Feminist Perspectives on Science
Feminists have a number of distinct interests in, and perspectives on, science. The tools of science have been a crucial resource for understanding the nature, impact, and prospects for changing gender-based forms of oppression; in this spirit, feminists actively draw on, and contribute to, the research programs of a wide range of sciences. At the same time, feminists have identified the sciences as both a source and a locus of gender inequalities: the institutions of science have a long tradition of excluding women as practitioners; feminist critics of science find that women and gender (or, more broadly, issues of concern to women and sex/gender minorities) are routinely marginalized as subjects of scientific inquiry, or are treated in ways that reproduce gender-normative stereotypes; and, closing the circle, scientific authority has frequently served to rationalize the kinds of social roles and institutions that feminists call into question.
Feminist perspectives on science therefore reflect a broad spectrum of epistemic attitudes toward and appraisals of science. These perspectives range from urging the reform of gender inequities in the institutions of science by calling attention to the underrepresentation of women or neglected questions while still embracing the standards and practices of the sciences they engage, to critical and constructive alternative programs of research that, to varying degrees, aim at transforming the framework assumptions, methodologies, substantive content, and epistemic ideals that shape the sciences. The content of these perspectives, and the degree to which they generate transformation depends not only on the types of philosophical and political commitments that inform them but also on the nature of the sciences and their subject domains. Feminist perspectives appear to have had greater impact on sciences that deal with objects of inquiry that are understood as gendered—those in the social and human sciences—and, secondarily, on sciences where the objects of inquiry are often characterized in gendered terms, metaphorically or by analogy (projectively gendered subjects)—chiefly the biological and life sciences. Feminist perspectives are relevant to sciences that deal with non-gendered subject matters, but perspectives vary substantially in content and in critical import depending on the sciences and the particular research programs they engage.
- 1. Dimensions of Difference among Feminist Perspectives on Science
- 2. Feminist Equity Critiques
- 3. From Selective Appropriation to Content Critique
- 4. The Feminist Methods Debate
- 5. Feminist Science Studies
- 6. Philosophical Implications
- 7. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Feminist scientists, critics, and analysts of science articulate positions that range from profound ambivalence to respect and enthusiasm for the sciences. At the critical end of this spectrum lie such famous indictments of science as Virginia Woolf's declaration: “science, it would seem, is not sexless: he is a man, a father and infected too” (1938). Lorraine Code expresses a similar view at the meta-scientific level. She argues that many of the epistemological ideals that inform science have androcentric origins and that once subjected to feminist scrutiny these ideals are found to be in need of reconstruction (1991, 314; 1993, 20). The worry here is that the sciences are not just superficially or inadvertently androcentric—male-centered in the questions they ask, in their claims and practice, their institutions and authority, their implications for the lives of women and for those marginalized within normative sex/gender systems—but are fundamentally sexist; they embody deep and systematic gender bias by which women, and any interests, perspectives, or insights associated with them, are disvalued and marginalized. On this view the sciences are “master's tools,” to use Audre Lorde's phrase (1984), that will inevitably subvert attempts to turn them to emancipatory or, at least, non-oppressive ends.
In fact, such implacably negative views of science are more often attributed to feminists than embraced by them. The claim that feminists are categorically hostile to science appears to derive from a conviction that feminism, as a political stance, is inimical to science. On this view, the distinctive objectivity of the sciences depends on shielding scientific inquiry from the influence of contextual (non-epistemic) values and interests of just the sort that feminists would bring to bear. However, such an understanding of the objectivity of science begs the question of the role of values in science and assumes a clear distinction between epistemic and non-epistemic values. Since the late twentieth century research exploring the role of values in science —undertaken by both feminist scholars and those who do not explicitly identify as feminist —suggest a more nuanced understanding of how epistemic and non-epistemic values interact and shape science in a variety of ways, including setting research agendas, evaluating evidence, and justifying theories (see for example Douglas 2009; Kitcher 2003, 2011; Lacey 1999; Longino 1990, 2002, 2012; Solomon 2001). However, even if one holds a traditional understanding that good science should not incorporate non-epistemic values, except perhaps in the choice of research questions, it does not follow from feminist critiques—of scientific institutions, the authority vested in the disciplines identified as scientific, framework assumptions, or specific methodologies and research results—that feminists are hostile to the sciences, to the epistemic ideals presumed to underpin the sciences, or to the diverse assumptions and methods associated with specific research traditions.
Many feminists embrace (and defend) the orienting ideals and tradition-specific conventions associated with the fields in which they work. Some focus chiefly on equity issues, often insisting that gender bias in the institutions of science does not bear on issues of content or method (see the section Feminist Equity Critiques). Others make a case for redefining research priorities without challenging existing research traditions; they aim to extend well established modes of inquiry to questions that have not been asked and to aspects of otherwise well mapped subject domains that have been neglected but that are of particular interest to women and feminists. This selective appropriation of the tools and methods of science as they have been traditionally understood also serves critical ends when feminists use them to expose and correct gender bias in the content of favored models and theories or background assumptions. Advocates of these “successor science” projects, as Sandra Harding describes them (1986, 160, 240), often endorse the very epistemic ideals of value freedom and objectivity feminists have been accused of repudiating. They insist that feminist critiques of and contributions to the sciences should be taken seriously precisely because they represent better science, in a traditional sense.
In practice these more circumscribed feminist critiques of science—equity critiques, arguments for applying the tools of science to new research questions, localized critiques of sexism or androcentrism in specific claims or methods, and remedial research designed to correct these omissions or biases—often lead to more profound epistemic/methodological, ontological/theoretical, and socio-political questions about the sciences than their advocates (initially) intend (see the sections From Selective Appropriation to Content Critique, The Feminist Method Debate, and Philosophical Implications). Even epistemically conservative critiques expose a depth and pervasiveness of gender bias in our best science as well as in manifestly bad science (Harding 1986, 19, 102–105), calling into question the neutrality of the conceptual frameworks within which scientists work and, by extension, the capacity of standard research methodologies to ensure the objectivity they claim. Consequently feminist critique anywhere along the spectrum of epistemic attitudes can and has led to more radical re-evaluation of the standards of good science, including questions about the neutrality of method and what is meant by the objectivity of science. Conversely, new questions lead to new research strategies, new categories of analysis, and an expanded repertoire of explanatory hypotheses, which frequently result in research programs that chart new domains of inquiry (see the section From Selective Appropriation to Content Critique). In the end, feminist initiatives often reshape scientific practice and in the process challenge its orienting ideals (see the section Philosophical Implications).
It is epistemically significant that critical reflections on these feminist interventions in the sciences, undertaken internally by practitioners and by external commentators and scholars, suggest that the interests and “angle of vision” that feminists bring to bear on the sciences can play a constructive role in exposing error, raising evidential standards, and generating innovative insights both within and about science (see the section From Selective Appropriation to Content Critique). Hence feminist critique can pose a fundamental challenge to the conviction that non-epistemic and/or contingent contextual values unavoidably corrupt the capacity of science to generate credible knowledge. What constructive as well as critical feminist engagements demonstrate is that non-epistemic and/or contextual values are not only ineliminable from scientific practice, but are instrumental to its empirical and explanatory success, including its capacity to interrupt entrenched patterns of understanding (see the section Philosophical Implications). The central epistemic challenge for feminists then is to conceptualize what counts as success in scientific inquiry in terms that realistically capture both its capacity to generate empirically rigorous, explanatorily probative knowledge and its context-specificity (see the sections The Feminist Method Debate and Philosophical Implications below). The usefulness of the sciences to feminists—the emancipatory promise of scientific inquiry as a resource for understanding and changing sex/gender inequities — depends precisely on this paradoxical epistemic character of empirical inquiry: that the sciences are a thoroughly social, human undertaking bearing the marks of their context of origin and the interests of their practitioners, yet with the capacity to challenge—to critically transform—the very assumptions, interests, and beliefs that constitute these contexts and motivate scientific inquiry.
The diversity evident in the various feminist perspectives on science arises, then, on several dimensions:
- feminists engage the sciences as practitioners operating within particular sciences intent on improving their field; as science studies scholars of various kinds interested in understanding the histories, social dynamics, and epistemic norms that animate sciences; as external commentators concerned with issues of accountability and with the impact of science on society, specifically on women and gender minorities;
- feminists focus on distinct aspects of science: its institutions; its methods and underlying epistemic commitments; its content, ranging from highly specific models and empirical claims to quite general framework assumptions (ontological, theoretical, and epistemic);
- feminist critiques of sexist or androcentric content take different forms depending on the nature of the science and its subject domain (e.g., whether it is thought to be intrinsically gendered, projectively gendered, or gender-neutral);
- feminists adopt a range of epistemic stances: some embrace quite conventional ideals of objectivity, evidence, and justification while others reject these epistemic presuppositions; some insist that a distinctive, new approach is required while others bring established philosophical perspectives to bear in articulating alternative epistemologies;
- the level of abstraction at which feminist perspectives on the sciences are formulated varies considerably, from critiques and interventions that are specific to particular research programs and the claims they generate, to conceptual analysis of overarching theoretical/ontological commitments and orienting ideals.
The result is, not surprisingly, a highly diverse array of feminist perspectives on science.
Feminists have challenged both the presumption that the sciences are an inherently masculine domain—that women are unfit for science, or science unfit for women—and the conviction that the institutions of science are a model of gender-neutral meritocracy. Feminist historians of science document entrenched historical patterns of exclusion of women while, at the same time, recovering evidence of women's active participation in the sciences, often in the face of stiff resistance. Analyses of the gendered structure of contemporary science undermine gender-conventional explanations of the continued marginality of women and show that inequalities persist in the representation, recognition, and effective integration of women into science, even as they gain access to the “training pipeline,” demonstrate an aptitude for scientific training, and make substantial contributions to the sciences.
The historical research on women in science suggests that the masculine profile of the sciences, as they have developed in Euro-American contexts in the last 300 years, was by no means monolithic or inevitable. For example, Londa Schiebinger argues that elite women and women involved in traditions of craft production in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries played an active role in the early formation of the sciences. The best known are noblewomen like Queen Christina of Sweden (1626–1689), Margaret Cavendish, the Duchess of Newcastle (1623–1673), and Madame du Chatelet (1706–1749), all of whom made contributions recognized by their peers but were denied membership in the scientific academies that were taking shape in their day. The emerging New Science “st[ood] at a fork in the road” with respect to the inclusion of women, Schiebinger argues (1989, 100), but as it became established it was defined by monastic university traditions and associations of aristocratic men that not only excluded women but, more generally, purged all things feminine (Schiebinger 1989, 9, chapter 8). The major academies of science excluded women: Marie Curie (1867–1934) was denied membership in the French Academie des Sciences in 1911 despite being the first person to win two Nobel Prizes (in 1903 and 1911); the U.S. National Academy of Sciences admitted its first woman (Florence R. Sabin) in 1925, but it was not until 1962 that the French Academie elected Marguerite Perey, an assistant to Marie Curie, as a correspondent of the Academie (Ramey 1992; Schiebinger 1989, 2). After the 1860s, when women were first admitted to universities and colleges, they slowly gained access to training in the sciences. By the 1940s there were “thousands of … women working in a variety of fields and institutions, whereas sixty or seventy years earlier there were about ten at a few early women's colleges” (Rossiter 1982, xviii). This was an achievement realized by “the best efforts of a host of talented women, who, seeing how both science and women's roles were changing around them, took steps to carve out a legitimate place for themselves in the new order” (Rossiter 1982, xviii). Nonetheless, these gains came at the price of what Margaret Rossiter describes as “a pattern of segregated employment and underrecognition” which few women escaped (Rossiter 1982, xviii); they served predominantly as technicians, assistants, or “computers,” and populated women's colleges and schools of home economics. Moreover, these gains proved to be vulnerable. The “new order” suffered a sharp downturn in the 1950s, when conventional views about the social roles appropriate for women regained prominence and women's participation in the sciences declined, as in paid jobs and the professional workforce generally, in the post-war years. It was another twenty years before women regained the levels of representation they had achieved in the sciences in the 1920s and 1930s.
