Notes to Optimality-Theoretic and Game-Theoretic Approaches to Implicature

1. This assumption is controversial. Those who don't accept this assumption should think of other examples where the semantic meanings of the alternative expressions form a linear chain with respect to inference. The scale ⟨and,or⟩ would do equally well, just as ⟨all,most,some⟩, if the quantifiers ‘all’ and ‘most’ give rise to an existential presupposition.

2. The choice of alternative expressions is crucial for any analysis of Quantity implicatures. Gazdar (1979), among others, assumes that alternatives are conventionally associated with certain lexical items. It seems more natural, however, to assume that this choice depends (also) on the question being asked, and/or what is relevant in the conversation (see, for instance, van Rooij, 2004).

3. This definition is less general than Blutner's actual definition, but comes down to the same for the example at hand.

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Robert van Rooij <>
Michael Franke <>

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