Notes to Kant’s Account of Reason

1. We might also note Kant’s view of logical reasoning. In the Introduction to the Transcendental Dialectic, Kant distinguishes “logical” from “real” or “pure” uses of reason. The logical use of reason represents a “subordinate faculty” (A305/B362) of drawing inferences (syllogisms), and Kant says relatively little about it in the Critique. It is the “pure” use, whereby reason “itself contains the origin of certain concepts and principles” (A299/B355), that demands critique: hence, of course, the book’s title. For extended discussion of this distinction, see Patrone 2008: Ch. 3.

2. This neglect is perhaps less surprising if we recall Kant’s disparaging remarks about attempts to answer the general question, “What is truth?” at B82/A58ff.

3. Cf. O’Neill 1984, which draws on Jean Piaget’s studies of young children’s knowledge of the world. When asked whether the number of beads will stay the same when they are spread out over a longer distance, for instance, children below a certain age will assume that the number of beads has increased. As O’Neill says, it is difficult to say just what the child believes in this case; in Kant’s terms, his or her beliefs do not meet the formal conditions of truth.

4. It is easy to miss the role that others’ judgments play when reading the first Critique, since Kant’s concern is largely with the transcendental conditions of experience in general. However, as Gelfert 2006 persuasively argues, testimony (and hence communication: cf. §§3.2 & 3.3 of the main entry) are fundamental to Kant’s analysis of knowledge among actual human beings. For example, Kant’s lectures on logic refer to “the criterion of truth: to compare one’s opinions with those of other people... The principle of indifference etc. to the judgments of others in comparison with my own is [by contrast] the principle of logical egoism” (24.2:740, as quoted/translated by Gelfert 2006: 644). See also Mikalsen 2010 for a recent application of these insights.

5. Cf. “the systematic unity of the understanding’s cognitions… is the touchstone of truth of rules” (A647/B675); “it can never be permitted to ascribe such a faculty [i.e., freedom] to substances in the world itself, because then the connection of appearances necessarily determining one another in accordance with universal laws, which one calls nature, and with it the mark of empirical truth, which distinguishes experience from dreaming, would largely disappear” (A451/B479); “What is connected with a perception according to empirical laws, is actual” (A376). Cf. Bxli, A492/B520f.

6. This last point raises the problem of induction—see Allison 2004: Ch. 15 and Kant and Hume on Causality.

7. Since Kant emphasizes the role of teleological explanation in biology, it is also worth noting the exemplary way in which evolutionary theory satisfies this demand. By showing how purposiveness emerges through natural selection, evolutionary theory integrates mechanical and teleological explanation, revealing the unity behind apparently conflicting scientific principles.

8. Genesis, Ch. 11—the literal meaning of “Babel” being “confusion.”

9. O’Neill 1989: Ch. 1 especially emphasises this passage, as well as the epigraph that Kant added to the second edition of the Critique from Francis Bacon’s Great Instauration. Bacon deploys the same imagery of making trial, secure founding, planning, construction, modesty and limits that Kant now uses.

10. Kant often uses the disparaging verb “vernünfteln,” akin to “rationalise” (Vernunft being the German word for reason).

11. Cf. Kant’s comment in the Prolegomena: “High towers and the metaphysically-great men who resemble them, around both of which there is usually so much wind, are not for me.” (4:373n)

12. Kant states this very clearly in “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?”: “if reason will not subject itself to the laws it gives itself, it has to bow under the yoke of laws given by another; for without any law, nothing—not even nonsense—can play its game for long” (8:145).

13. “But who would even want to introduce a new principle of morality and, as it were, first invent it? Just as if, before him, the world had been ignorant of what duty is or in thoroughgoing error about it.” (Critique of Practical Reason, 5:8n)

14. Kant was already clear about this in the so-called “Prize essay,” an “Inquiry concerning the distinctness of the principles of natural theology and morality” (1764). He expands on the point in the first Critique’s Doctrine of Method, in the section entitled, “The Discipline of Pure Reason”; cf. Bx ff.

