Libertarianism is a family of views in political philosophy. Libertarians strongly value individual freedom and see this as justifying strong protections for individual freedom. Thus, libertarians insist that justice poses stringent limits to coercion. While people can be justifiably forced to do certain things (most obviously, to refrain from violating the rights of others) they cannot be coerced to serve the overall good of society, or even their own personal good. As a result, libertarians endorse strong rights to individual liberty and private property; defend civil liberties like equal rights for homosexuals; endorse drug decriminalization, open borders, and oppose most military interventions.
Libertarian positions are most controversial in the realm of distributive justice. In this context, libertarians typically endorse something like a free-market economy: an economic order based on private property and voluntary market relationships among agents. Libertarians usually see the kind of large-scale, coercive wealth redistribution in which contemporary welfare states engage as involving unjustified coercion. The same is true of many forms of economic regulation, including licensing laws. Just as people have strong rights to individual freedom in their personal and social affairs, libertarians argue, they also have strong rights to freedom in their economic affairs. Thus, rights of freedom of contract and exchange, freedom of occupation, and private property are taken very seriously.
In these respects, libertarian theory is closely related to (indeed, at times practically indistinguishable from) the classical liberal tradition, as embodied by John Locke, David Hume, Adam Smith, and Immanuel Kant. It affirms a strong distinction between the public and the private spheres of life; insists on the status of individuals as morally free and equal, something it interprets as implying a strong requirement of individuals sovereignty; and believes that a respect for this status requires treating people as right-holders, including as holders of rights in property.
It is popular to label libertarianism as a right-wing doctrine. But this is mistaken. For one, on social (rather than economic) issues, libertarianism implies what are commonly considered left-wing views. And second, there is a subset of so-called “left-libertarian” theories. While all libertarians endorse similar rights over the person, left-libertarians differ from other libertarians with respect to how much people can appropriate in terms of unowned natural resources (land, air, water, minerals, etc.). While virtually all libertarians hold that there is some constraint on how resources can be appropriated, left-libertarians insist that this constraint has a distinctively egalitarian character. It might require, for instance, that people who appropriate natural resources make payments to others in proportion to the value of their possessions. As a result, left-libertarianism can imply certain kinds of egalitarian redistribution.
- 1. Self-Ownership
- 2. Other Routes to Libertarianism
- 3. The Power to Appropriate
- 4. Libertarianism, Left and Right
- 5. Anarchism and the Minimal State
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- Related Entries
The family of views making up libertarianism includes many different members. Philosophically most distinctive, perhaps, offers a particular moral theory. This theory is organized around the view that agents initially fully own themselves and have certain moral powers to acquire property rights in external things. This theory sees libertarian policy conclusions as the result of not merely empirical truths or real-world feasibility constraints, but as following from the only defensible (and restrictive) moral principles.
Some libertarians of this kind consider freedom the paramount value. They hold, for example, that each person has a right to maximum equal negative liberty, which is understood as the absence of forcible interference from other agents (e.g., Narveson 1988; Steiner 1994; Narveson & Sterba 2010). This is sometimes called “Spencerian Libertarianism” (after Herbert Spencer).
Most, however, focus more on the idea of self-ownership. Famously, this view is attributed to Robert Nozick (Cohen 1995; but see the discussion below). On this view, the key libertarian starting point is that people have a very stringent (perhaps the most stringent possible) set of rights over their persons, giving them the kind of control over themselves that one might have over possessions they own. This includes (1) rights to control the use of the entity: including a liberty-right to use it as well as a claim-right that others not use it without one's consent, (2) rights to transfer these rights to others (by sale, rental, gift, or loan), (3) immunities to the non-consensual loss of these rights, (4) compensation rights in case others use the entity without one’s consent, and (5) enforcement rights (e.g. rights to restrain persons about to violate these rights).
