Notes to Innateness and Contemporary Theories of Cognition

1. The selection of studies reviewed in this central section, as well as the discussion, draw heavily on Carey (2009). This significant work discusses a wide range of important findings in conceptual development (to which Carey has been a major contributor). Carey defends the Nativist view, but argues for a critical role for learning in the conceptual changes that follow.

2. Chomskyan linguistics was not alone in rejecting the anti-mentalist constraints of Behaviorism. There was interesting work being done along parallel tracks on memory and category learning, and cybernetics and information theory were also beginning to focus attention on internal processes. Chomsky’s work had a ‘multiplier effect’ on all these initiatives. Bechtel & Abrahamsen 1999 tells the history very well.

3. Chomsky has varied a good deal of the theoretical apparatus over the years, but the picture here—drawn mainly from the Chomsky 1965—was especially influential. See Cowie 2010 for a thorough (but skeptical) discussion.

4. This idea was not itself new. Chomsky 1966 discusses a number of earlier attempts to use language learning as evidence for Nativism and a Rationalist conception of mind.

5. The common dismissal of instincts and reflexes as somehow ‘not counting’ in the Nativist-Empiricist debate is relevant here.

6. Pinker 2002 explores the cultural and intellectual resistance to Nativism.

7. In fact, in Darwin it did—especially with regard to the emotional elements of human nature (1998/1872).

8. Chomsky builds much of his social theory on this idea (see McGilvray 2005 for discussion).

9. We are talking here about the adoption of influential paradigms and the direction of research, not evidence and argument. All the polemical points we’ve reviewed remain controversial and debate about their ultimate correctness continues.

10. The proper characterization of a module is a matter of ongoing debate (see Robbins 2010 for a detailed discussion).

11. Downes 2010 is a useful summary of the state of the art here.

12. This immediately raises questions about the relation between the innately based information embodied in these Pleistocene tools, and their truth. For discussion of the possible philosophical ramifications of this evolutionary perspective, see Plantinga 1993, Nagel 1997, and Street 2006.

13. See Pinker & Bloom 1990 (and the exchanges following the target article).

14. The resistance to evolutionary explanations in psychology, in a nutshell, is based on the complaint that such explanations have ignored an alternative hypothesis—viz., that larger brains were selected for because they provided a crucial advantage vis-à-vis some challenge x (we will probably never be able to determine what that x was), and that as a side effect of this growth, humans came to have the ability to use language, prove theorems about Hilbert spaces, etc.

15. See, for instance, Gallistel 2000 and Marler 1991. Burge 2010 discusses such animal systems with an eye to understanding their specific representational content and standing (and this bears directly on Nativist claims). His views also bear on the proper interpretation of many of the findings about infants and young children discussed in section 2.

16. But there are attempts to model other domains on language—see, for example, the grammar-type model of morality—discussed in Mikhail 2008 and Hauser 2006.

17. Piaget 1928, 1936/1952, and 1954 are some very important works in this regard, but the output of Piaget and his collaborators is prodigious. For a philosophical discussion of Piaget, see Flanagan 1991.

18. One significant attempt to bring the Piagetian and Chomskyan paradigms into conversation was not a great success (see Piatelli-Palmarini 1980).

19. Some are exploring the possibility that there is also a distinct core domain focused on social relationships, and another on space and geometry. There is also some disagreement about whether our grasp of physical objects is part of the perceptual system itself or is a post-perceptual conceptual achievement.

20. We do not discuss the continuing Nativist work on language acquisition, which is covered extensively in the Cowie 2010 entry on Innateness and Language.

21. See for example, Laurence & Margolis 2007 and Leslie, Gallistel & Gelman 2007

22. The system is ‘abstract’ in the sense that it is not a feature of visual perception and/or audition per se, but operates to link the outputs of such systems. See Burge (2010, chapter 10) for further discussion.

23. Here we ignore the possibility that innate systems of this sort might somehow be deactivated or extinguished.

24.Wellman et. al. (2001) discusses two decades of false-belief studies and argues that they support the view that children go through a significant conceptual change in coming to understand belief. There is also now a large literature investigating the neural substrate of belief attribution, the role of mental state language and complement syntax, the influence of executive function ability on mental state attribution, the connection of belief attribution and theory of mind to autism and other developmental disorders, etc. Doherty (2009) is a recent study of the research in this area.

25. Although we don’t discuss moral cognition here, these findings bear on the infant’s empathy and readiness for moral evaluations.

26. This argument-schema about the Nativist implications of the Classical computationalist view of mental representation has been controversial from the start—see, for instance, the papers in part II of Hook 1969.

27. Griffiths & Yuille 2006 is a useful primer on the range of sophisticated tools and techniques used in Bayesian models; see also Joyce 2008 (entry on Bayes’ Theorem).

28. Note that, as with factory settings of artifacts, such settings may be over-ridden. We may be able to learn new priors, and there may be second-order priors that govern such updating. So if there are innate priors, they are just initial settings, and not hard constraints; they need not close us off to the true nature of things.

29. Here we set aside questions about the ‘psychological reality’ of Bayesian models—e.g., Does the mind/brain actually execute Bayesian $$calculations (or are there heuristics that approximate the results)? Are learners sensitive to the relevant parameters of such calculations? Do they store the right sorts of information? Some of these questions are being addressed; see, for example, Teglas et. al. 2011 for some suggestive findings about infant’s sensitivity to probabilities and Xu 2007.

30. Tenenbaum 2006 provides a useful cross-section of current research.

31. This will include not just Bayes’ theorem but a range of information pertaining to the collection and characterization of the data, including information about how to sample the world, how and what to store, what conditions to consider reliable, relations between samples and populations, etc.

Copyright © 2017 by
Jerry Samet <>
Deborah Zaitchik <>

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