Notes to Locke on Personal Identity

1. Unless noted, all references to Locke’s Essay are to Nidditch’s edition (L-N): Book, Chapter, Section.

2. For a discussion of the ways in which the place-time-kind principle has been interpreted by Locke scholars, see Jessica Gordon-Roth’s “Locke’s Place-Time-Kind Principle” (2015) in Philosophy Compass.

3. In addition, it appears that Locke is open to the possibility of non-human persons. This comes through in the “rational parrot” passage, or L-N 2.27.8. In this passage, Locke describes a traveler’s tale which depicts a parrot who converses as a rational creature. Locke then intimates that while we might be tempted to call this parrot a “person,” we would never be tempted to call him a “man”. It is thus not only the case that Locke distinguishes between the term “man” and the term “person”, and asserts that the identity of persons and the identity of men can come apart; it is also the case that Locke leaves open that individuals who aren’t human beings could count as persons. A similar point is arguably found in Anne Conway’s Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy (first published in 1690). It is not clear that Locke read Conway’s Principles, though it is clear that Leibniz (for instance) did.

4. There is a degree to which this—the assertion that persons, human beings, bodies, and souls are distinct entities for Locke—has been assumed in the presentation of the imaginary cases that Locke devises in L-N 2.27 in section 1 of this entry.

5. Very few scholars take Locke to think that persons are relations. For a defense of the persons as relations reading, see Marko Simendić (2015).

6. See also Ballibar (2013).

7. As Jolley points out, Leibniz reads Locke as a materialist (1984).

8. Although some work has been done on Locke’s writings on religion (see Nuovo 2002, 2011, 2017, forthcoming; Jolley 2015; and Weinberg forthcoming) and there is increased interest in this amongst Locke scholars, they remain rather understudied, and much of the discussion of Locke’s treatment of persons has taken place without these texts in mind. There is a good deal of work to be done, and new theoretical possibilities to be explored.

9. Catharine Trotter Cockburn publishes her Defence anonymously, but Locke becomes aware that she is indeed the author of the 1702 Defence and sends several books to Cockburn to express his gratitude.

10. Remarks upon an Essay Concerning Humane Understanding (1697), Second Remarks upon an Essay concerning Human Understanding (1697), and Third Remarks upon an Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1699). It was long thought that the author of these pamphlets was Thomas Burnet, but recently it has been uncovered that the author is more than likely Willis. See Walmsley, Craig, and Burrows (2016).

11. Through the “Resurrectio”, however, it also becomes clear that Locke thinks the ultimate punishment for evil persons is (final) death. Locke thus denies the doctrine of eternal damnation. It should also be noted that in some readings of Locke, Locke is a mortalist (this came through in the Locke Workshop held at Mansfield College, Oxford July 2018).

12. As Kenneth Winkler points out, Leibniz is quite sympathetic to Locke’s picture of persons and

held a view of continuity broad enough to transform Locke’s account (as it is usually understood) into something very close to twentieth-century accounts: “for I believe that each of a man’s thoughts has some effect, if only a confused one, or leaves some trace which mingles with the thoughts that follow it”. (Winkler 1991: 201–202)

13. Leibniz, for instance, makes this point (though Leibniz’s New Essays was not published until 1765).

14. Hume’s Appendix complicates the picture even further. Here Hume says,

Most philosophers seem inclin’d to think, that personal identity arises from consciousness; and consciousness is nothing but a reflected thought or perception. The present philosophy, therefore, has so far a promising aspect. But all my hopes vanish, when I come to explain the principles, that unite our successive perceptions in our thought or consciousness. I cannot discover any theory, which gives me satisfaction on this head. In short, there are two principles, which I cannot render consistent; nor is it in my power to renounce either of them, viz. that all our distinct perceptions are distinct existences, and that the mind never perceives any real connexion among distinct existences. Did our perceptions either inhere in something simple and individual, or did the mind perceive some real connexion among them, there wou’d be no difficulty in the case. For my part, I must plead the privilege of a skeptic. (1738 [1896: 636])

15. For more on Hazlitt, see Martin and Barresi (2000).

16. On top of this, it is worth noting that at least seven of the contributors to Blatti and Snowdon’s 2016 volume on animalism discuss Locke’s view explicitly, and others refer, or respond, to Lockeanism.

Copyright © 2019 by
Jessica Gordon-Roth <gordo216@umn.edu>

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