The idea of self-ownership is attractive for many reasons. We recognize people as self-owners when we recognize that there are things that may not be done to a person without their consent, but which may be done with consent. Thus, we consider rape wrong because it involves a body being used against the will of the person to whom it belongs, but not because there’s something inherently wrong with sexual intercourse. We consider assault wrong for similar reasons, but allow voluntary boxing matches. There are also more theoretical reasons for self-ownership’s attraction. The principle is a strong endorsement of the moral importance and sovereignty of the individual, and it expresses the refusal to treat people as mere things to use or trade off against each other.
Some libertarians hold that people enjoy full self-ownership. We can define full self-ownership as a logically strongest set of ownership rights one might have over oneself. The notion has some indeterminacy, as there can be more than one strongest set of such rights. Still, there is a determinate core set of rights. Central to this idea are full control rights, the right to determine the use of one’s person. Control rights are central to self-ownership in order to distinguish between certain things (like physical contact) that may be done to a person with, and may not be done to a person without her consent. Full-self ownership, in other words, offers protections against others doing things to us against our will.
Obviously, full self-ownership offers the strongest possible version of the benefits of self-ownership more generally. And in many contexts, this is highly attractive. Full self-ownership, for instance, offers a straightforward and unequivocal defense of women’s rights over their bodies, including the right to terminate unwanted pregnancies. It explains why it’s wrong to sacrifice the rights and freedoms of minorities (even a minority of one) for the sake of protecting the interests of the majority. It offers a principled objection to clearly objectionable forms of paternalism or legal moralism. And so on.
At the same time, full self-ownership does can out other moral considerations, including ones that are often thought relevant to justice. Consider the view, made famous (or infamous) by Robert Nozick (1974), that people have a right against being forced to assist others, except as a result of their agreement or wrongdoing. Such a view rules out redistributive taxation aimed at reducing material inequality or raising the standards of living for the poor. Since taxation siphons off part of people’s earnings, which represent people’s labor, and people initially have the right not to be forced to work for certain ends, Nozick argued, redistributive taxation is morally on a par with forced labor.
Nozick’s point was that theories of justice face a choice. One can (a) respect people as the primary controllers of their lives, labor, and bodies. But in that case, people must also be free to work, and not work, as they choose (so long as they don’t violate the rights of others). This means working for whomever they want, on the terms they want, and keeping the gains. Recognizing this leaves little room for redistributive taxation. Or one can (b) endorse the enforcement of certain distributions. But in that case, the theory must endorse taking what people innocently produce through their own labor, redirecting their work to purposes they did not freely choose. This latter option is unacceptable to anyone endorsing the idea of full self-ownership. As Nozick wrote, it involves claiming a kind of control over the lives of others that is similar to a claim of ownership in them. And this is unacceptable (1974, p. 172).
In part because it seems to lead to conclusions like these, the idea of full self-ownership is very controversial. And it’s undeniable that full self-ownership has counter-intuitive implications. A related, but different, worry concerns not duties of assistance, but cases in which a person in extreme need can be greatly benefitted as a result of using another person. Even if one has no duty to assist in those cases, may others use one’s person, without consent, to assist someone in need? Suppose, to use an extreme example, we can save ten innocent lives by gently pushing an innocent person to the ground. Full self-ownership asserts that this would not be permissible. Again, the idea is roughly that since individuals are normatively separate, they cannot permissibly be used to benefit others without their consent.
A third worry is that full self-ownership may permit voluntary enslavement. Just as people have, on this view, the right to control uses of their persons, they also have the right to transfer their rights over their persons to others, for example through sale or git. However, this is controversial among libertarians, some of whom deny that these kinds of transfers are possible because it's morally impossible for others to control one’s will (Rothbard 1982; Barnett 1998, pp. 78–82), because such transfers undermine our autonomy (Grunebaum 1987), or because of theological reasons (Locke 1690). Theorists who endorse the possibility usually argue that libertarian self-ownership is about giving people control over the permissible uses of their person, not about the necessity of some psychological capacity to control their person. As a result, the right to exercise one’s autonomy is what matters here, even if one exercises it in (otherwise) problematic ways, not the protection or promotion of autonomy. (See e.g. Vallentyne 1998; Steiner 1994.)