Second wave feminist activism was instrumental in regaining and building on the educational gains realized by first wave feminism. These challenges to the continuing marginalization of women, in the sciences as in many other spheres of professional and public life, resulted in landmark legislation in the late 1960s and early 1970s that mandated equal opportunity in employment and education; chief among these were the Title IX Education Amendments of 1972 that extended the Equal Pay Act of 1963 to higher education (Rossiter 1995, 382). Women have since made dramatic gains, doubling and quadrupling their representation in college and graduate programs in science, and among employed scientists and engineers. Taking all the science and engineering disciplines together (the NAS includes social and life sciences, as well as physical science and engineering), women have received 25% or more of the PhD's awarded in the sciences for the last thirty years; since 2000, they have accounted for more than 50% of the bachelor's degrees awarded in the sciences. In 2006 women were awarded 40% of the doctorates in the sciences and engineering (National Science Foundation, Division of Science Resource Statistics, Survey of Doctorate Recipients 2006). The distribution of degrees by discipline illustrates more clearly where the majority of these gains have been. “[W]omen earned almost half the doctorates in earth, atmospheric, and ocean sciences, chemistry, and math; and approximately one-fifth of the doctorates in computer science, engineering, and physics”(AAUW 2010, 12).
Since the mid-1980s, however, there has been growing concern that these gains for women in the science training “pipeline” have not been translating into comparable improvements in their representation in faculties of science and in “leadership positions” in the sciences (NAS 2007, ix); as one commentator put it in 2000, thirty years after the formal barriers to women's participation had been struck down, the representation of women among full professors was still less than 10%, well below what you would expect given “the number of doctorates awarded … [and] the number of years it takes to move from PhD to full professor” (Greenwood 2000, 19). In academia as a whole, women continue to be concentrated in the most insecure positions and at the lowest ranks of the academic hierarchy; despite their growing representation in the PhD training pipeline, this “inverted pyramid” pattern of distribution—a primary target of feminist challenges to educational and employment inequities in the 1960s—has proven to be stubbornly resistant to change. This pattern of distribution is especially clear in the sciences. 19.4% of full professors in science and engineering are women compared with 25% across all fields. This disparity is amplified at the top research institutions where women make up only 16% of full professors in science and engineering. “If we compare the percentage of tenured female faculty in 2006 with the percentage of STEM doctorates awarded to women in 1996 (allowing 10 years for an individual to start an academic job and earn tenure), in most STEM fields the drop-off is pronounced. ...Even in fields like biology, where women now receive about one-half of doctorates and received 42 percent in 1996, women make up less than one-quarter of tenured faculty and only 34 percent of tenure-track faculty in 2006” (AAUW 2010, 17). This pattern is reflected in salary differences and other professional rewards, in disparities in types of appointment and in rates of promotion, even when a range of other variables—e.g., institutional type, measures of productivity, discipline—are taken into account (Ginther 2004; West and Curtis 2006, 12).
The question of how to explain these persistent inequalities in the representation of women in the sciences has been the focus of intense controversy. Conventional accounts typically invoke the talents, drive, and preferences of women. For example, in 1979 Jonathan Cole argued that inequities in the employment status, compensation, and reputational standing of women in the sciences are best explained in terms of their self-selection out of the training pipeline and, when they persist in professional careers, by lower levels of productivity that cannot be accounted for by marital or parental status; in short, women conform to gender-conventional expectations even if they get the necessary training. In a statement that generated intense public debate twenty-five years later (2005), Larry Summers (who was then the president of Harvard) reiterated these intuitions without the backing of any systematic analysis of the kind Cole presented, and without responding to the wide range of critiques and reassessments that have substantially undermined Cole's claims in the intervening twenty-five years. From the outset, feminists challenged both the specifics of Cole's analysis and the assumptions that informed it noting the difficulty of disentangling the influence of the environment in which women make choices from their “natural” inclinations. Through the 1980s, a growing body of grass-roots, activist research documented what came to be known as the “chilly climate” for women in academic institutions (Hall and Sandler 1982; The Chilly Collective 1995; Wylie, Jakobsen, Fosado 2008). While overt, intentional discrimination was by no means a thing of the past, what these reports documented were the debilitating effects for women of having to negotiate a “host of subtle personal and social barriers” that run along lines of gender difference and that often operate “below the level of awareness of both men and women” (Sandler 1986, 17; Hall and Sandler 1982, 2984). The sorts of mechanisms reported in these studies include, for example, the patterns of exclusion of women from informal mentoring and communication networks within the profession and the workplace; gender-normative work assignments that channel women into heavy advising, undergraduate teaching, and into administrative positions that carry substantial organizational responsibility but little decision-making power; gendered patterns of evaluation bias by which, for example, the accomplishments of women are more readily attributed to luck or external factors while those of men are treated as evidence of talent, training, and hard work (for an overview, see Wylie 1995; Wylie, Jakobsen, Fosado 2008).
The insights central to these reports and pamphlets came to prominence when the authors of the 1999 MIT report on the Status of Women in the Faculty of Science declared that women continue to face gender discrimination in this “post-civil rights era” but that it does not operate through the formal, overt barriers to participation that had mobilized activists in the 1960s. It takes the form of diffuse but persistent differences in recognition and response: “a pattern of powerful but unrecognized attitudes and assumptions that work systematically against women despite good will” (MIT 1999, 11). The MIT study documented systematic differences in such tangibles as salary and merit increments, institutional responses to external job offers, internal support for research, and the allocation of office and laboratory space, as well as more subtle differences in service expectations, teaching assignments, and the influence women have over decisions that affect their worklife. Although “micro-inequities” in these various areas may each seem trivial, taken individually, they translate into patterns of devaluation and marginalization that amplify through the trajectory of a career. The MIT study reports an age-related pattern of gender differences that is corroborated by a growing number of quantitative studies of gender difference in scientists' career trajectories (e.g., Ginther 2004; Sonnert and Holton 1995; Xie and Shauman 2003); small initial differences (in salary, initial appointment, workload) are compounded in ways that have a substantial cumulative impact on the quality of women's work lives and their effectiveness in the workplace, and result in significant differences in their career outcomes compared to those of similarly well trained and accomplished men (MIT 1999, 8). These forms of “subtle” discrimination are now the primary target of initiatives designed to redress what the Chair of the NAS Committee describes as a “needless waste of the nation's scientific talent” (Shalala, in NAS 2007, ix). For example, they figure prominently in the arguments for extending Title IX requirements for equal opportunity in education to science training programs (Rolison 2000, Zare 2006), that had, in the past, chiefly been applied to inequities in support for women's sports. They are also addressed by projects designed to foster “institutional transformation” that have been funded by the National Science Foundation ADVANCE program (the Program for the Advancement of Women in Academic Science and Engineering Careers); these include a range of strategies for counteracting gender-based evaluation bias in the allocation of resources, in the review of researchers' credentials at the point of hiring, promotion and tenure, and in a range of other decision making processes (for links to ADVANCE projects see “Internet Resources” below).
The 2010 AAUW report, Why So Few? Women in Science, Technology, Engineering, and Mathematics, reviews these issues and makes recommendations to counteract such inequities in science education. The report identifies three themes that persist in conventional explanations of the gender disparities in STEM fields. The first is the idea that there are innate sex-linked differences in talent —specifically that men typically have better mathematical skills and that these are required for success in STEM fields. The second is the idea that both drive and preferences differ by gender—that girls are simply less interested in STEM disciplines and so do not choose to pursue STEM careers. The third is related to the sorts of micro-inequities described in the MIT study, revolving around the workplace, including both explicit and implicit biases within the workplace and life-work balance issues that are thought to drive women out of STEM fields. As detailed above, these conventional themes resurface periodically in the discussion of gender inequities in STEM fields suggesting an inevitability of the status quo. The AAUW report challenges each of these standard explanations in turn and makes suggestions designed to address features of STEM education that seem likely to contribute to this persistent gender disparity. This and the other studies and recommendations described above are good examples of the ways that scientific research has been brought to bear on issues of gender equity.
The shift of attention away from overt discrimination and towards the cumulative effects of small scale disadvantages that exist in everyday interactions in the social fabric of scientific institutions, education, and culture more generally represents a highly consequential reframing of the issues with which advocates for gender equity in the sciences have been struggling for several decades. It converges on, and increasingly draws inspiration and empirical grounding from, several lines of demographic, experimental (social psychological), and sociological research that have been developing since the late 1970s. Yu Xie and Kimberlee Shauman (2003) decisively challenge Cole's claim that women demonstrate a productivity deficit unrelated to marital or parental status (2003, chapter 9), and they call into question the reliance in later gender equity research on a rigid “pipeline” metaphor, arguing that a less linear life course model provides a better framework for recognizing the more complex patterns of delayed entry, short-term withdrawal and reentry evident in the scientific training and career paths typical for many women (2003, 6–9). The experimental work of cognitive psychologists and social psychologists delineates a set of mechanisms—in the form of cognitive schemas and other heuristics that play a role in automatic cognitive processing—that operate below the threshold of conscious awareness, generating patterns of evaluation bias that track not only gender but also race/ethnicity and a range of other dimensions along which social inequality is constituted (Steele 1998; Valian 1999).
Finally, a number of ambitious longitudinal and cohort studies have put sociologists and historians of science in a position to refine models of the complex processes by which the “micro-inequities” generated by the operation of automatic cognitive processing can produce large-scale gender differences in outcomes.
What has taken shape in the last two decades is, then, a fundamental reorientation in our understanding of the gendered nature of scientific institutions that both informs and is rooted in the critical perspectives brought to bear by feminists. It can no longer be assumed that, unless formal barriers to access or discriminatory intent can be established, the persistent under-representation and marginalization of women in the sciences must be attributed to factors internal to the women themselves. As the NAS and AAUW reports make clear, the preponderance of evidence tells against conventional explanations that attribute to women an inherent cognitive deficit or a lack of drive and commitment to succeed in science; explanations of the forms of gender inequality that persist in the sciences must take into account the effects of training and workplace environments that are inhospitable for women and minorities, the role of various forms of evaluation bias that operate below the threshold of conscious awareness, and the impact of institutional structures that fail to counteract, or that amplify, these disadvantages (NAS, S-2, 3 and AAUW, xvi). These insights suggest that gender inequities in the sciences cannot be expected to resolve themselves without concerted effort, and that this effort should focus, not (primarily) on adapting women to existing institutions, but on ensuring that these institutions are accountable for changing entrenched practices that are responsible for the continued loss of trained scientific talent. A primary focus of efforts to realize “institutional transformation” of this sort (as outlined by the ADVANCE projects mentioned above) is to counteract subtle forms of bias as they operate in small-scale interactions in the workplace, in training and mentoring relationships, and in decision processes throughout the institutions of science education and employment.
In addition, although many self-identified feminist scientists insist that their critiques of gender inequity in no way impugn the epistemic integrity of their fields, there are good reasons to think that systematic institutional biases do affect the content and practice of the sciences. What form this takes will vary widely by field and subfield depending, for example, on whether gender categories are constitutive of the subject domain (as in the case of most social sciences), or on how directly they can be projected onto it (as in the case of animal behavior research). But even in those areas of the physical sciences where the subject domain is, at most, attributed gender characteristics on a metaphorical basis (as symbolically or projectively gendered subjects), patterns of workplace segregation that run along gender lines (e.g., with women predominantly working in particular subfields and research niches), and gender differences in recognition and support (e.g., in funding and in citation patterns), may well have an impact on what questions are given priority, what hypotheses get uptake, and what results are recognized as bearing on problems that are central to the research agenda of the discipline.
What feminists share, despite enormous internal diversity of perspective, is a concern to understand and to change conditions of oppression that operate along lines of gender difference. To realize these goals it is necessary to understand with accuracy, subtlety, and explanatory precision the nature and sources of oppression, and scientific inquiry is one of the most powerful tools available for doing this. Thus, feminists have an interest in research programs that address questions of particular concern to women and to feminists or, more generally, to those who are systematically disadvantaged by traditional gender roles and social relations structured by conventions of heterosexuality (heteronormative and sex/gender-normative conventions).
