Supplement to Temporal Logic

Supplement: First-order Relational Structures and Languages

A first-order relational structure consists of:

  • A non-empty set of objects \(D\), called the domain (of discourse);
  • Designated objects or individuals in \(D\) denoted by constants;
  • Designated relations in \(D\) denoted by predicates;

We focus on purely relational structures here. That is, we do not consider structures with designated functions.

Here are some examples of first-order relational structures:

  • the numerical structure \(\mathcal{N}\) on the set of natural numbers \(\mathbf{N}\) with the relations \(=\) and \(<\), and the designated object \(0\).
  • the structure \(\mathcal{H}\) on the set of all humans with the unary relations (i.e. properties) man and woman, binary relations parent of, child of, and loves, and designated individuals Adam, Eve, Joe, Mia, etc.

The vocabulary of a relational first-order language \(\mathcal{L}\) comprises:

  • Non-logical symbols:
    • constants: \(a, b, c, \dots\)
    • predicates (of specified arities): \(Q, R, \dots\)
  • Individual variables: \(x, y, z, \dots\)
  • Logical symbols:
    • truth-functional connectives: \(\lnot, \land, \lor, \rightarrow, \leftrightarrow\)
    • equality: \(=\)
    • quantifiers: \(\forall\), \(\exists\)
    • auxiliary symbols: \(( \ , \ )\)

Terms in \(\mathcal{L}\) are constant symbols and individual variables. Atomic formulae in \(\mathcal{L}\) are of the form \(R(\tau_{1},...,\tau_{n})\), where \(\tau_{1},...,\tau_{n}\) are terms in \(\mathcal{L}\) and \(R\) is an \(n\)-ary predicate symbol in \(\mathcal{L}\). In particular, \(\tau_{1} = \tau_{2}\) is an atomic formula. The set of formulae of \(\mathcal{L}\) can be recursively defined as follows: \[\varphi \ := \ R(\tau_1,\dots,\tau_n) \ | \ \tau_1 = \tau_2 \ | \ \bot \ | \ \neg \varphi \ | \ (\varphi \land \varphi) \ | \ \forall x \varphi, \] where \(R(\tau_1,\dots,\tau_n)\) and \(\tau_1 = \tau_2\) are atomic formulae. The truth-functional connectives \(\vee, \rightarrow\), and \(\leftrightarrow\) are definable in terms of \(\neg\) and \(\wedge\) as usual. In addition, \(\exists x\varphi := \neg \forall x \neg \varphi\). We distinguish between free and bound occurrences of variables in formulae (depending on whether the variable occurs in the scope of a quantifier or not). Closed formulae, i.e. formulae not containing any free occurrences of variables, are called sentences. For more background on first-order logic, see e.g. Fitting and Mendelsohn (1998).

Copyright © 2020 by
Valentin Goranko <>
Antje Rumberg <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]