A fourth concern about the counter-intuitive nature of full self-ownership points out its restrictive implications. Full self-ownership might seem to condemn as wrongful even very minor infringements of the personal sphere, such as when tiny bits of pollution fall upon an unconsenting person. Prohibiting all acts that can lead to such minor infringements poses an unacceptable limit to our liberty. But from the point of view of self-ownership, there is no principled difference between minor infringements and major infringements. Thus, this objection goes, self-ownership theory must be rejected (Railton 2003; Sobel 2012).
This objection, however, is of dubious force as it presupposes an (even more) implausible conception of full self-ownership than its defenders have reason to endorse. Suppose we understand the moral benefits that self-ownership confers along two dimensions: protections from unwanted uses of our bodies, and liberties to use our bodies. As the objection points out, it is not possible to simultaneously maximize the value of both dimensions: our protections restrict our liberties by restricting the possible uses of one’s body, and vice versa. Since maximizing the protection-dimension implausibly restricts the use-dimension, the correct response is not to reject self-ownership, but rather to loosen the protection-dimension somewhat in order to enhance the use-dimension. Doing this would allow minor infringements for the sake of self-ownership. As Eric Mack (2015) puts it, a good theory of self-ownership offers people some “elbow room.” (For more discussion, see Brennan & Van der Vossen 2017)
Nevertheless, many libertarians do reject full self-ownership. It’s possible to weaken the principle along any of the dimensions above in order to avoid the objections, while holding on to the general spirit of the self-ownership view. Thus, one could accept limited non-consensual duties of assistance, say, and accept some reduction in the control-dimension of self-ownership. Others, as we have already seen, reject the idea that self-owners have the power of transfer themselves into (voluntary) slavery. Either way, the result will not be a theory of full self-ownership, but one that approximates that idea.
Weakened conceptions of self-ownership, however, raise important questions. For one, if self-ownership turns out to have multiple dimensions that can be weakened in light of competing considerations, it loses some of its theoretic appeal. After all, part of that appeal was the idea’s relative simplicity, which seemed to make it a good starting point for a theory of justice. Once we start trading off the idea against other considerations, those considerations are thereby admitted into the libertarian moral universe. This raises complicated questions about their relative weights, appropriate trade-off rules, and so on.
Moreover, if trade-offs are possible between these dimensions, we will want to know why we should sacrifice one in favor of the other. And in order to answer that question, we may need to invoke some further, underlying value. This threatens the status of self-ownership as a foundational principle in libertarian theory. Presumably, foundational principles are not based on underlying values. For many libertarians, this is not much of a concession, however. If few endorse full self-ownership, even fewer endorse it as a foundational principle.
Such a move would also avoid a final kind of objection, this one more theoretical in nature. This objection holds that, upon inspection, the idea of self-ownership is neither as simple nor as clear-cut as it initially appeared. One version of this objection points to the indeterminacy of the idea of ownership. Positive law recognizes a wide variety of ownership arrangements, including ones that consist of very different kinds of rights than the self-ownership theorist defends. There may be no clear general notion of ownership to which one can appeal to defend self-ownership. Instead, ownership claims may be conclusions of intricate moral (or legal) arguments (Fried 2004, 2005). However, if self-ownership is understood to be importantly analogous to ownership in general, this poses no objection. Instead, it shows a more fruitful way for theorizing our rights over our persons are more fruitfully (Russell 2018).
While Nozick (1974) is typically read as someone who treats full self-ownership as a premise or foundational principle (see especially the influential discussion in Cohen 1995), it is far from clear that this is correct. One obvious problem is that Nozick invokes the idea of self-ownership only once in Anarchy, State, and Utopia. And while that passage is oft-quoted, in terms of his arguments, the idea as such does little work in the book. Part II of Anarchy, State, and Utopia develops a large number of arguments against redistributive conceptions of justice which do not invoke or rely on the idea of full self-ownership.