At their most conservative epistemically and conceptually, the research initiatives undertaken by feminists do not challenge the background assumptions and methodological commitments that underpin existing programs of scientific research; often the goal is to expand the range of questions addressed in particular social, medical, and biological sciences or to selectively appropriate the tools of scientific inquiry for application in feminist-directed research. Key examples come from the medical sciences where the women's health movement has been pivotal, not only in educating women and redefining their relationship with health care professionals, but in bringing feminist critique and activist pressure to bear on medical research that has chiefly focused on the ailments of men, or has taken male bodies and disease profiles as the norm for the medical diagnosis and treatment of women. The feminist activism responsible for making breast cancer a primary focus in the “war on cancer” is one high profile example. Feminist advocacy played a critical role, in the 1960s and 1970s, in challenging a tradition of medical practice that made radical mastectomy the treatment protocol of choice much longer in the U.S. than elsewhere. The clinical trials that demonstrated the efficacy of less invasive alternatives to radical mastectomies were a model of rigorous medical research (e.g., Fischer's trials, as described by Lerner 2001, 136–138), but considerable pressure was required to convince the medical establishment that such research was needed and to take its results seriously (Lerner 2001, 115–169). More generally, feminist activism was responsible for “a great awakening [in the 1980s] of mainstream medicine to women's health concerns,” as Schiebinger describes it, that put pressure on the medical establishment not only to direct attention to neglected conditions that affect primarily women (e.g., osteoporosis and breast cancer), but also to take account of ways in which women's health and disease profiles diverge from models based on studies of male subjects (1999a, 113). Heart disease is one especially prominent example of a well studied condition the understanding of which was based, until the late 1980s, almost entirely on samples of men, even when it concerned the effects of hormones like estrogen (Schiebinger 1999a, 113). Feminist activism was directly responsible for federally enforced reforms of medical research, instituted in the early 1990s, that required the inclusion of female subjects in clinical trials, given findings that FDA-approved drugs were routinely tested exclusively on men and that publicly funded research on women was largely limited to reproductive health issues (Schiebinger 1999a, 114–117). The NIH guideliness, updated in 2001, are an example of the results of such activism.
A similar impulse is evident in much of the research undertaken by feminists in the social sciences, or in response to feminist demands, where the goal has been to apply established research tools to neglected questions that particularly concern women and feminists. These “successor science” traditions of research have faced stiff criticism internal to feminism since at least the mid-1980s, on grounds that they are “insufficiently critical” of the scientific ideals that animate many social sciences (Harding 1986, 30), but they continue to thrive and have made substantial contributions in a number of contexts. The sophisticated quantitative analysis of the career paths, patterns of compensation, and professional outcomes for women in the sciences described in the last section (Feminist Equity Critiques) is one example in which conventional social scientific methods have been used to good effect to document persistent patterns of gender-based discrimination in institutions that purport to be meritocratic. Other examples include a wide range of policy-oriented research aimed at documenting, and designing effective strategies for solving, specific problems created by gendered social institutions, cultural conventions, and divisions of labor. One strand of research on violence against women (Greaves and Wylie 1995) makes use of conventional demographic analysis to show that gender-based patterns of violence cross-cut class and ethnic, race, and religious identification; the aim was to effect a change in policing and funding policies that address domestic violence. Other action and policy oriented research includes, for example, studies of the “gender gap” in voting patterns, the gendered nature of poverty world-wide, and the differential impact of development policies on women.
Another productive tradition of feminist research in this appropriative spirit is characterized by “remedial” research designed to fill lacunae in established theories or bodies of knowledge, correcting errors that arise from ignoring women and gender without changing the terms of disciplinary engagement. For example, the women entering anthropology in unprecedented numbers in the 1960s were quick to recognize the need for compensatory ethnography. Sometimes male researchers had scant access to women informants, and sometimes they ignored or discounted them, with the effect that women, their roles and relationships, their distinctive sub-cultures and activities, were often strikingly absent from ethnographic narratives. Claude Levi-Strauss is famous for a description entered in his field journal in the 1930s that illustrates the problem: “the entire village left the next day in about thirty canoes, leaving us alone in the abandoned houses with the women and children” (1936, cited by Margrit Eichler and Jeanne Lapointe 1985, 11). Deepening this critique, Shirley and Edwin Ardener describe the “problem of women” as a case in which ethnographic subjects are muted both within their own societies and by social anthropologists who, they observe, have traditionally characterized the societies they studied in terms of “dominant male systems of perception” (S. Ardener 1975, xiii): “the study of women is on a level little higher than the study of the ducks and fowls they commonly own” (E. Ardener 1975, 1), which is to say, women had been taken into account only insofar as they figured, or were valued, in the public languages and worlds of men. Similar ideas are also reflected in substantial shifts of focus in fields like primatology where projected gender norms had given rise to a “general vision that primate society revolves around males and is based on aggression, domination, and hierarchy” (Strum and Fedigan 2000, 5). Here a reorientation of field observation practices brought into focus the central role played by females in primate societies, and the importance of “tactics other than aggression (particularly those that rely on social finesse and the management of relationships),” making it clear that “hierarchy may or may not have a place in primate society, but that males and females are equally capable of competition” (Strum and Fedigan 2000, 5; see also Fedigan and Fedigan 1989).
Even when they are methodologically and epistemically conservative, feminist interventions that correct specific errors of omission and extend the tools of science to neglected problems often generate more deeply challenging questions. The successes of these remedial exercises make it clear that many fields have been compromised by unrecognized and unintended bias in the way their subject domain had been defined. When women have been restored to the historical record and to sociological, political, and anthropological accounts from which they have been omitted, eclipsed (Smith 1978), or relegated to a walk-on role (Novick 1988, 497), it often has become clear that the problem was not just erasure but systematic distortion. As critical reflection on conceptual androcentrism deepened, the role of ethnocentric gender norms in structuring inquiry has proven to have profound implications, not only for how women and explicitly gendered subjects are conceived, but also for ostensibly gender neutral aspects of social, historical subjects, and for various natural domains as well.
Specific critiques of research that either ignore women altogether or assimilate them to male-defined norms and expectations have taken shape in every field that deals with human subjects. An example of the former comes from political science where Pamela Paxton argues that in operationalizing democracy one of its key indicators,“universal suffrage,” is often explicitly or implicitly understood as universal male suffrage. When universal suffrage includes women Paxton notes that many of the key claims about the development of democracy—including a standard interpretation that identifies three waves of democracy—may need to be revised (Paxton 2000). Accounts that make claims about the causes of democracy rest on this classification into three waves and so the decision about how to operationalize the latent concept can have far-reaching effects for theoretical explanation.
A well-known critique of taking male norms as universal is Carol Gilligan's reassessment of Lawrence Kohlberg's model of moral development, an account that had been based exclusively on samples of boys. Kohlberg had assumed that the developmental stages manifest in these all-male samples could be generalized; girls were expected to conform to what he took to be a universal trajectory. Gilligan argued that when you attend to the specifics of moral reasoning among girls, a distinctive trajectory of moral development emerges, characterized by an increasingly sophisticated “contextual mode of judgment” that diverges (in the intermediate stages of moral development) from the decontextualized, universalizing, rule-based forms of moral reasoning Kohlberg found in his research on boys (1982). She makes the case for recognizing, in this “difference voice,” evidence that calls into question the stage structure and universalizing assumptions fundamental to Kohlberg's system. Gilligan has since been criticized for reproducing the structure of a fixed developmental scheme (taken over from Kohlberg and developmental psychology generally), and for ignoring the impact on moral reasoning of a range of social and economic factors other than gender. Nonetheless, her posit of a “different voice” represents a decisive challenge to the androcentric presumption that male experience, perception, and patterns of development can be treated as normative for human psychology as a whole.
In other contexts feminist content critiques focus on gender stereotypes reflected in the converse assumption: that men and women are categorically different. In such cases similar and overlapping traits are either ignored or are characterized in different terms when associated with men rather than women; Eichler refers to these as errors that arise from imposing a “double standard” and from “sexual dichotomism” (1988). Examples of this practice are widespread in sex difference research (Fausto-Sterling 1985), a field that continues to reproduce gender-normative stereotypes despite trenchant and sustained critique (Young and Balaban 2006). One consequential example of research undertaken to counteract interconnected errors of erasure and distortion is the ethnographic work with groups long identified as “hunter-gatherers.” Ethnographers who focused on the roles and activities of women in these groups discovered that, among temperate, desert dwelling and subtropical foragers, the small game and plant resources provided by women gatherers may account for as much as 70% of the group's total dietary intake. Ironically, they found that when small game was “collected” by women it was described as gathering, whereas it counted as hunting when the same activities were attributed to men. They learned, as well, that women gatherers are highly mobile, like the men of their social groups (they are not limited to a home base); they control their own fertility to an extent not previously acknowledged; and they play leadership roles, presumed to be the exclusive domain of men, particularly when decisions concern group movement and subsistence strategies (e.g., Slocum 1975; see also contributions to Lee and Devore 1968, and overviews by Dahlberg 1981, and Fedigan and Fedigan 1989).
These findings were, in part, the impetus for rethinking models of human evolution that depended on ethnographic models of the subsistence patterns and social organization of foragers defined in terms of the role of male hunters. In the first instance, they inspired corrective “woman the gatherer” models of human evolution that challenged the assumption that “the demands of the hunt shaped the characteristics that make us human” (e.g., Dahlberg 1981, 1). The reorientation of primatology, mentioned in 3.1 Selective appropriation, was another source of corrective pressure on male-centered models of human evolution, in this case, in a field where the subject of inquiry is projectively gendered. But as research has taken shape in these fields, predicated on skepticism that ethnocentric gender stereotypes can be assumed to hold for contemporary foragers, much less for diverse species of primates and early hominids, it has become increasingly clear that the female-centered antithesis is just as problematic as the sexist and androcentric models of human evolution they are intended to displace. Linda Marie Fedigan argues that feminists should resist the tendency to invert and revalue the gender-dichotomous categories central to our own sex/gender system; it seems likely that our hominid ancestors lived in social groups and utilized subsistence strategies that were unlike any that are familiar from contemporary ethnographic or primatological research (Fedigan 1986). With reference to primate models, Sperling argues that anthropomorphized “langurs with lipstick are no improvement over baboons with briefcases” (1991, 27); contemporary gender stereotypes—“the new female primate is dressed for success and lives in a troop that resembles the modern corporation” (1991, 4)—are no more adequate a framework for understanding primates than the stereotypes of an earlier era, which represented females as passive coquettes and males as aggressive strategists. She urges a thorough-going reassessment of assumptions about the naturalness of sex/gender roles and identities that make anthropomorphic projections of gender stereotypes seem plausible. If we are to come to terms with the complexity and flexibility of primate behavior, we must be prepared to set aside simplifying assumptions about its species-specificity and sex-dimorphism, especially where characteristics like aggression are concerned (Sperling 1991, 20–22).
Despite sustained critique, the conventions of sex/gender taken to be common sense continue to inform evolutionary theorizing. Elisabeth Lloyd describes pervasive androcentric and sexist biases in evolutionary explanations of human female orgasm that reflect not only an uncritical acceptance of entrenched assumptions about women's sexuality (even by authors who invoke the results of sexology research that decisively disproves these assumptions), but also a deep-seated conviction that this trait must be explicable in adaptationist terms, often construed in terms of transparently ethnocentric and sexist assumptions about the function(s) that the capacity for female orgasm fulfills and for which it must have been selected (1993, 2005).
Sarah Richardson also exposes and explores projective attributions of gender in the ways that stereotypical ideas about male and female traits shape research on chromosomes and sex determination. She argues that “[f]rom the earliest theories of chromosomal sex determination to the midcentury hypothesis of the aggressive XYY supermale, the longstanding belief that the X is the ‘female chromosome,’ and the recent claim that males and females have ‘different genomes,’ cultural gender conceptions have influenced the direction of sex chromosome genetics” (2013, 2). As one example of the effects of this projection she explores the failed supermale hypothesis—the idea that XYY males have more “maleness” in virtue of having two Y chromosomes. Supermales were hypothesized to be, among other things, more aggressive. Their greater numbers in institutions (both psychiatric and correctional) seemed to support this. The gendering of the Y chromosome—thinking of it as having stereotypically male traits—supported the flawed transitive reasoning: Y distinguishes maleness, males with double Y should have more (double?) maleness (e.g., aggression). The result was not only a false conclusion but a failure to examine evidence that did not support the hypothesis. For example, institutional populations were revealed to also contain a disproportionate number of XXY males. If one uses the same reasoning based on gender stereotypes, this evidence appears to be inconsistent with the supermale hypothesis. Ultimately the hypothesis was discredited for a variety of reasons, but this “embarrassment” in chromosomal sex determination research is only one example of how assumptions about gender can shape understanding of the object of inquiry. Richardson argues that such areas of research carry with them ”gender valence“—a more nuanced projective gendering of the subject matter that is more subtle than what is typically referred to as “gender bias.”
