Supplement to John of Salisbury

The Epicurean Tyrant

The matter of King William II Rufus stands out, in John of Salisbury’s corpus, as a special case of tyranny, in that Rufus both embodies the quintessential example of the poisonous head of the secular body politic and serves to illustrate the connection between piety and justice. In one brief paragraph (no element of which occurs in his source text), John paints a fulsome picture of a thoroughly depraved Epicurean and an impious and unjust ruler, immoderate in every way:

[H]e was wasteful of his own property, grasping at others’, very fond of wild beasts but very unconcerned about people, a promoter of warfare and wickedness but a most vehement oppressor of the Church and innocence, an enthusiastic devotee of pleasure, as one might expect of one in whom love of the world and contempt for God flourished equally without moderation or measure. But what is most unbecoming a prince, he had no respect for his body and debauched himself by every kind of uncleanness (A&B: 38).

The cumulative, polluting effect of such a ruler is, not surprisingly, a diseased and dissolute realm:

Not only the nobles, but even the common folk, although they were ill used, followed the prince as much as they could, … since it is well known that such as the ruler of a country is, so are those who dwell in it. (A&B: 38)

Throughout John’s account, he refers to Rufus most frequently as “the godless/impious king” (A&B: 45, 51) and, of course, a tyrant. The principle lesson of the Policraticus’ discussion of tyrants is that all come to a bad end, which, regardless of manner, is ordained by God. Just so, John declares of Rufus that “he who had lived like a beast met a bestial end”, because “the hand of the Lord had carried out a glorious vengeance for His Church” (A&B: 54–55). The hand of the Lord, in this case, may have been Rufus’ own (A&B: 56); John’s source text reports the possibility that Rufus himself (mis)shot the fatal arrow.

As fitting as the end of Rufus is, John makes a significant alteration to Anselm’s reaction to the news of his king’s untimely death, which highlights the degree to which John’s judgment on tyrants was entirely uncompromising. Despite the long exile and many other deprivations and depredations Anselm had been forced to endure at the hands of his monarch, Anselm had never wavered in his loyalty, “pray[ing] to the Lord every day for [Rufus’] conversion and salvation …” (A&B: 53). When Anselm learned of the king’s sudden death, he was distressed by the realization that Rufus had died without having reconciled himself to God and to the Church. In Eadmer’s Vita Anselmi (John’s source), Anselm laments that “he would much rather that his own body had died than that the king had died in his present state” (Vita Anselmi: 126; emphasis added). In John’s version, Anselm “would have preferred the king to be alive in the good graces of the Lord than dead in such a way” (A&B: 54; emphasis added). While the eternal damnation of his monarch disturbed Anselm greatly, John is far more sanguine about this punishment being meted out on a tyrant. For John, tyrants don’t just come to a bad end, they come to the ultimate Bad End.

Copyright © 2016 by
Karen Bollermann <>
Cary Nederman <>

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