Nozick also invoked ideas that contradict reading him as a proponent of full self-ownership as a foundational principle. He argued that self-ownership is an expression of the Kantian requirement that we treat people only as ends in themselves (suggesting that the Kantian idea, and not self-ownership as such, is foundational). And he didn’t wish to rule out that any plausible theory of rights must allow that they can be overridden in order to prevent “catastrophic moral horror” (Nozick 1974, p. 30). It seems, then, that self-ownership is the view at which Nozick arrives, on the combined strength of all the arguments that he provides (Brennan & Van der Vossen 2017).
That said, it’s important to note that not all libertarians accept that the idea of full self-ownership should be weakened or treated as non- foundational. Some remain committed to the idea and have offered responses to all the objections above. For one prominent reply to worries about indeterminacy and related theoretical objections, see Vallentyne, Steiner, & Otsuka 2005.
Just as Nozick may have seen libertarianism as the best way to express a host of moral considerations in the realm of justice, so too many other libertarians embrace different principles as the foundation of their theories. Such authors seek to honor people as rights-holders or sovereign individuals, whom we need to treat as the primary claimants of their lives and bodies. But they also seek to avoid some of the implausible elements of full self-ownership. Views like this treat self-ownership neither as necessary maximally strong, nor as self-evident or foundational.
Libertarian theory can thus be defended in many different ways. This is true both of theories that give pride of place to self-ownership and of theories that don’t. Examples of the former include Eric Mack (2002, 2010) who sees self-ownership rights as among several natural rights grounded in our nature as purposive beings. In Mack’s view, the protections and freedoms offered by the idea are justified in order to grant to all individuals a separate sphere in which they can act in accordance to their self-chosen purposes. Similarly, Loren Lomasky (1987) derives rights from a related, although slightly different, conception of people as project pursuers. John Tomasi (2012) argues that strong rights over our bodies are required by the ideal of democratic legitimacy. According to Daniel Russell (2018), self-ownership rights provide the only way that people who live together can all genuinely live their own lives.
Many libertarian theories invoke insights from economics. An influential strand of thinking in this tradition, closely related to F. A. Hayek and Ludwig von Mises, argues that libertarian or classical liberal political conclusions follow from human epistemic limitations. Free societies, and in particular free market systems, best utilize the available information in society by allowing and incentivizing individuals to act on the partial information they possess, including information about their local circumstances, needs, and desires, as well as their productive abilities and the trade-offs that those might present. Any society that wants to deviate from the decentralized decision-making represented by market exchange, the argument goes, will have to collect, process, and fully understand all this dispersed and complex information, aggregate it into some kind of social welfare function, and assign goods accordingly. This latter process is simply beyond our capabilities. Free societies thus will predictably outperform other societies on important metrics (Hayek 1960, 1973; Von Mises 1949).
Another example follows the work of Adam Smith, claiming that libertarian ideas are inherent in our ordinary moral psychology. Smith famously considered justice to be strictly negative in nature: something we satisfy simply through abstaining from theft, coercion, and other violations of libertarian rights. Thus, in The Theory of Moral Sentiments, Smith wrote that the rules that “call loudest for vengeance and punishment are the laws which guard the life and person of our neighbour; the next are those which guard his property and possessions; and last of all come those which guard what are called his personal rights, or what is due to him from the promises of others” (Smith 1759 , p. 84). These are the only acts that are generally disapproved of in a way calling for punishment (1759 , p. 78). Human rule following of this kind is desirable because it’s conducive to the stability and effectiveness of society (1976 , p. 86).
None of this means that people don’t have obligations to assist others. Smith grounds his view in a deeply social view of moral psychology. Thus, benevolence along with justice is a pillar of society. However, we cannot expect or force people to care for distant strangers in the same way as they care for themselves. And trying to organize a society along these lines would lead to disaster. Smith was extremely skeptical about government officials, writing about how they seek fame and power, think themselves morally superior, and are more than willing to serve their own interests and those of well-connected businessmen rather than the public good (Smith 1776 , pp. 266–7). And, perhaps foreshadowing Hayek, Smith argued that governments are generally incapable of knowing enough to guide large numbers of people. Human beings make their own decisions and respond to circumstances, thus thwarting any systematic plans the government might lay out for them. Thus, as a rule, it’s more promising to appeal to people’s self-interest through market exchange than to use state coercion.