As these examples illustrate, critiques of erasure and of distortion have implications for the framework assumptions—ontological commitments, explanatory repertoire, conventional categories of description and analysis—that have structured research in many fields; they throw into relief aspects of these various subject domains that are left out of accounts, or prove to be inexplicable when they are conceived in terms of gender categories and norms of behavior that are specific to a relatively narrow selection of contemporary human social experience. For example, Lloyd's critique of evolutionary theorizing about female orgasm poses a challenge, not just to the specifics of the explanatory theories she considers but to the broader, culturally conventional assumptions about distinctively male and female roles, sexual response, and behavioral predispositions that underpin adaptationist research programs in a wide range of areas; the aggressive, promiscuous male and the coy, passive female of sociobiological theorizing populate not only explanations of human sex/gender traits (ranging from the physical capacity for orgasm to the psychology of mate preference and social patterns of investment in offspring), but also accounts of the behavior of primates and ducks and, projectively, even the reproductive functioning of biological organism like slime mold, an example to be discussed.
Thus we see that even when the subject domain of a science is not intrinsically gendered, as in the case of most natural and life sciences, it may be projectively or symbolically gendered; gendered language and concepts may figure as heuristic resources in the description of bio-physical phenomena (Spanier 1995), and scientific categories that are not overtly gendered may have gendered social meanings in the contexts of their formation (Potter 1988). To take the latter case first, Elizabeth Potter develops an account of the role of 17th century gender politics in shaping Boyle's commitment to the mechanistic orientation that ultimately yielded his theory of gases (2001). His opposition to the radical politics associated with the animism of the alternative hylozoic theory informed not only his choice of orienting metaphysics but also the emerging norms of experimental, methodological practice—for example, norms of simplicity—in terms of which his theory was assessed and debated. Potter's point is not that Boyle's gas laws are themselves explicitly gendered, but that their formation and ratification as scientific was deeply shaped by the articulation of gender politics and theological commitments specific to 17th century England.
In analyses of the life sciences feminists show how research in reproductive physiology has been structured by the attribution of stereotypically masculine traits to sperm (as active agents) and feminine traits to eggs (as passive), sometimes at considerable cost to empirical adequacy and explanatory power (Martin 1991; Spanier 1995). Bonnie Spanier discerns the influence of these metaphors in molecular biology even when the subject is not human reproduction, in the attribution of sex differences to E. Coli organisms, for example. Here the transfer of genetic material from one single-cell organism to another is characterized in gendered terms: the donor and recipient cells are labeled “male” and “female,” respectively, and the transfer process is described as mediated by “conjugal unions between male and female cells” (1995, 56). This hetero/sexualizing and gendering at the level of molecular phenomena is evident (Spanier 1995, 26). But we also see a more subtle sort of gendering in competing models of the factors that control the aggregation of slime molds, a case analyzed by Evelyn Fox Keller in connection with a more general critique of the “force of the concept of predetermined centralized control as a ‘natural’ model of relationship among components of living systems or populations” Keller 1985, 150–157). By projecting causally familiar models — models of governance and control that reflect the gender hierarchy of society with which we are familiar — “we risk imposing on nature the very stories we like to hear,”(Keller 1985, 187).
In short, although the specifics of feminist content critiques are necessarily quite different in the biological and physical, as opposed to the social and historical sciences, they follow a similar trajectory. Even narrowly circumscribed, gap-filling and corrective interventions often expose patterns of omission or gender-normative distortion that compromise not just the details but the framework assumptions of the sciences examined. Discovery of these omissions and distortions leads to critical questions about the methodological standards and epistemic ideals that inform scientific practice. By the mid-1980s feminist research had exposed such pervasive androcentric and sexist bias that it called into question not just “bad science,” but much that passes for “good science,” even exemplary science (see Longino and Doell 1983, 207–208; Harding 1986, 22–23; Wylie 1997). Feminist content critiques thus pose two related challenges. If established scientific methodologies routinely (although not always) reproduce androcentric and sexist bias or themselves generate these biases, then the question arises whether and how feminists could do better; the feminist methods debate took shape, chiefly in the social sciences, in response to this question (see section The Feminist Methods Debate). By extension, feminist critiques of and contributions to the sciences suggest the need to reassess making a sharp distinction between “contextual” values (non-epistemic, socio-political interests and considerations) and cognitive factors (good reasons, evidence)—the ideals (truth, objectivity) understood to be “constitutive” of the sciences. Thus challenges for feminist philosophers of science include clarifying the role of contextual/non-epistemic values in successful science and articulating norms of epistemic credibility and justification—including conceptions of objectivity—in an account of good science that incorporates such values.
While at times feminists have been skeptical about the capacity of conventional research methods to expose systematic bias, it is now generally agreed that a plurality of methods have been productive for achieving feminist goals. Nonetheless there are questions related to method that feminists have wanted to explore. To understand what is at stake, it may be helpful to use Harding's distinction between method, methodology, and epistemology. Methods are “techniques for gathering evidence,” whereas methodology is “a theory and analysis of how research should proceed.” Epistemology is the “theory of knowledge or justificatory strategy” that underlies the methodology (Harding 1987, 2). While quantitative, qualitative, and mixed methods research have all produced evidence for science that is consistent with feminist goals, questions have been raised about the possibility of problematic epistemological presuppositions underlying the use of particular methods to gather that evidence—and about how those presuppositions might inform methodology (see section Philosophical Implications).
For example, some scholars reject the conviction that social research must conform to models of natural scientific practice on grounds that, when formulated in terms of positivist theories of science, these models entrench “ruling practices” in the form of quasi-experimental and quantitative methods that reproduce the categories of dominant ideology and obscure devalued or subordinate perspectives (Mies 1983; Smith 1974; Stanley and Wise 1983). This objection is an objection to the methodological framework within which these methods have been employed. Although few maintain that research methods are intrinsically sexist or androcentric, feminist social scientists have often found that, if they are to recover dimensions of social life ignored by mainstream research, they often must use forms of evidence considered ephemeral (e.g., diaries, private papers, material culture, as opposed to archives of public record) and rely on methods that are non-standard or marginal by the conventions of their fields (e.g., qualitative methods in fields dominated by experimental and quantitative modes of inquiry inspired by the natural sciences). Nonetheless there are times when the more mainstream quantitative methods can provide powerful resources for making feminist arguments (section Feminist Equity Critiques).
Shulamith Reinharz's review of feminist social research methods (1992a) identified productive feminist applications of virtually every research method available in the social sciences, and by the end of the 1990s, Heidi Gottfried concluded that feminist practitioners had made a decisive “move from singularity to plurality”(1996, 12). Epistemic arguments reinforced this impulse toward a plurality of methods. Sandra Harding (1987) and Helen Longino (1987) argued that there is no justification for positing “a distinctive female way of knowing” and that it is more fruitful to ask what it means to “do science as a feminist” (Longino 1987, 53), and to recognize that feminist research practice will be as diverse as are the commitments that generate the questions it addresses and the fields in which feminists work. Thus, the current “feminist methods debate” is more aptly characterized as debate about methodology—a debate about the theoretical framework for knowledge production within which the methods are used.
Consistent with this idea, feminist researchers have converged around a set of commitments that shape their research—commitments that guide how to use methods as feminists—and thus provide a methodological framework. Four shared commitments are particularly salient: relevance, experiential grounding, accountability, and reflexivity (Wylie 2007). These commitments aid in guiding research that is non-sexist and otherwise consistent with feminist ideals (Eichler 1988; Fonow and Cook 1991; DeVault 1999; Hesse-Biber and Yaiser 2004; Hesse-Biber 2007). The first of these—relevance—refers to the goals of feminist research; to do research as a feminist means to address questions that are relevant to women and, more generally, to those oppressed by gender-structured systems of inequality (many of whom are not women). Sometimes this principle is more specifically formulated in activist terms; feminist research should be “movement-generated” in the sense that it should not only provide an understanding of sexist and hetero-normative institutions, but should also generate strategies for changing these institutions (Ehrlich 1975, 10, 13).
The commitment to experiential grounding is embodied in the directive, variously formulated, that feminists should start their research from the lives of women and those marginalized by conventional sex/gender structures. As articulated by Dorothy Smith in the early 1970s and subsequently elaborated by Harding (1991, 2004a), this is a recommendation to take women's everyday lives as a “starting point” point for research: focus on those aspects of social life and forms of understanding that typically remain “off-stage,” “eclipsed” by the normatively masculine focus of conventional social sciences (Smith 1978; 1987). The feminist research that most straightforwardly exemplifies these ideals are community self-study projects: research undertaken by women, on women, for women (Gorelick 1991, 459), in which women's experience and concerns give rise directly to the questions asked. Examples include the grass-roots “chilly climate” (workplace environment) research discussed above (in the section Feminist Equity Critiques), studies of the needs of homeless and poor women of the kind supported by the Vancouver Women's Research Center in the 1970s (Jacobson 1977) and undertaken by “Roofless Women” twenty years later (1997). The principles that inform these projects—that inquiry should be motivated by explicitly activist objectives and designed with the aim of leveling the hierarchy of authority inherent in traditional “expert” forms of social scientific research—have also inspired the robust traditions of participatory research associated with the women's shelter movement, described by Patricia Maguire in her classic account, Doing Participatory Research: A Feminist Approach (Maguire 1987) and by Naples in connection with studies of women's “invisible” work, and research with adult survivors of childhood sexual abuse (Naples 2003). In the context of ongoing debate about the status and authority of the “evidence of experience” (Scott 1991), the second principle—that feminist research “start from,” and be grounded in, women's experience—has been reframed as a commitment to treat gendered experience and self-understanding as a critical resource at all stages of research (Wylie 1992).
The commitment to accountability leads to the specification of ethical and pragmatic norms for feminist research; these include accountability to research subjects in a variety of ways. Minimally the research process should not, itself, exploit or demean research subjects who are oppressed by sex/gender systems; ideally, it should empower them. Often feminists hold themselves to a higher standard, arguing that research practice should be a site for instituting feminist social and political values: in designing research projects they should do all they can to counteract the hierarchical structures that make social science a “ruling practice,” implementing egalitarian, participatory forms of knowledge production. Here feminist principles converge on ideals that inform a number of research traditions that emphasize participatory modes of inquiry but are not explicitly or primarily feminist in orientation, and on a set of general arguments for inclusive norms of research practice that Longino has developed (2002) (see section 6.4 Objectivity). For example, practitioners of participatory action research (PAR) and community based collaborative research (CBPR) in fields as diverse as forestry (Fortmann 2008; Wilmsen et. al 2008), development (Hickey and Mohan 2004), and community health (Minkler and Wallerstein 2003), make the case that a commitment to emancipatory goals requires, not just that research address relevant questions, but that it be non-exploitative and subject-driven. In addition, like many feminists, they argue that a commitment to accountability and reciprocity requires, in the ideal, that research subjects should be involved at all stages of research design, data collection, analysis, and authorship. The rationale here is not only moral and political—that fully collaborative practice exemplifies a thoroughgoing “diffusion or decentralization of power,” as Longino describes the feminist “community value” at work here (1994, 476)—but that social norms which reinforce a “tempered equality of intellectual authority” and inclusive modes of critical engagement in scientific communities are instrumental to epistemic ends (Longino 2002, 131). Although her point of departure was the delineation of commitments characteristic of feminist research, Longino has developed a set of entirely general arguments for such norms; they ensure that the epistemic resources of diverse perspectives are brought to bear in the critical assessment of research methods, evidence, and inference, as well as the claims based on them (1995; 2002, 128–135). Given that the unconditioned subjectivity of a “view from nowhere” is unattainable, she argues, the basis for ratifying knowledge claims can only be the integrity of the processes of knowledge production as assessed against jointly social and cognitive norms such as these (1993, 113).
Finally, each of the commitments outlined above entails that feminist researchers make reflexivity a central virtue. A strength of feminist critique lies in uncovering previously hidden androcentric assumptions. Thus feminist social scientists bring to their research an awareness of the need to contextualize research. As Shulamith Rheinharz puts it, they should “state their premises rather than hide them” (1992b, p. 426), unlike the approaches they critique. The interests that motivate their choice of questions, the assumptions that underpin the hypotheses they consider, and the reasons for adopting particular methods of inquiry and categories of description and analysis should be explicit. On stronger formulations, this commitment to cultivate a stance of critical reflexivity requires that feminists take into account the various ways in which their own socially defined angle of vision, interests, and values are constitutive of the research process and of the understanding it produces (e.g., Fonow and Cook, 1991; Mies, 1983). Harding has elaborated this in terms of a requirement for “strong objectivity”: “Strong objectivity requires that the subject of knowledge be placed on the same critical plane as the objects of knowledge. Thus strong objectivity requires what we can think of as ‘strong reflexivity’” (Harding 2004a, 136)(section Philosophical Implications). At a meta-level, Longino has argued the case for a governing principle of “methodological provisionalism”: feminists should be prepared to revise any of their norms in light of what they learn from practice (1994, 483). While principles of critical reflexivity and “provisionalism” are not—in themselves—feminist, Longino suggests a “bottom line” proviso that should inform their application by feminists: the basis for adopting, and for assessing and revising, any methodological norms that inform feminist research should be a commitment to “prevent gender from being disappeared” (1994, 481).