15. Thus a number of writers have stressed the more modest, defensive idea of vindication at work in Kant: not a positive proof that permits no doubt, but a defence that address the specific worries of specific audiences—while of course remaining open to the possibility that other audiences will raise other worries. Cf. Ameriks 2003, or this claim from Łuków (1993: 221): “It is neither sufficient nor possible to prove law and freedom, but it is sufficient and possible to defend them by identifying the practical constraint which testifies to their instantiation in actual lives.”

16. Passages at A310/B358 and A316/B373 are very close to the central principle of legal order explored in the Doctrine of Right, the first part of the Metaphysics of Morals—but this is not yet the underlying idea of the Categorical Imperative.

17. Please see the note at the beginning of the bibliography for an explanation of these references to Kant’s moral writings.

18. We might add a third reason. We also have an interest in the unity of philosophy, that might be frustrated if practical and theoretical reason did not stand in a definite hierarchy. Cf. Guyer 1989.

19. Of these ideas, we have already seen the special status of freedom in Kant’s system (just as it had a somewhat anomalous position within the “Antinomies” of the first Critique). In fact, the postulates only appear after Kant thinks he has demonstrated the practical reality of freedom, which is known to us by the second Critique’s famous (and, as we have seen, nearly as controversial) “fact of reason.”

20. Kant is not totally pessimistic about the results of good action—in his Lectures on Ethics, he comments, “if only all men together were unanimously willing to promote their happiness, we might make a paradise of Novaya Zemlya” (Collins, 27:285f). Novaya Zemlya is a Russian arctic archipelago—ironically enough, one later used as a nuclear test site. (My thanks to Jens Timmermann for this reference and information.)

21. A terminological note: Kant sometimes also refers to this as the highest “derived” good, as compared with God’s existence as the highest “original” or “independent” good—5:125, 132; “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” 8:139.

22. Remarkably, O’Neill’s work is not considered in the most important study on Kantian reason to appear since this entry was first written. Ferrarin 2015 emphasizes the autonomy and activity of reason, and some of the same metaphors as O’Neill. He also mentions (at 262) the “common principle” that Kant says is shared by speculative and practical reason. But he does not consider what this might be, or consider the place or justification of the Categorical Imperative in Kant’s account. Chapter 1 of his study is valuable for the close attention it pays to Kant’s “cosmic” conception of philosophy (A838/B866 f; see also Ypi 2013) and the central role of &ldsquo;ideas of reason.” This represents an important corrective to readings of the first Critique that dwell on the justification of everyday knowledge and sideline Kant’s overarching concern to make sense of philosophical reasoning. Ferrarin’s work also repays reading for its reconciliation of two, apparently conflicting metaphors that Kant uses for reason: the constructive, architectural metaphor (also emphasized by O’Neill) and the biological image of an organism with its own unity, needs and ends.

23. One might also cite the fact that Kant links autonomy not only to practical but also theoretical reason: “the power to judge autonomously—that is, freely (according to principles of thought in general)—is called reason.” (Conflict of the Faculties, 7:27)

24. But the maxims are formulated much earlier, before the publication of the first Critique: see the unpublished notes R1486, 15:715f (1775-77) and R1508, 15:820, 822 (1780-84); they also appear in the Lectures on Logic, 9:57, as “general rules and conditions for avoiding error.”

25. Kant’s words repay close reading: To think for oneself “is the maxim of reason that is never passive. The tendency [to passivity], hence to heteronomy of reason, is called prejudice; and the greatest prejudice of all is representing reason as if it were not subject to the rules of nature, i.e. superstition. Liberation from superstition is called enlightenment, since, although this term is also applied to liberation from prejudices in general, it is superstition above all… that deserves to be called a prejudice, since the blindness to which superstition leads… is what makes most evident the need to be led by others, hence the condition of a passive reason.” (5:294f)

26. “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” 8:144. Cf.: “…if this freedom [of the pen] is denied, we are deprived at the same time of a great means of testing the correctness of our own judgments, and we are exposed to error” (Anthropology, 7:129). Universal communicability is also central to Kant’s account of aesthetic judgment, following his discussion of the three maxims in the third Critique (5:295—7).

27. For a rather different, but perhaps complementary, attempt to reconstruct key Kantian insights about reason, while preserving aspects of the instrumental and communitarian approaches, see Brandom 2001 & 2002: Ch. 1.

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