Libertarian arguments of this kind cast the state as an arbitrator, an impartial agent that makes fair and productive cooperation between citizens possible, much like a referee enables fair play by administering the rules of the game. It’s crucial, then, for the state to remain impartial and not choose sides in society or the economy. Once governments begin benefiting one party over another, whether this be certain groups in society or business interests, such involvement is in principle off-limits and likely to backfire as it will favor whoever is politically well-connected or favored at the time. The minimal state, then, is the only state capable of structuring complex and deeply interdependent societies in ways that are mutually beneficial.
Of course, this discussion still omits many other members of the libertarian or classical liberal family of views. Some theorists depart from consequentialist or teleological principles, which they see as best served by these policies (Epstein 1995, 1998; Friedman 1962; Rasmussen & Den Uyl 2005; Shapiro 2007). Others adopt a Rawlsian framework, either claiming that the spirit of John Rawls’ theory of justice (particularly a concern for the least well off) calls for a far greater respect for individual freedom than is usually thought (Tomasi 2012). Yet others see classically liberal requirements flowing from a public reason or justificatory approach (Gaus 2010, 2012).
Libertarian and classical liberal theories conceive of distributive justice as largely (sometimes exclusively) historical in nature. To ask whether justice obtains in the world is mainly to ask whether people have been justly treated, principally whether their rights to their persons and possessions have been respected. Even though distributional issues can be relevant for assessing the justice of a society (see the next section), libertarians generally see people’s rightful possessions as whatever they acquired in legitimate (i.e., rights-respecting) ways. As a result, they reject theories that look merely at outcomes or end-state distributions.
The most common mode of just acquisition is through the legitimate transfer of prior just holdings. This is why libertarians generally defend noncoerced, nondeceptive market relations as just. Of course, not all modes of legitimate acquisition can depend on prior just holdings—there must be a starting point, an original acquisition. In Nozick’s “entitlement theory” distributive justice consists entirely of these two modes of acquisition and a principle of rectification for their violation.
The broader point is that libertarians generally accept that individuals can carry out such acts of original acquisition. More precisely, they accept that individuals can acquire unowned goods unilaterally, without having to ask the consent of approval of other people, some governing body, or anything else. The argument for not needing the permission of others to use and appropriate the external world is relatively straightforward. The moral benefits of private ownership are important, and if there is a good justification for having a system of private property, it should be possible to derive a justification for acts that begin to bring about such rights as well. Any view that would require the consent of others, or some kind of government legitimation, creates barriers to acquisition and thus threatens these moral benefits (Van der Vossen 2009, 2015; Mack 2010).
The most famous account of how unilateral original acquisition is possible remains Locke’s labor theory. According to Locke, when people work on previously unowned objects, subject to certain provisos, they turn those objects into their private property. The precise nature of Locke’s argument, the relation between labor and acquisition, as well as the nature of the provisos, are hotly contested. The most famous interpretation, again, seeks to ground property in the (prior) rights of self-ownership. On this view, when people labor they quite literally extend their claims of self-ownership over external objects, thus drawing them into their rights-protected sphere. As Locke (1690 , chapter V) put it, since laboring mixes one’s labor, which one owns, with something that is unowned, the previously unowned thing becomes owned.
This argument suffers from well-known problems. For instance, since laboring is an activity, the idea of mixing it with an object seems at best a metaphor for something else. But in that case, the argument is incomplete: we still need to know what really grounds property rights (Waldron 1988). More importantly, it simply is not true that mixing something owned with something unowned is sufficient for appropriation. As Nozick pointed out, if I pour a can of tomato juice that I own into the unowned ocean, I lose my tomato juice—I do not gain an ocean (Nozick 1974, pp. 174–5). Third, if labor-mixing really were sufficient for generating claims in objects, why should this be restricted to unowned goods? Why not say that mixing my labor with something already owned generates a claim of coownership (Thomson 1990, pp. 326–327)?