In articulating these principles, feminist practitioners often work as insiders to the disciplines whose methods and results they critique; far from being cynically dismissive of scientific inquiry, they are committed to improving the epistemic credibility and integrity of research practice in these fields. The challenge they engage, in practical and methodological terms, is that of showing that ineliminable contextual values can be a resource for doing better science.
Science Studies is an interdisciplinary field that draws upon anthropology, cultural studies, economics, feminism, history, philosophy, political science, and sociology in order to study science. Historian Mario Biagioli (1999, xii) defines science studies as a field that asks how science works rather than what science is and he describes science studies as using a variety of methodologies and research questions to find out how science works. For example, anthropologist, Sharon Traweek (1988) compared two communities of high energy physicists by asking “how they have forged a research community for themselves, how they turn novices into physicists and how their community works to produce knowledge.” David Hess characterizes science studies as tracking “the history of disciplines, the dynamics of science as a social institution, and the philosophical basis for scientific knowledge” (1997, 1). And sociologist Emma Whelan characterizes science studies as focusing on “how social factors intrude upon science,” “the products of science” and “the process of doing scientific work itself” (Whelan 2001, 544; italics in original). Though definitions offered by science scholars differ, they nevertheless agree that the focus of science studies is on the interactions of science with society, including both micro and macro interactions. A fundamental aim of science studies is to critique narrow understandings of science as a rational activity, (e.g., as instantiating a logic of science) and to show, from a variety of perspectives, that science is a social activity.
Sue Rosser (1989) notes the impact of feminism on science and science studies in six areas: pedagogical and curricular transformation in science, attention to the history of women in science as well as to the current status of women in science, feminist critique of science, feminist theory of science and feminine science (see Rosser 1989, Harding 1986 and 1991, and Rose 1994). When science was first identified as having a masculine basis, many asked whether this implies that there is a feminine science or that women would do science differently than men. The idea of a feminine science helped to challenge the idea of science as only a masculine endeavor and focused the analytical gaze on its “feminine” aspects such as intuition, collaboration, and social networks. In general feminist science studies scholars have contributed gender analyses that address “issues of power and inequality, varieties of knowing and knowers, discourse and materiality, subjectivity and objectivity, embodiment, representation, work, resistance, and the lay/expert divide” (Whelan 2001, 538). In addition, most feminist science studies scholars try to understand the relationships among science, gender, race, class, sexuality, disability and colonialism and how science constructs and applies these differences. Among the most frequently cited feminist science scholars are: Ruth Bleier, Adele Clarke, Anne Fausto Sterling, Joan Fujimura, Donna Haraway, Sandra Harding, Evelynn Hammond, David Hess, Ruth Hubbard, Evelyn Fox Keller, Emily Martin, Sue Rosser, Margaret Rossiter, Linda Layne, Richard Levins, Richard Lewontin, Helen Longino, Carolyn Merchant, Rayna Rapp, Hilary Rose, Londa Schiebinger, Bonnie Spanier, S. Leigh Star, Sharon Traweek, and Nancy Tuana. (See the Bibliography for sample work by these scholars.)
Hilary Rose (1983, 82) notes that as critical work becomes “more theoretical, more fully elaborated, so women and women's interests recede from the forefront.” For example, Evelyn Fox Keller (1995) observes that feminist scholars first questioned the objectivity of science, a question later appropriated by mainstream historians of science. This could explain the impact of feminist science studies scholars on the field of science studies at the inception of the field in the late 1970s and the decrease in obviously feminist science scholarship in the two main journals of science studies: Science, Technology and Human Values and The Social Studies of Science in the 1990s and 2000s. Eulalia Pérez Sedeño (2001) critiques science studies for not employing a serious gender analysis in its skeptical, constructively critical account of science and challenges mainstream science studies to include the private sphere as well as the high profile public sphere as locations of research. In the same way, scholars have called for closer engagement between feminist theory and feminist science studies. For example, a special issue of Feminist Theory, edited by Susan Squier and Melissa Littlefield (2004) suggests that a closer examination of materiality, agency, and performance in feminist science studies could create a point of mutual interest for feminist theory and feminist science studies.
Since its inception, feminist science studies has not been a unified field. The category, “feminist science studies” includes feminist critiques of science, history of women in science, attention to equity issues for women in science, the experience of women in science, the effects of science on women, cultural constructions of gender and feminist theories of scientific knowledge. Under the rubric of gender, science and culture we find scholars discussing the marginalization of women in science, raising questions of equity in science, analyzing the gendered nature of science and questioning the construction of scientific knowledge. These various dialogues from multiple directions create disparate subspecialties and give the appearance of a feminist science studies diaspora. Research in feminist science studies is found in anthropology, biology, cultural studies, ethnic studies, history of science, literary studies, philosophy of science, philosophy, postcolonial studies, sociology, and women's studies among other disciplines. Thus, the field is diverse in its methodologies and approaches to research. This is both its strength and its weakness. Most feminist science studies scholars identify themselves primarily with a traditional discipline and secondarily with feminist science studies, which can make it difficult to distinguish work in the field. But its diverse methods and approaches also give the field flexibility, diversity, breadth and depth. Thus, Banu Subramaniam (Hammonds and Subramaniam 2003, 929) celebrates the field of feminist science studies because it allows for the possibility of construction and collaboration in addition to critique. Finally, despite the diversity of methods and approaches, most scholars address not only the relationship of science and gender, but also the relationship of science, race, class, sexuality, disability and colonialism and ask how science has been used to construct and apply these differences.
The early feminist science scholars addressed a number of binaries that were prevalent in scientific discourse: rational/irrational, objective/subjective, science/nature, pure/constructed, and sex/gender that reflected contemporary thinking and beliefs about science. Feminist science scholars were not alone in questioning the binaries of modernity but they were first to do it for science and their work contributed to a more critical analysis of scientific culture. Ruth Hubbard's (1990) work illustrated that science reflects the values of those who do science: privileged, educated white men who have defined what counts as rational/irrational, objective/subjective and pure/constructed. Susan Griffin (1979) and Carolyn Merchant (1980) explored the science/nature discourse through historical and cultural analysis to illustrate the values of nature as feminine and science as masculine that permeated modern science. Donna Haraway (1989) explored assumptions concerning the binaries, objective/subjective and science/nature, through an analysis of gender and racial bias in primatology. Sandra Harding's (1991) work illustrated that science produces meanings that are constructed. Helen Longino and Ruth Doell (1987) documented masculine bias within evolutionary and endocrinological research. Luce Irigaray (1989) showed how scientific language was not neutral and needed to be interpreted as sexed logic. These same binaries are no longer the major focus of feminist science studies because the critiques have been mainstreamed into theories on the social construction of science. However, the science/nature distinction is still being actively explored (Suchman 2008; Barad 2003, 2007; Hammond 2003; Goodman 2003) because it speaks to the boundary between human and machine and addresses the question of difference that has engaged feminist scholarship since its inception.
Scholarship that explores how scientific knowledge is constructed both inside and outside the laboratory and the application of this knowledge to the lives and bodies of women is a central focus of feminist science studies. Turning first to the production of knowledge, based on accounts of Rosalind Franklin (Maddox 2002) and Barbara McClintock (Keller 1983), Ruth Hubbard (2003) has concluded that the relationship between science and gender is not to be found in the simple claim that women do science differently than men. As she puts the point, “ovaries or testes do not directly affect what science we do and how we do it.” Other feminist science studies scholars argue for the social construction of science and aim to show that how we do science and how the science we do are both constructed through lenses that are culturally and socially created and that are gendered. Thus it is not the ovaries or the testes but the culture that shapes how we do science. Science is not separate from the person who does science or from the culture in which science is embedded (Tuana 1989). Although social constructivism has been the prevailing theoretical framework for feminist work, Donna Haraway (1991) has cautioned both that it may not be the most powerful tool for deconstructing science and its objects since it may help maintain the ideological doctrines of science through its focus on rhetoric and that it abandons objectivity. Karen Barad challenges feminist science studies to take up “onto-epistem-ology—the study of practices of knowing in being” [italics in the original, 2003: 829] that would acknowledge that we “are part of the world in its differential becoming.” This echoes an earlier challenge expressed by Rose (1983) about the importance of the personal within our theories and the need for theories that integrate and interpret lived experiences.
Turning to applications of scientific knowledge, the medicalization of women's lives and bodies provides excellent examples of feminist questions and approaches. Rayna Rapp's (1999) work on amniocentesis illustrates the convergence of feminist theory with science studies that allows Rapp to analyze gender, power and culture in this area of medicine. By analogy with a Venn diagram Rapp explores the “intersecting and juxtaposing” perspectives of scientific literacy, disability rights, reproductive rights and the technological transformations of bodies/pregnancy into a woman-centered research project. In her study of immunity in American culture, Emily Martin emphasizes “the commonalities and the differences among people who have various kinds of experience and expertise” in scientific knowledge (Martin 1994, 14). Martin begins with the premise that science is “an active agent in a culture that passively acquiesces” and that society fails to “provide an adequately complex view of how scientific knowledge operates” (1994, 7) and it is part of her methodology to “deliberately cross” the borders that have historically separated the scientists producing knowledge and the society applying it. And finally, Deborah Blizzard's (2007) ethnography of the sociocultural development of fetoscopy applies a constructivist framework to show how “patient-mothers,” physicians, clergy and others in a social network actively affect the process of development and acceptance of fetoscopy. These studies move beyond science texts to situate scientific knowledge on the bodies and lives of women.
One early area of study for feminist science studies was investigation of the location of women in science and their absence from science. (See Rossiter 1982, 1995; Wertheim 1995; and Feminist Equity Critiques above.) Having documented and challenged women's and other minorities' absence from science, scholars have, by asking why specific individuals both male and female leave science, aimed to improve the number of minorities in science (Seymour and Hewitt 1997). Feminist scholars have suggested and encouraged several strategies for improvement. Modest curricular reform in the sciences has included a more community-based education that includes peer instruction, “real world” problem-solving activities, active learning, inquiry-based learning, and team-structured activities that reflect the realities of doing science while challenging common stereotypes of science. Second, feminist scientists and scholars of science encouraged the education and training of scientists “to conduct their investigations in accordance with feminist principles, to resist androcentric currents of mainstream research communities and in some cases to organize their intellectual production along theoretical lines identified with feminism” (Kohlstedt and Longino 1997, 6). This influence on education and training may be the fastest growing area of feminist science studies (broadly construed) as scientists begin to take up feminist concerns (see, for example, Mayberry et al. 2001 and Wyer et al. 2001). Recently, scholars have asked, “has feminism changed science?” and have begun to answer it in the affirmative. (See the special issue of Signs (2003) edited by Londa Schiebinger, especially articles by physicist, Amy Bug; archaeologist, Margaret W. Conkey; and evolutionary biologist, Patty Gowaty. See also Schiebinger 1999b.) Feminism has been most successful in influencing/changing the use of metaphors in biology (see Spanier 1995) and scientists are beginning to be more explicit about their methods, values and beliefs and how these might influence their work. Medicine, primatology, biology and archaeology are most frequently cited for having incorporated gender analyses into their science (Schiebinger 1999a.)
The presence of women in the sciences, feminist critiques and feminist theories have contributed to changes in modern science as well as in studies of science. But an important goal of feminist science studies is to encourage the presence of women and men who differ by race, class, nation, sexuality, disability, etc. and who can bring to science and science studies a multifaceted awareness of difference, power relations, domination, language and of the need for innovative methodologies. Having documented the absence and reasons for the absence of women in science in the industrialized nations, scholars have begun to examine the role of gender and science in developing nations and in the processes of development (Campion & Shrum 2004); however, more analysis of gender, science and culture outside of western cultures is needed. Although race is more likely to be addressed within feminist than in mainstream science studies, even there it is a nascent area of study. Scholars addressing race and science include: Evelynn Hammond, Banu Subramaniam, Jenny Reardon, Alondra Nelson, and researchers in Sandra Harding's 1993b anthology, The “Racial” Economy of Science. Disabilities studies is also a new field that promises to trouble the space between science, able bodies and feminist theory (see Kafer 2003, Hall 2002, Kittay et al 2001 and the Bibliography for work by these scholars). Feminist science scholars continue to respond to Hilary Rose's challenge to create a “practice of feeling, thinking and writing that opposes the abstraction of male and bourgeois scientific thought” (Rose 1983, 87).
