Michael Oakeshott, University Park: The Pennsylvania State University Press.
- Friedman, R., 1989, “Oakeshott on the Authority of Law”, Ratio Juris, 2(1): 27–40.
- Fuller, L., 1969, The Morality of Law, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Grant, R., 1990, Oakeshott, London: Claridge Press.
- –––, 2012, “The Pursuit of Intimacy, or Rationalism in Love”, in Franco and Marsh 2012: 15–44
- Haddock, B., 2005, “Contingency and Judgement in Oakeshott’s Political Thought”, European Journal of Political Theory, 4(1): 7–21.
- Hart, H., 1958, “Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals”, Harvard Law Review, 71(4): 593–629.
- Hempel, C., 1942, “The Function of General Laws in History”, Journal of Philosophy, 39(2): 35–48.
- Hexter, D. and M. Kenny, “Intimations of Oakeshott: A Critical Reading of his ‘Notebooks, 1922–86’”, European Journal of Political Theory, 18(1): 138–149.
- Kant, I., 1793, “ On the Common Saying: That May be Correct in Theory, but It is of No Use in Practice”, in Practical Philosophy, M.J. Gregor (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996, 273–309.
- Kos, E. (ed.), 2019, Michael Oakeshott on Authority, Governance, and the State, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Marsh, L. (ed.), 2001, Michael Oakeshott: Philosopher, London: Michael Oakeshott Association.
- McIlwain, D., 2019, Michael Oakeshott and Leo Strauss: The Politics of Renaissance and Enlightenment, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Nagel, E., 1961, The Structure of Science; Problems in the Logic of Scientific Explanation, New York: Harcourt Brace & World.
- Nardin, T., 2001, The Philosophy of Michael Oakeshott, University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press.
- –––, 2015, “Oakeshott on Theory and Practice”, Global Discourse, 5(2): 310–322.
- –––, (ed.), 2015, Michael Oakeshott’s Cold War Liberalism, New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Neill, E., 2013, “Michael Oakeshott and Hans-Georg Gadamer on Practices, Social Science, and Modernity”, History of European Ideas, 40(3): 1–31.
- Norman, J. (ed.), 1993, The Achievement of Michael Oakeshott, London: Duckworth.
- Orsi, D., 2016, Michael Oakeshott’s Political Philosophy of International Relations: Civil Association and International Society, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
- O’Sullivan, L., 2003, Oakeshott on History, Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- –––, 2014, “Michael Oakeshott and the Left”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 75(3): 471–492.
- O’Sullivan, N. (ed.), 2017, The Place of Michael Oakeshott in Contemporary Western and Non-Western Thought, Exeter: Imprint Academic.
- Pettit, P., 1997, Republicanism: A Theory of Freedom and Government, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Plotica, L., 2015, Michael Oakeshott and the Conversation of Modern Political Thought, Albany: State University of New York Press.
- Podoksik, E. (ed.), 2012, The Cambridge Companion to Oakeshott, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Ripstein, A., 2009, Force and Freedom: Kant’s Legal and Political Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Skinner, Q., 1998, Liberty before Liberalism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Ryle, G., 1949, The Concept of Mind, London: Hutchinson.
- Thompson, M., 2019, Michael Oakeshott and the Cambridge School on the History of Political Thought, London: Routledge.
- Wallace, R., 2020, “Practical Reason”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2020 Edition), E. Zalta (ed.), forthcoming URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2020/entries/practical-reason/>.
- Walzer, M., 1987, Interpretation and Social Criticism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Williams, K., 2007, Education and the Voice of Michael Oakeshott, Exeter: Imprint Academic.
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