In light of these and other objections, many have offered different defenses of private property. These justifications depend neither on accepting a prior thesis of self-ownership, nor on the affiliated thesis that self-ownership rights can be extended outwardly through labor. Instead, these arguments point to the moral importance of people having security over external resources, whether this is understood in terms of support for political and civil liberties (Gaus 2010), our ability to be project pursuers or purposive agents (Lomasky 1987; Mack 2010), or the ability to be the authors of our lives (Tomasi 2012).
An influential line of argument ties the justification of property to the material prosperity and well-being that it brings about. Rights of private property serve to divide the external world into a number of discrete, individual parts, each exclusively controlled by its particular owner. Organizing the social world in this way is preferable to collective use or ownership because it helps avoid collective action problems. When things remain held in open-access commons, we all have an incentive to use as much as we can, leading to a general pattern of use that ends up depleting the resource, to everyone’s detriment. Rights to private property not only avoid such a “tragedy of the commons,” they also incentivize people to preserve their parts, increase their productivity, and exchange what they own with others on mutually beneficial terms (Schmidtz 1994; Buchanan 1993).
Since these justifications of property do not rest on a prior principle of self-ownership, they are not committed to seeing property rights as in any way absolute, immune to just regulation, or even precluding any and all forms of taxation. Despite what is sometimes suggested (Freeman 2001), virtually all libertarians that reject self-ownership as a starting point also accept that property rights need specification, can be instantiated in quite different, yet morally acceptable forms, and might be overridden by other moral considerations. Such views do not entail the impossibility of unilateral original appropriation either.
Libertarians and their critics are concerned with the issue of original appropriation primarily because it demarcates a major fault line in political philosophy. The libertarian’s historical conception of justice, and the accompanying insistence that governments refrain from redistributive projects, require that property rights do not depend on the government, positive law, or the consent of others for their moral validity. Such a view is viable if one can establish the possibility of unilateral appropriation, without essential reference to the existence of the state or law.
Libertarianism is committed to a strong guarantee of basic liberty of action. However, even views that endorse the strongest possible form of self-ownership do not guarantee such liberty. For if the rest of the world (natural resources and artifacts) is fully owned by others, one is not permitted to do anything without their consent—since that would involve the use of their property. Since agents must use natural resources (occupy space, breathe air, etc.), free people require rights to use parts of the external world.
The question arises, then, what constraints (if any) exist on ownership and appropriation. Libertarian theories can be put on a continuum from right-libertarianism to left-libertarianism, depending on the stance taken on how natural resources can be owned. Simply stated, a libertarian theory moves from “right” to “left” the more it insists on constraints aimed at preserving some kind of equality.
At one end of the spectrum sits the maximally permissive view of original appropriation. This view denies there are any constraints on use or appropriation (Rothbard 1978, 1982; Narveson 1988, ch. 7, 1999; Feser 2005). Thus, agents may appropriate, use, or even destroy whatever resources they want (assuming, of course, that they violate no one’s self-ownership in the process). As a result, this view sees natural resources as initially unprotected. However, this is not a very popular view, as it simply ignores the problem above: property relations can threaten people’s liberty and even self-ownership, irrespective of their own voluntary choices or wrongdoing. Such a theory does not live up to libertarian ideals very well.
Most libertarians, then, accept something like what’s come to be known as the Lockean proviso. This proviso holds that appropriation is permissible if “enough and as good” be left for others. There’s an extensive debate over how exactly this proviso is to be understood. Nozick interprets the proviso to require that no one can be made worse off as a result of use or appropriation, compared with a baseline of non-use or non-appropriation. But this interpretation is problematic for at least two reasons. First, this such a welfare-based constraint on the exercise of people’s natural right to appropriate seems ill-motivated within Nozick’s theory. In general, the exercise of our rights isn’t usually constrained by a non-worsening requirement. Second, Nozick’s proviso is vulnerable to the objection (raised by Cohen 1995) that, as long as property owners compensate non-owners only slightly over the pre-appropriation baseline (which is likely quite low), non-owners are not wronged. This would be true even if the owners extracted almost all of the benefits of cooperation, and that seems unfair.