Feminist science studies, feminist activist research, and feminist appropriations of science often pose a challenge to conventional views about what makes science scientific. The traditional conception of objectivity and the value neutrality, or the freedom of science from non-epistemic (moral, social, or political) values often associated with such a conception of objectivity, come into question. Feminist perspectives on science sometimes expose instances in which such non-epistemic values compromise scientific results, as we have seen. When sexist assumptions, either directly or projectively, shape the understanding or approach to the objects of inquiry, a variety of distortions of science can occur. But feminist science studies also reveal that in some instances moral, social, and political values can improve science. It follows that a key task for philosophers of science operating from a feminist perspective is reframing accounts of evidence, justification, and objectivity to show how it is possible that non-epistemic values can improve science. The following subsections focus on the approaches of several feminist philosophers of science who have taken up this challenge by re-examining the role of values in science and reconceptualizing objectivity.
One way in which feminist philosophers of science have responded to these challenges is through an approach that we might call “empiricist holism.” Many feminist empiricists were influenced by the American pragmatists of the second half of the twentieth century, particularly Wilfred Sellars, Willard van Orman Quine, and Donald Davidson. Miriam Solomon notes the prevalence of this influence on a variety of contemporary feminist empiricists including herself (2012, 435). These feminists take a naturalized approach to the philosophy of science, basing their accounts on the knowledge practices of the sciences on which they focus. They are empiricists in taking experience as the ultimate arbitrator of our beliefs; they are holists in that they take beliefs to answer to experience as whole—in Quine's phrase, as a “web of belief”—rather than one-by-one. Longino's contextual empiricism, discussed in detail elsewhere (see the entries on feminist epistemology and philosophy of science, feminist social epistemology, the social dimensions of scientific knowledge, and briefly in this entry in section 6.4 Objectivity), is one of the most influential examples of these approaches (Longino 1990, 2002). We will examine several other versions in the work of Lynn Hankinson Nelson, Alison Wylie, Elizabeth Anderson, and Sharyn Clough.
Lynn Hankinson Nelson's naturalized, holistic, feminist empiricist account is explicitly derived from her reading of Quine, as the title of her book makes clear (Who Knows: From Quine to a Feminist Empiricism 1992). For Nelson, a philosophy is naturalized when it is commensurable with the actual history and contemporary practice of science, grounded in sciences relevant to theories of theorizing, e.g., psychology, cognitive science, biology, and/or sociology, and it explains consensus and dissent, progressive and less than progressive episodes, in the same terms. Thus, a good philosophy of science must, like good science, achieve a balance among empirical success, predictive success and explanatory power and must, as a good epistemology of science, describe and explain how scientific knowledge is acquired. Nelson holds that a naturalized philosophy of science does not justify knowledge in general or our particular knowledge claims; instead it must give an empirically adequate description of the production of scientific knowledge, i.e., it is held accountable to case studies that have not been rationally reconstructed to fit its own (or any other) philosophy of science. Its only normative job is to ask whether the social processes currently characterizing scientific practices, recruitment, education, etc. are likely to produce the best theories and if not, suggest changes to ensure that they do. Feminist naturalized philosophy of science, then, attends to processes, including especially methodological processes, reflecting gender considerations. And since gender is never in fact separated from race, class and other socio-political categories, feminist philosophy of science attends to these also. The actual practice of science thus incorporates socio-political and cultural values and in this way values are part of into the interconnected system of beliefs that is subject to empirical constraint.
In Nelson's empiricist holism, hypotheses, models and theories put forward in the sciences must be tested against relevant evidence where evidence includes the observational consequences of the hypothesis and a large set of theories within which the hypothesis is embedded, including common-sense theories. Thus, a hypothesis or model in any branch of science is related to many, but not all, of our current theories. For Nelson, the evidence supporting a specific theory, hypothesis, or research program is of two types: observation, although not the pre-theoretic observation of traditional empiricism, but rather observations already informed by background theory; and “a body of accepted standards and theory” which also differ from the traditional empiricist account in that they are informed by social beliefs and values (1996, 100). This account is empiricist and holist inasmuch as it states that evidence is constituted by observation and by theories which themselves are supported by evidence and by other theories. Yet the holism here is relatively modest in that evidence for a hypothesis includes the observational consequences of many, but not all, current theories, metaphysical assumptions, methods, standards and practices (1996, 101).
The account is also naturalized, for Nelson notes that observation is largely structured as current theories would have it, meaning that observational experience is explained by scientific accounts such as those given in neurobiology, developmental biology, neuropsychology and evolutionary biology, rather than by a philosophical account. Nelson points to feminist and other case studies of good scientific work which show that socio-political values influence scientific justification. (See 1990, 205–212 and passim for a discussion of the “man, the hunter” theory of human evolution; 1995, 410–413 and 414 for a discussion of work in neuroendocrinology showing that hemispheric lateralization is sex-differentiated; and 415ff for a discussion of the centrality of sex differences in sociobiology.) She concludes from these case studies that it is a lack of empirical success that makes scientific work bad—not necessarily socio-political values that do so. Her holistic view of evidence allows us to see that the androcentric assumptions made by scientists and revealed by feminist science studies are not baseless; they rest upon evidence which includes commonly held social assumptions about relations between the sexes (1993, 147). That feminists do not hold them is due in large part to their perspective, a perspective arising from their shared response to current “social experiences, relations, traditions, and historically and culturally specific ways of organizing social life” (1993, 147). For Nelson, the distinction between good and bad science is still based on traditional constitutive or epistemic virtues including (though not limited to) empirical adequacy, explanatory power and predictive power.
Moreover Nelson argues, case studies also reveal that socio-political and other contextual or non-epistemic values sometimes help constitute evidence in good science, i.e., science which scientists themselves say is good science. Thus, the theories that, together with our experiences, constitute evidence include social values and socio-political theories. We must, she says, “reconsider the assumption that political beliefs and theories, and values, are not subject to empirical control, that there is no way to judge between them” (1990, 297). Finally, on the basis of her case studies, Nelson also argues that knowledge is produced and maintained by communities. While individual scientists put forward candidates for knowledge, they do not know their hypotheses autonomously, before the relevant community has deemed the hypotheses confirmed.
Among the challenges to empirical holistic accounts is that in such accounts of science confirmation of hypotheses appears to be circular, i.e., our scientific beliefs merely confirm one another. Archaeology provides us with a particularly salient example, for archaeologists must use analytical theories drawn from familiar sources to make hypotheses about past cultures and lifeways and to interpret archaeological data as evidence to test these hypotheses. Clearly their observations and hence their observational evidence is “theory-laden.” Given that the evidence used to support hypotheses and theories about the cultural past is informed by theories based on the cultural present, how can archaeologists avoid begging the question in favor of their own understanding of past cultures?
Alison Wylie has developed the Consilience Model of Confirmation through analysis of many cases showing how archaeologists in fact judge the relative credibility of evidential and explanatory claims. The model is compatible with other forms of holism, such as Nelson's in that it shows how hypotheses from different domains bear on: (1) the interpretation of data so that the data function as evidence for a hypothesis, (2) hypotheses taken as background assumptions supporting an argument from the evidence to the hypothesis under test, (3) the interpretation of the hypothesis, and ultimately, (4) how hypotheses and principles from different domains affect the theory giving rise to, and in turn supported by, the hypothesis being tested.
Questions about the adequacy of an interpretive hypothesis are usually settled, Wylie notes, when independently constituted lines of evidence converge. Archaeologists recognize that evidence is not a stable, foundational given; it is always “theory-laden,” but mitigated objectivity is achieved when the theories used to construe/interpret data as evidence are secure and independent.
Evidence must be secure in two senses: first, the background knowledge used to link the present record (data) with antecedent causes (conditions that produced it) or past events must be credible in its home context (e.g., paleobotanical claims used in an argument must be well established in paleobotany), and second, the inferences supported by this background knowledge are secure to the degree to which the links between the present record (data) and antecedent causes or past events (background assumptions) are unique or deterministic, and to the degree to which the argument chains are relatively short and simple. The evidence must also exhibit epistemic independence in two senses: (1) background assumptions used to establish the evidence must be independent of the hypothesis being tested; and (2) background assumptions (linking principles or sets of linking principles) derived from one or more different sources used to establish the evidential import of archaeological data must be confirmed independently of one another. Background assumptions also must be horizontally independent of one another, i.e., no one set of linking principles entails the others as a proper subset of itself or is confirmed by the same evidence. Once the evidence is secure and independent, then archaeologists can triangulate, set up a system of mutual constraint among different lines of evidence bearing on a hypothesis and ultimately on a theory. Wylie's model shows that archaeologists use an enormous diversity of evidence and the diversity ensures that the evidence can sometimes function as a semi-autonomous constraint on claims about the cultural past, particularly when some of it depends on background knowledge from one or more different sources and when it enters interpretation at different points. Thus different lines of evidence can be mutually constraining when they converge or fail to converge on a coherent account of a particular past context.
Wylie's model provides a good analysis of how gender considerations enter archaeological reasoning and it allows us to see when evidential considerations do meet standards of good practice in the field and when they do not. For example, when current assumptions about women and gender roles are uncritically taken up and used to support hypotheses about the cultural past in a particular context, such middle-range, linking hypotheses about past women and gender roles fail to be independent of present assumptions and often fail to be fully secure. A number of feminist case studies in archaeology reveal instances in which conventional work fails the requirement that collateral theories be independent. For example, Patty Jo Watson and Mary C. Kennedy 1991, reveal pervasive androcentrism in explanations of the emergence of agriculture in the Eastern Woodlands of what is now the U.S; Christine Hastorf 1991, through her study of pre-Hispanic sites in the central Andes, shows that gender roles and household structures are not the same everywhere at all times, but change as societal structures or dominant ideas change; and Elizabeth Brumfiel 1991 whose work in the Valley of Mexico shows that the Aztec state depended on tribute to maintain its political and economic hegemony, and this depended on changes in the organization and deployment of predominantly female domestic labor.
Arguably the greatest challenge for feminist science scholars is in showing how feminist values can result in epistemically better science. Critics argue that feminists hold their values dogmatically. Indeed, these critics argue that everyone holds their values dogmatically because values cannot be influenced by facts. Moreover, critics claim that when social values and interests influence scientific work, they supplant reasoning from evidence and so interfere with the goal of science which is finding out the truth about nature and about humans and human life, or finding theories with a “good fit,” i.e., that fit the data reasonably well. Thus, when social values or interests influence scientific work they make it bad science. Since many feminists argue that feminist values are able to improve science, this is a challenge to which they must respond. One way to do this would be to make a distinction between legitimate and illegitimate uses of values. This is the approach that Elizabeth Anderson takes (1995a, 2004).
As an illustration of the use of values in a legitimate way (non-dogmatically) Anderson offers an analysis of Abigail Stewart et al.'s (1997) research on divorce (Anderson 2004)—research that was explicitly guided by feminist values in a variety of ways. According to Anderson, the values that Stewart and her team of researchers brought to their investigation are of the sort that are answerable to empirical evidence—the evidence of emotional states. Anderson argues that values are subject to critical scrutiny and revision in light of arguments and evidence; briefly, experiences such as disillusionment allow most people (those who are not dogmatic) to learn from experience that some of their values are mistaken. Like most experiences, emotional experiences have cognitive, usually representative, content and we can find out that the representative content is erroneous, confused, etc. Thus, if we find out that the cognitive content of an emotional experience is defective in some way, we might discount the importance of the feeling, too. Such emotional experiences can function as evidence for values because these experiences are independent of our desires and ends. We can be persuaded by reasons and by facts that despite our emotional experience of something or someone, that thing or person is valuable (or not). This sort of persuasive argument is quite common and makes sense only because our emotions are responsive to facts. And usually our emotions are reliable, though certainly not infallible, evidence for our value judgments. The exceptions include emotions affected by drugs, depression, etc. (2004, 9–10).
Anderson examines how background values function at various stages of Stewart et al.'s research: the framing of research questions, the understanding of the objects of inquiry, the making of decisions about what data to collect, the generation and sampling of data, the analysis of the data including the choice of technique for analysis, decisions about when to end data analysis, and what conclusions are drawn. To illustrate, we focus on just one of these stages—the way that values enter into understanding the objects of inquiry.
