Notes to Yeshayahu Leibowitz

1. In an eightieth birthday tribute to Leibowitz published in Hebrew translation as “The Conscience of Israel” in the newspaper Ha’aretz, 4 March 1983, 18.

2. See Sihot, 54. Leibowitz states here that he believed Levinas’ work was significantly shaped by his Judaism, as much in his general philosophy as in his Jewish writings.

3. These remarks only appear in the original Hebrew version of this piece—“Mitzvot Ma’asiyot,” in Torah u-Mitzvot. Though I have generally tried to refer to the English translations from Judaism throughout, on the few occasions when quotations from Leibowitz’s Hebrew texts are required, the translations are my own.

4. This comparison assumes Steven Nadler’s view that Spinoza’s pantheism is reductive and thus “extensionally equivalent to atheism,” Nadler 2006, 119. Notably, this is a point that Leibowitz himself often makes, defining atheism as the view that “the world is the totality of being, or, in other words, that it is God” (Accepting the Yoke, 14).

5. While, as we will see presently, parallels are often drawn between elements of Leibowitz’s thought and that of Kant, here it is notable just how closely Leibowitz’s ideas parallel those of the Neo-Kantian Jewish thinker Hermann Cohen, for whom the uniqueness of God is described in terms of his nonsensible "being," which is to be sharply distinguished from "existence," which is "attested by the senses" (Cohen, 1919, 44). God’s being, moreover, "does not admit any mixture, any connection with sensible existence," (ibid., 44-45), and to connect the two in any manner similarly leads directly to pantheism according to Cohen.

6. The Temple, for example, does not have any intrinsic property of holiness—“holiness” is a function of religious acts as we will see, and does not exist independently of those actions. Only activity directed to God is holy and the holiness of the Temple thus consists only of the holy actions performed there. See Judaism, 46–47.

7. Hanoch Ben-Pazi, however, has attempted to argue that despite Leibowitz’s explicit statements to the contrary, whether consciously or not the holocaust is in fact foundational to his thought. Indeed, it is the prime motivation for his complete elimination of God from history, which is based on the "crisis of faith" engendered by the sheer impossibility of any theodic reconciliation between traditional conceptions of God and an evil of such magnitude. (See Ben-Pazi 2008).

8. See for example his statement at the beginning of “Lishmah and Not-Lishmah,” in Judaism, 61–78.

9. Additional reasons for Leibowitz’s denial that the Torah is a work that contains cognitive information are detailed in Sagi 1997, 432ff. A more wide ranging discussion of arguments against reading science into the opening chapters of Genesis that includes consideration of a Leibowitzian position can be found in Shatz 2008.

10. Of the various sources of rabbinic authority in the Torah, the most oft cited is Deuteronomy 17: 8–11, which tells of coming for judgment to the “priests, the Levites and the judge that shall be in those days,” and to not deviate from their judgment. Rabbinic interpretation and comment on this is voluminous. Particularly relevant to this discussion is Moses Maimonides, Mishneh Torah, “Laws of Rebels,” 1: 1–2.

11. For example, “The acceptance of the yoke of Torah and Mitzvoth is the love of God, and it is this that constitutes faith in God.” (Judaism, 44–45, emphasis added).

12. Leibowitz does note the possibility of exceptions where individuals arrive at practice based on “faith,” rather than practice, though he believes that it must indicate a prior religious propensity. See Judaism, 7. The phenomenon within Judaism of Ba’alei Teshuvah—the term used to describe Jews who decide to turn to Jewish practice without having been practitioners to that point, might fall into this category for him.

13. Unsurprisingly given the foregoing discussion, there are those see Leibowitz as suggesting a Kierkegaardian “leap of faith” type of theology – or non-theology – albeit one where the leap is taken retrospectively, consequent to the very practices that constitute it, by which time whatever independent specification one attempts to give of faith ends up either transgressing boundaries that Leibowitzian transcendence sets on language and thought, or collapsing back into talk of commitment to the practice. The Kierkegaardian allusion here is one to which we will return.

14. See, for example, Judaism, 20 and 22 for the view that such worship is idolatrous. In contrast, Judaism, 40 and 66 speak of it as permitted.

15. Interestingly, Levinas here may split the difference between Kant and Leibowitz, agreeing with the former that ethics is a form of contact with the noumenal, but agreeing with Leibowitz that it is not a deliverance of practical reason. See Fagenblat 2004 for further discussion of these issues.

16. A further sticking point here will also be how one understands “rationality.” Brafman 2105 touches on many of these criticisms.

Copyright © 2019 by
Daniel Rynhold <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]