Others interpret the Lockean proviso as requiring something like a sufficientarian requirement, such that people must have access to an adequate share of natural resources (Lomasky 1987; Wendt 2017). This view might invoke differing conceptions of adequacy, such as well-being or the ability to be self-governing (as in Simmons 1992, 1993). Or one might see the proviso as ensuring the ability to exercise one’s rights of self-ownership (Mack 1995).
At the other end of the spectrum, left-libertarians think it implausible that people who first use or claim natural resources thereby become entitled to unequal benefits. Since natural resources are not created or produced as such, left-libertarians claim that the value of these resources belongs in some sense to everyone, This common ownership of the world supports some egalitarian constraints on appropriation and use.
What we might call equal share left-libertarianism—advocated by Henry George (1879) and Hillel Steiner (1994), for example—interprets the Lockean proviso as requiring equally valuable shares of natural resources for everyone. Thus, while individuals are morally free to use or appropriate natural resources, those who thereby acquire more than their share (understood in terms of per capita value) owe compensation to others. This constraint is enduring significance. It applies at the moment of appropriation, and encumbers subsequent through time. Others claim that the equality requirement is supposed to also compensate for disadvantages that result from different natural abilities (such as the effects of genetic differences). Thus, Otsuka (2003) claims that the Lockean proviso prohibits appropriations that diminish the opportunities of others for well-being beyond the opportunity obtained by appropriating or using a natural resource.
As an interpretation of Locke’s requirement that appropriators leave “enough and as good”, however, left-libertarian views are implausible. In his discussion of appropriation, Locke invokes the idea of distributive shares only three times (sections 31, 37, and 46). All appear in the context of the (quite different) prohibition on letting things spoil. In these cases, and in these cases alone, Locke sees appropriation as taking what belongs to others. His point is clear: when we take but don’t use, we remove things for others to take and use—which was the point of allowing unilateral appropriation in the first place.
At this point, left-libertarians often claim intuitive support for an egalitarian proviso. When multiple people are presented with a previously undivided resource, equal division is the intuitively fair approach. An objection, however, is that such intuitions apply only to circumstances that ignore relevant conditions. For instance, while Otsuka (2018) is correct to claim that if two persons are stranded together on an island, equal division is the intuitive solution, this may not be true if one person arrived earlier, already cultivated, say, two-thirds of the island, while leaving more than enough for the second person to independently make a living, is willing to cooperate, trade, and so on. In that case, the latecomer insisting that she has a right to half the island is not only counter-intuitive, but probably just wrong. The intuition of equal division becomes even less appealing if we imagine more than two parties, capable of production, trade, and cooperation, arriving at different times. It remains true, of course, that such latecomers will be entitled to something like an equally good shot at making use of the world’s resources. What such an equally good shot comes to, however, is much less clear.
Whatever interpretation of the proviso one accepts, however, libertarians left and right agree that once persons enjoy legitimate rights over their property, these are more or less immune to other claims of distributive justice. There is little room in the theory for thinking that certain distributions or material outcomes are morally significant as such. To the libertarian, concerns such as material equality are inconsistent with an appropriate concern for people’s equality. (See, e.g., Schmidtz 2006.) Thus, Nozick (1974) argues in his famous discussion How Liberty Upsets Patterns that because any system of property must allow gifts and other voluntary transfers, and because these will significantly upset whatever distribution is put in place, there is very limited room for concerns with distributional equality. Since treating people as moral equals means respecting them as the holders of these rights, and since such rights will be exercised in ways that will not equalize material outcomes, forced redistribution counts as unjust.
None of this is to say that libertarians are not concerned with outcomes at all. John Tomasi (2012, p. 127) argues that many libertarians and classical liberals are committed to a kind of distributive condition requiring that societies must be expected to work to the benefit of the least well-off. This seems to overstate the matter considerably, but it is certainly true that many libertarians see their policies as promoting the general good, and this plays an important role in their justification. Hence, libertarians are wont to point out that being poor in a free society is much better than being poor elsewhere, that markets in general do not work to the detriment of the poor, and so on.