In the case of the divorce study, there are a variety of such objects that need to be considered, but prominent among these are “divorce” and “family.” Stewart's research team acknowledges these objects of inquiry as “thickly” described—meaning that value concepts are part of their descriptions. Anderson notes that, for example, the values incorporated in the concept of divorce used by Stewart's team differ from those incorporated into Judith Wallerstein and Joan Kelly's research on divorce (Wallerstein and Kelly 1980). For Wallerstein and Kelly divorce is conceived of as a loss or trauma. Stewart's team, in contrast, took divorce to be a process of adjustment to a new state. There are two important differences in this alternative conception of divorce. The first is that divorce is not treated as a one-time event with an aftermath but rather as an ongoing life adjustment. Second, the process of adjustment is open-ended allowing for both positive and negative effects. Wallerstein and Kelly's framing of divorce as a trauma or loss calls for researchers to focus on the negative effects and so shapes the data collection. Anderson's analysis makes it clear that both studies incorporate values—it is not that one is value-free and the other value-laden. However, Stewart et al's values are explicitly and self-consciously present and thus, open to empirical scrutiny.
Anderson's argument is that Stewart et al.'s divorce study is better science than previous research on divorce because it is more empirically adequate and thus her argument is consistent with evaluation on standard constitutive/epistemic values—accounts that have increased empirical adequacy are prima facie better accounts. However, what differs is her analysis of the values invoked in the study and their responsiveness to empirical evidence. Stewart's conception of the objects of inquiry allows for both negative and positive experiences to count as evidence of the effects of divorce and so the way her team conceptualizes the objects of inquiry allows for a consideration of all of the evidence (unlike Wallerstein and Kelly's research which focuses only on the negative effects). Thus Anderson's analysis of the research indicates how the feminist values held by the researchers and incorporated into the research produce more empirically adequate, and hence better, science.
Sharyn Clough's approach to the question of values in science develops a view based on Donald Davidson's account of belief formation—an extension of Quinean holism. For Clough, holism requires that all values are empirically adjudicated—“some political claims (e.g., feminist claims) are better supported by empirical evidence than others”(2003b, 4). She has made use of her account to examine how sexist and racist values are not well-supported by evidence and hence science that is sexist and racist is clearly not good science (Clough 2003a; Clough and Loges 2008). She has also examined how feminist values improve research.
One recent example is her analysis of research on the hygiene hypothesis—the hypothesis that increased levels of concern about sanitation and the consequent decrease in exposure to micro-organisms and pathogens is related to increasingly high rates of auto-immune disease and allergies, particularly in the industrialized nations of the North and West (Clough 2011, 2012). The primary evidence for the hypothesis is the correlation between the rates of disease and the hygiene habits in the areas where the rates have increased. Further support for the hypothesis is garnered from recent research that shows that increased exposure to microbes in childhood is correlated with increased immunity in adulthood. Clough explores this case from a feminist perspective after noting additional data—the affected populations (those suffering from the illnesses) have disproportionate representation of women and girls. Clough argues that when viewed through an awareness of the gender structure of human societies, which generally require higher standards of cleanliness for female children than for males, this greater incidence of morbidity among females becomes evidence for the hygiene hypothesis and thus provides an opportunity for increased empirical adequacy. In other words, not paying attention to gender—not using the minimum feminist value that gender matters—narrows the range of data that researchers treat as evidence. Thus values have the potential to increase the empirical adequacy of an account. In effect, feminist values give rise to an augmented hygiene hypothesis that takes into account the differential enforcement of standards of cleanliness and so predicts a decreased immunity in adult females.
On Clough's analysis, the feminist values that drive the research are “first and foremost, beliefs, the semantic content of which is formed no differently from the content of factual beliefs. Together, all of our beliefs form a holistic web of meaning, to use the Quinean metaphor. Factual and value judgments might be used for different rhetorical purposes in our explanations and research, but that is different from saying that one kind of judgment has empirical content and the other does not” (Clough 2012, 423).
These two examples provide an illustration of how case study analysis may be used to work through the role that values can serve in good science and so how the general sorts of insights that holist accounts provide can be made specific. Each of the accounts discussed requires that political, social, moral, and cultural values of the sort that are traditionally understood to be non-epistemic must answer to empirical evidence. While they differ on the philosophical details of exactly how evidence bears on theory, the accounts have strong similarities and suggest avenues for reconciliation or even convergence. But holist accounts do present challenges in this regard. Solomon has expressed concerns about the ability of feminist holist empiricism to provide a general analysis of how values function in knowledge production. She questions whether any single approach to values will be able to provide an account of the various ways that values may function in science. She argues that values are not all of one type and consequently, when relevant (and they may not always be relevant, according to Solomon) they may be relevant in different ways, playing different roles in knowledge production. Different approaches—such as those that have been discussed and other ways of thinking about contextual or non-epistemic values and science—may be better for understanding the various roles that such values play in knowledge production (Solomon 2012,446). Miriam Solomon's critique and the ongoing discussion highlight another aspect of the diversity of feminist perspectives on science.
One reason that many philosophers of science have found it difficult to accept the conclusion that non-epistemic, feminist values can make a positive contribution to science is their commitment to an ideal of scientific objectivity. Elisabeth Lloyd notes that the meaning of “objectivity” or of “objective” is complex, unstable and far from clear. In one philosophical picture, “objective” characterizes a relationship between knowers and reality-as-independently-existing; methodologically, the knower must be detached, because investment in a particular belief or attachment to a point of view (“bias”) “could impede the free acquisition of knowledge and correct representation of (independent) reality…”. In Lloyd's analysis the problem lies with the claim that this “objective” reality —what she refers to as the “Really Real”— is “converged upon through the application of objective methods.” The Really Real can be known since it is publicly accessible to those who use these objective methods and who are properly detached or disinterested. As Lloyd points out, this view assumes (a) that the Really Real is completely independent of us; thus, (b) objective knowledge of this Reality requires an “objective method” characterized by detachment, because (c) attachment or point of view might interfere with our independence from the reality we wish to know, and (d) this reality is publicly accessible, if it is accessible at all (1995, 354–356). These assumptions are each problematic and here and in the next section, Feminist Standpoint Theory, we will consider how they affect feminist philosophy of science.
The first assumption, that the Really Real is completely independent of us, fails to acknowledge that in addition to “resistances by reality,” sociocultural factors are ”necessarily involved in the development of knowledge and concept-formation.” Anthropologists are virtually unanimous in holding that “sex and gender roles lay the foundations of every human society's other social practices,” therefore, any epistemology or philosophy of science that includes social interests and values as integral to the acquisition of knowledge should include sex and gender related values and interests (Lloyd 1995, 373 and 367–368).
Lloyd elaborates that when researchers investigate a phenomenon their goal is not only to represent reality, but to give a significant representation (i.e., relevant). Scientific accounts (theories and hypotheses) must focus on the parts of reality that are relevant to the interests (and values) that give rise to the research questions that motivate the research (2005, 244–245). While reality may be independent of us, our accounts of reality are accounts of the aspects of reality that matter to us and are shaped by our the interests that give rise to our research programs. Additionally, the questions addressed through research arise, in part, from what is thought to be known at the time that the research commences, this means that part of the evidence for the account rests in that background knowledge. The ineliminability of values in both the background knowledge and the current projects challenges the traditional idea of objectivity.
In addressing the question of objectivity, Lloyd and Anderson both make use of Hugh Lacey's distinction between two aspects of the value-free ideal: neutrality and impartiality, to clarify how interests and values may be implicated in good science (Lacey 1999, 2–6). Neutrality is the requirement that scientific theories neither presuppose nor support any non-epistemic (moral, political, social, or cultural) values. Impartiality is the requirement that theories must be evaluated on the basis of evidence and the extent to which they fulfill other epistemic values. (Anderson cites Kuhn's 1977 list: empirical adequacy, consistency, scope, external consonance with established theories) (Anderson 3004, 3). Impartiality is not achieved by disregarding evaluative standards—interests and values; instead it is achieved by “a commitment to pass judgment in relation to a set of evaluative standards that transcends the competing interest of those who advocate rival answers to a question” (Anderson 1995b, 41–42). Thus, Lloyd and Anderson take impartiality to be the key feature of objectivity, as does Lacey, “Impartiality is the ‘rock bottom’ component of the idea that the sciences are value free” (Lacey 1999, 78). However, as discussed in section 6.3, Anderson notes that at least some value judgments answer to empirical evidence and so they may serve as part of the evidence for background theories against which we evaluate evidence for hypotheses under consideration. This realization forces a reassessment of the ideal of impartiality—background theories may affect our assessment of the evidence and so we must be prepared to determine when such influence is pernicious and when beneficial. As we have seen in section 6.3 Feminist Perspectives on Values in Science, Anderson makes the distinction by examining the extent to which the values are responsive to evidence— that is, the extent to which they are held non-dogmatically. In order to meet the ideal of impartiality researchers must consider all of the evidence—since some of the evidence is either value-laden or supports the values that direct the research questions, impartial science need not be neutral.
This discussion has focused on approaches that fall under the general description “empiricist,” many of which owe much to Longino's contextual empiricism (see the entries on feminist epistemology and philosophy of science, feminist social epistemology, and the social dimensions of scientific knowledge) and so we will close with a brief description of the features of contextual empiricism that bear on the question of objectivity.
Using Kuhnian arguments for underdetermination of theory by evidence, Longino argues that since empirical evidence can never fully determine that we should accept any particular theory, contextual values (social, moral, political, and cultural) must play a role in that determination. Therefore, evidence is relative to the contextual values against which the evaluation of the theory occurs, a view that is shared among most of the philosophers discussed above. As a result, scientific theory is not neutral; it presupposes certain social and political values that are among the background assumptions against which the theory is evaluated and hence it is not objective in the traditional sense that requires neutrality (2008, 80). For Longino, scientific theory is not impartial either since social and political values play a role in theory acceptance. Longino offers another understanding of objectivity that grows out of the social character of science, which provides the opportunity for “transformative criticism.” Such criticism requires the adherence to social norms: publicly recognized forums for the criticism of evidence, of methods, and of assumptions and reasoning; uptake of criticism, which requires that the community not merely tolerate dissent, but alter its beliefs and theories over time in response to the critical discourse; publicly recognized standards by reference to which theories, hypotheses, and observational practices are evaluated and by appeal to which criticism is made relevant to the goals of the inquiring community; and finally, communities must be characterized by tempered equality of intellectual authority (Longino 1993, 1997, 2002). When science is conducted according to these norms it balances partialities and Longino considers it objective to the degree that it fulfills these norms. But it is neither neutral nor impartial since scientific theory is informed by values that shape the context in which the relevance of evidence is determined.
Feminist standpoint theory is often contrasted to feminist empiricism as an alternative epistemology for addressing concerns about the role of values and questions of objectivity. We will briefly discuss several different analyses of feminist standpoint theory in the next section. While it has been standard to distinguish feminist empiricism from feminist standpoint theory since Harding's 1986 categorization of feminist alternatives to traditional epistemology into three types—feminist empiricism, feminist standpoint theory, and feminist postmodernism—as we shall see, recent analyses of feminist standpoint theory and refinement to feminist empiricism suggest that the views are not only compatible but may converge (Intemann 2010).
Philosophical accounts of feminist standpoint theory begin with Sandra Harding's account of a methodology that sociologist Dorothy Smith used and advocated (Smith 1974; Harding 1987). While there are various versions, the commonalities include endorsement of the following three theses: the situated knowledge thesis, the thesis of epistemic privilege, and the achievement thesis (Wylie 2001, 2003, 2004; Rolin 2009; Intemann 2010; Crasnow 2013, 2014). The thesis of situated knowledge is based in the understanding that knowledge is for and by a particular set of socially situated knowers and so is always local—a cultural/social/political “location” characterized by the power relations endemic in such settings. The differential distribution of power and differences in interests are closely related—and thus the questions asked and the features of the world that are relevant to answering those questions vary depending on location as well. As Smith puts it,“From the point of view of ‘women's place’ the values assigned to different aspects of the world are changed” (1974, 7). Among the differences that are most salient are those that are in conflict with the interests of the dominant groups. Thus the metaphors of situated knowledge and social location give rise to one of the key ideas of feminist standpoint theory—the idea of the researcher as an insider/outsider who has “double vision.” Patricia Hill Collins (1986), for example, advocates the use of standpoint to analyze race and class. She argues that the researcher who is marginalized may recognize that many of the concepts and procedures adopted by the discipline are problematic when her colleagues do not, precisely because she is able to see the objects of inquiry both with the eyes of a researcher trained in the discipline and through her own experience from a marginalized social location.
