Notes to The Philosophy of Neuroscience

1. See Bickle 1995 and 1998, Chapter 5, and Schaffner 1992 for non-technical overviews emphasizing consequence for the intertheoretic reducibility of cognitive psychology to neuroscience.

2. This assumption is not gratuitous. We saw in the first paragraph of this section that folk psychological generalizations appeal to a variety of propositional attitudes. Eliminativists are also not the only theorists who make this assumption. Versions of Jerry Fodor’s (1981, 1987) influential (and noneliminative) Representational Theory of Mind assume explicitly this account of folk psychology. There have been dissenters, however, including Horgan and Graham 1991 and Jackson and Pettit 1990.

3. See Rumelhart, Hinton, and McClelland 1986 for an overview of this mathematical framework for parallel distributed processing in artificial neural networks structured like brains.

4. For a good overview of this circuitry with helpful illustrations, see Llinás 1975.

5. Hooker 1981a,b,c suggests this terminology. See Bickle 1998, chapter 3 for an attempt to quantify these notions.

6. Gate-control theories hypothesize that the extensive feedback projections in the mammalian pain transmission system serve to inhibit, enhance, or distort feedforward pain information, from nociceptors (pain receptors) to the central nervous system. See Hardcastle 1997 for a critical discussion of these theories, with extensive references.

7. See Paul Churchland 1995, for an illustration of the location of a number of color stimuli in this space.

8. See Paul Churchland 1989 for an eye-opening approximation of this number.

9. Paul Churchland 1995 provides a non-color example of a three-dimensional face space, where the dimensions represent nose width, eye separation, and mouth fullness.

10. For an early articulation of the “explanatory gap”, see Levine 1983.

11. The thalamus is a bilateral structure at the rostral tip of the brainstem. Its various nuclei are densely connected with cortex.

12. Commissurotomy is a surgical procedure to treat severe epilepsy resistant to other regimes. It involves ablating portions of the corpus callosum, a large band of axon fibers connecting neurons across the two cerebral hemispheres.

13. The aphasias are specifically linguistic deficits. They can include, but are not limited to, speech production and speech comprehension deficits. See Kolb and Whishaw 1996.

14. Agnosia is a recognitional deficit that does not involve sensory deficits. A visual agnosic, for example, typically will be able to describe features of objects presented visually, and even accurately draw the object, but will be unable to identify it visually (e.g., “rose”); although typically he or she will be able to identify the object via other sense modalities, like olfaction. A prosopagnosic will be able to identify features of faces, but will be unable to identify whose face it is, even if the face has been presented many times. See Kolb and Whishaw 1996 for a good overview. See Sacks 1985 for some clinical descriptions that depict the human side of the deficit.

15. Aside from the neurophilosophical impact of being able to image specific neural activities while performing specific behavioral and cognitive tasks, the underlying science of these techniques is fascinating. For PET, water or sugar molecules are labeled with unstable radionuclides possessing excessive protons (Magistretti 1999). This extra proton is converted into a neutron by the normal process of radioactive decay. This process emits a positron (a positively-charged electron) which collides with an electron and releases two photons with opposing trajectories. Special detectors located around the head respond to these photons. When two photons simultaneously reach detectors oriented 180 degrees to each other, the positron-electron collision producing them can be localized to a resolution of less than a few millimeters. Water molecules labeled with oxygen-15 are used to measure amount of blood flow, and deoxyglucose molecules labeled with fluorine-18 are used to measure glucose utilization. Both blood flow and glucose utilization are correlated directly with level of neural and glial cell activity, so a PET scan provides an extremely accurate measure of location of neural activity in baseline and test situations. Sophisticated algorithms and computer graphics produce an image of different activity levels in different neural regions. Activity profiles can be analyzed at a variety of imaged “slices” or “cuts” through the tissue (hence the term, “tomography”). Researchers have used PET studies to obtain evidence for, e.g., activity in anterior cingulate cortex as crucial to the executive control of attention (reviewed in Aston-Jones et al. 1999). PET technology has also been used extensively to compare and contrast the various neural areas active during distinct linguistic tasks like reading and writing (reviewed in Caplan et al. 1999).

fMRI technology provides a way to measure directly the amount of oxygenation or phosphorylation in specific regions of neural tissue (Magistretti 1999). These markers are directly tied to neural activity level since they indicate cell respiration and ATP utilization. Depending on its degree of saturation by oxygen, hemoglobin in the blood alters the signal of biological tissue subjected to a strong magnetic field and then released. Biophysicists are still unraveling the exact mechanisms generating these patterns of detectable energy release. Sensors located around the tissue can convert this energy into coordinates to compute resolution of activity less than to a few millimeters, depending on magnet strength (roughly equivalent to PET). fMRI has been used experimentally to study the localization of specific linguistic functions, memorial functions, and executive and planning functions of frontal cortex.

16. See Llinás and Churchland 1996 especially the essay by Merzenich and deCharms, for the variety of “representation” concepts employed in modern neurobiological theorizing.

17. This approach is discussed in section 5 above. It has since been superseded by other methods and analyses that circumvent these criticisms. But Lloyd’s point was historically important. See again the final paragraph in this entry’s Introduction.

Copyright © 2019 by
John Bickle <>
Peter Mandik <>
Anthony Landreth <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]