Libertarians are highly skeptical of political authority and state legitimacy. Since people are, quite simply, independent and equal beings, with none naturally subordinated to any other, states (like all other agents) ought to respect the moral rights of individuals, including their rights over their persons and their legitimate possessions. For this reason, libertarians typically require something like voluntary consent or acceptance for legitimate state authority.
Unfortunately, all states fail to satisfy this requirement for many of their subjects. As a result, they use massive amounts of force in ways that are morally impermissible. States violate the rights of citizens by punishing people for self-regarding conduct (e.g. taking drugs, refusing to purchase health insurance, or engaging in consensual sex in private). Similarly, states violate the rights of their subjects by forcibly transferring their legitimate possessions to preferred others (e.g. to bail out large companies, to provide for pensions, or pay for public parks). States violate the rights of citizens when they forcibly prevent them from innocently contracting and associating with others, exercising their religion, occupy certain professions because of their ethnic background, gender, or sexual orientation, and much, much more.
A standard objection here is that, since so much of modern life seems to require a state, libertarianism’s anarchist stance is problematic. In reply, libertarians typically argue that many of the effects of states are extremely negative. States wage devastating wars abroad, restrict migration with devastating results for the world’s poor, and oppress and violate the rights of many of their own citizens. Moreover, many of the positive effects that states can bring about can also be obtained through voluntary mechanisms. Libertarians tend to be more hopeful about the possibility of anarchic provision of order, public goods, as well as charitable giving. (See, e.g., Huemer 2012; Chartier 2012.)
Even though libertarians are generally quite hostile to state authority, this does not mean that the state cannot permissibly undertake certain minimal activities. This includes most obviously the enforcement of individual rights and freedoms. These activities do not presuppose state authority since such activities are permissible with or without people’s prior consent (unless, of course, such activities involve the violation of rights themselves).
Some theorists, such as Hayek (1960), argue that it can be permissible for people to be forced to pay for basic police services. But this argument seems problematic within libertarian theory. If people do not agree to their legitimate possessions being used for these purposes, it would be unjust to force them to pay for these services, even if they clearly benefit a benefit as a result. After all, libertarians generally deny that merely receiving a benefit suffices to justify enforceable requirements to pay.
Some left-libertarians endorse further “state-like” activities for the state, which other libertarians would reject. Since most left-libertarians recognize enforceable duties to compensate others in proportion to the value of the natural resources they possess, the state might forcibly collect and disburse these payments. Some hold that even various public goods can be forcibly provided, including basic police services, national defense, a basic system of roads, etc. The underlying justification here is that the provision of these public goods will increase the value of natural resources, making the taxed amounts a case of self-financing. (Vallentyne 2007)
One popular argument for state authority holds that states can be legitimate if they are democratic. Libertarians tend to be very skeptical about this view. A large body of empirical findings has shown that voters tend to be radically uninformed, ignorant, and indeed biased about political issues. And democratic deliberation does little, if anything, to improve this. Indeed, it seems like it is rational for people to remain ignorant about politics. Given that one’s causal influence on the quality of political decisions is negligible, and it is costly in terms of time and effort to become informed, it is rational for people to remain ignorant. Most people thus vote in ways that have more to do with signaling their ideological allegiance or virtues, and less with the merits of the issues (Caplan 2008; Somin 2016; Brennan 2016; Pincione & Tesón 2011).
In addition to voter ignorance, many libertarians fear the more general dynamics of state power. Public choice theory points out that since the best way to understand the behavior of political agents is along roughly maximizing lines, there is little reason to think that the state will generally behave in the public interest (Tullock & Buchanan 1962). Thus, many government policies impose widely dispersed costs on the populace to confer localized benefits on a few, often politically well-connected elites. Examples include the large-scale bailouts of financial companies and agricultural subsidies.
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- Vallentyne, Peter. “Libertarianism,” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (2014), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2014/entries/libertarianism/>. [This was the previous entry on libertarianism in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
The editors note that as of the January 2019 update, no content by the original author, Peter Vallentyne, remains in this entry. So he is no longer listed as an author.