Epistemic privilege has been one of the more contentious components of feminist standpoint theory. Much criticism of the view stems from a mistaken understanding in which epistemic privilege is thought to be automatic. As Kristen Intemann points out, if this was the claim that feminist standpoint theory made the view would be either trivial or false (Intemann 2010). But feminist standpoint theory is not committed to the clearly false claim that any woman can automatically know about the experience of all other women. Nor does it make the trivial claim that only those who have had a particular experience know what that experience is like. This seemingly trivial claim suffers from another problem in any case since the idea that only women can know the experience of other women depends on a presupposition of some sameness of women's experience—a presupposition that is blatantly false. A finer-grained understanding of social location reveals the flaws of this presupposition since there are many differences among women having to do with social cultural, political locations. Misunderstandings of the situated knowledge and epistemic advantage theses result from thinking of them in isolation from each other and mistakenly taking them to be claims about individualistic knowledge. Feminist standpoint theory is not an account of how an individual acquires knowledge, but rather an account that treats knowledge as social. This point can be made more clearly by considering the achievement thesis.
Understanding the achievement thesis requires distinguishing standpoint from perspective. Harding does so in the following ways. Feminist standpoint theory intends to map the practices of power—the ways the dominant institutions and their conceptual frameworks create and maintain oppressive social relations and structures. It does this by uncovering a distinctive insight about how the hierarchical social structure works. This comes about through the creation of a group consciousness rather than through the shift in perspective of an individual (Harding, 2004b, 31–32). While the change in location of an individual automatically brings a different perspective, achievement of a standpoint is not automatic. Perspective does not necessarily include the awareness one would need to “map the practices of power” or understand forms of oppression. Perspective also is not the right metaphor for understanding the way in which a groups' consciousness is created and differs from that of an individual.
Harding emphasizes the deeply political aspect of feminist standpoint theory. This characterization also makes clear the challenge that feminist standpoint theory raises for objectivity. Both neutrality and impartiality seem violated by feminist standpoint theory. Using the analysis of the previous section, we can see that the thesis that knowledge is situated means that it is partial. Treating epistemic privilege as a virtue rather than a vice depends on the partiality of the knowledge. And finally, the view that this privilege is not automatic—not merely a result of social location but achieved— prescribes striving for partiality rather than impartiality. It is not surprising that resistance to feminist standpoint theory has revolved around the way it has been perceived as a threat to the objectivity of science (Pinnick 2005).
Harding addresses the concern about objectivity through what she calls “strong objectivity,” (see also the section The Feminist Methods Debate). “Strong objectivity,” means that the subject of knowledge and the process through which knowledge is produced are to be scrutinized according to the same standards as the objects of knowledge. The contextual elements that function as part of the evidence, the selection of problems, the formation of hypotheses, the design of research (including the organization of research communities), the collection, interpretation, and sorting of data, decisions about when to stop research, the way results of research are reported and so on need to be open to critical evaluation. But such evaluation requires that these contextual elements be visible to researchers. The insider/outsider double-vision that feminist standpoint theory produces gives rise to the epistemic advantage through which researchers have access to this information. “...[A] maximally critical study of scientists and their communities can be done only from the perspective of those whose lives have been marginalized by such communities. Thus, strong objectivity requires that scientists and their communities be integrated into democracy-advancing projects for scientific and epistemological reasons as well as moral and political ones” (Harding 2004a, 136).
Alison Wylie offers an alternative approach to the question of objectivity in her account of feminist standpoint theory that suggests a blurring of the lines between feminist empiricism and feminist standpoint theory. She notes that “objectivity” is frequently used to indicate a relationship between theory and the world and so is identified as a property of knowledge claims. She proposes that we think about objectivity as the degree to which these claims conform to some standard set of epistemic virtues such as: empirical adequacy, explanatory power, internal coherence, consistency with other established bodies of knowledge. These theoretical virtues can rarely, if ever, all be maximized and so which virtues are deemed most important at any given time will depend on the interests, purposes, intentions, and goals of the knowers—all of which might be elements of a standpoint. Consequently, feminist standpoint can improve objectivity through determining what sort of empirical adequacy, explanatory power, or other virtues are relevant for a particular knowledge project and the degree to which each is relevant. Empirical adequacy is typically thought to be the most crucial of these virtues—a theory must fit the phenomena—and consequently it might be thought that empirical adequacy should always be preferred over other virtues. But Wylie points out that “empirical adequacy” is ambiguous. It could be either “fidelity to a rich body of localized evidence (empirical depth), or...a capacity to ‘travel’ (Haraway) such that the claims in question can be extended to a range of domains or applications (empirical breadth” (Wylie 2004, 345) and so even in the case of empirical adequacy interests (and so standpoint) are relevant. On Wylie's account, science is not neutral (values inform hypotheses and are implied by them), nor is it impartial, given that values determine which among the characteristics that determine objectivity are to be considered the most relevant for this knowledge project. But impartiality has not entirely vanished in that what counts as empirical is not determined by values, although its relevance is. The epistemic privilege thesis of feminist standpoint theory shows in that those in positions of subordination have epistemic privilege regarding some kinds of evidence and its relevance, special inferential heuristics, and interpretative or explanatory hypotheses. Wylie thus affirms the thesis of epistemic privilege although she notes that such epistemic privilege is contingent. It is always relative to a specific knowledge project.
Both Harding and Wylie appeal to standards (epistemic values) that transcend any social/political (non-epistemic values) and yet their accounts accommodate social/political values and provide ways of understanding how such values play a positive role in knowledge production. Intemman has argued that contemporary feminist empiricism and feminist standpoint theory have converged in many ways. For example, Wylie's account of feminist standpoint theory is compatible with her holism discussed in 6.2 The Consilience Model of Confirmation. However, Intemann identifies two remaining areas of difference: feminist empiricism and feminist standpoint theory differ over the kind of diversity needed for objectivity and they differ over the role that non-epistemic values play in enhancing objectivity (Intemann 2010, 790). She contends that feminist empiricism would benefit from adopting feminist standpoint theory's understanding of diversity—i.e., that it is the diversity of social locations rather than diversity of interests and values that are what contribute to objectivity. Intemann argues that feminist standpoint theory offers a better explanation of the positive role of feminist values in science rather than simply advocating for the diversity of values as feminist empiricism does. Whereas feminist empiricism argues for a balancing of values through diversity and so embraces impartiality, Intemann claims that feminist standpoint theory extols feminist values because they are good values rather than for their role in improving impartiality. She suggests a convergent position that she dubs “feminist standpoint empiricism” (2010, 794).
Gaile Pohlhaus, Jr. (2002) has suggested that there are distinctive features of feminist standpoint theory that have not been fully developed. She criticizes Harding's explication of feminist standpoint theory as being too individualist, identifying the spatial metaphor of social location as the source of this problem. The location metaphor has the effect of individualizing the knower—only one individual can occupy a place at a time. Pohlhaus argues that feminist standpoint theory requires a social conception of the knower(s)—the knower should be conceived of as a knowledge community not an individual. Such a social conception of the knower also provides a path to a political conception of the knower structured by the distribution of power and provides a fuller account of the achievement thesis. Standpoint has been understood as achieved primarily through struggling against the dominant understanding of the social/political world. What is missing is an account of struggling with. “To struggle-with would involve building relations with others by which we may come to know the world and understand one another, that is the project of building knowing communities” (Pohlhaus 2002, 292). Political communities are built on shared interests. Building such a community requires acknowledging diversity—including diversity of interests that arise from diversity of location—and uncovering shared interests through which to forge community. The political nature of early standpoint, with its roots in Marxist theory, captured this political feature of achievement, but later versions minimize it, moving away from the Marxist use of class struggle as a primary organizing principle of analysis. Sharon Crasnow (2013, 2014) suggests that Pohlhaus's insight about struggling-with can be developed into a more nuanced account of social/political values and negotiated shared interests. These negotiated and forged shared interests, arrived at through struggling-with, could serve to provisionally stabilize evidential relevance relations around a particular knowledge project. Such an extension of feminist standpoint theory may also point to its relationship to current research in social epistemology (see the entry on feminist social epistemology). This is another path through which a convergence of feminist empiricism and standpoint theory could be developed.
Feminist perspectives on science reflect a broad spectrum of appraisals and epistemic attitudes toward science. These are motivated by a recognition that the institutions of science have traditionally excluded women as practitioners; that issues of concern to women and sex/gender minorities are routinely marginalized in scientific inquiry, or are treated in ways that reproduce gender-normative stereotypes; and that scientific authority often rationalizes social roles and institutions that feminists call into question.
Feminists are skeptical of both the presumption that the sciences are an inherently masculine domain—that women are unfit for science, or science unfit for women—and the conviction that the institutions of science are a model of gender-neutral meritocracy. This skepticism has led to feminist equity critiques (discussed in the section on Feminist Equity Critiques). Feminist historians of science document entrenched historical patterns of exclusion of women but, at the same time, they recover evidence of women's active participation in the sciences. Although by mid-nineteenth century women were admitted to institutions of higher education and slowly gained access to scientific training, since the 1980's it has become clear that these gains in science training have not translated into comparable improvements in their representation in faculties of science and in “leadership positions” in the sciences.
Conventional explanations of these persistent inequalities typically invoke the talents, drive, and preferences of women. But other explanations note that while intentional discrimination still exists, gender discrimination also takes the form of diffuse but persistent differences in the recognition and reward of women's achievements. These differences in treatment arise in part from cognitive schemas and other heuristics that operate below the threshold of conscious awareness, generating patterns of evaluation bias that track not only gender but also race/ethnicity and a range of other markers by which social inequality is constituted. Although feminists have different perspectives on science in which they work, feminists share a concern to understand and to change conditions of oppression that operate along lines of gender difference. These goals require an accurate understanding of the nature and sources of oppression, and the sciences offer powerful tools for providing this understanding. As we saw in Section 3, some feminist scientists call for attention to neglected questions with the aim of improving the sciences in their own terms; those who are more methodologically and epistemically conservative do not challenge the background assumptions, methodological commitments, standards and practices of existing programs of scientific research. We can think of this approach as the selective appropriation of the tools of scientific inquiry for application in feminist-directed research.
But even epistemically conservative feminist interventions—those focused on correcting errors of omission and on investigating neglected problems—often generate more deeply challenging questions. Thus, many feminist scientists are more critical of the standards and practices of existing research programs and pursue constructive programs aimed at transforming the methodologies, ontological commitments, framework assumptions, and epistemic ideals that animate their fields. As we see from the many examples presented in Section 3, interventions that intend to be remedial or corrective often expose patterns of omission or gender-normative distortion that compromise not just the details but the framework assumptions of the sciences examined and the epistemic ideals that inform scientific practice.
The recognition that established scientific methodologies frequently reproduce or generate androcentric and sexist biases has led feminists to ask how to improve their methods. Feminists have articulated guidelines for research that sought to avoid the pitfalls of sexist and androcentric practice exposed by feminist critique (Section 4). These guidelines include addressing questions relevant to women and others oppressed by gendered systems; grounding research in the situated experience of women, i.e., ensuring that women's experience gives rise directly to the questions asked and undertaking to treat gendered experience and self-understanding as a critical resource at all stages of research (though not as epistemically foundational); adhering to ethical and pragmatic norms specifying that practitioners be accountable to research subjects in various senses; and being reflexive. Strong reflexivity means taking into account the ways in which their own socially defined angle of vision, interests, and values influence the research process. In short, feminist research aims to prevent gender from being “disappeared.”
All the issues discussed in this essay, from equity critiques to philosophical analysis, are among those included in the field known as “feminist sciences studies.” Generally, this interdisciplinary field, discussed in Section 5, encompasses feminist work in anthropology, cultural studies, economics, feminism, history, philosophy, political science, and sociology, and aims to show that and how science is a social activity. Across these disciplines, feminist science scholars contribute gender analyses that address such issues as power and inequality, differences among knowers, subjectivity and objectivity, embodiment, work, and the distinction between scientific experts and lay-people. And most feminist analyses pay attention to the relationships among science, gender, race, class, sexuality, disability and colonialism and how science constructs and applies these differences. Section 5 briefly summarizes past work in feminist science studies, but we note that recent work increasingly turns to the role of gender and science in developing nations and in the processes of development; the intersection of gender, science and culture outside of western cultures holds promise. Although race is more likely to be addressed within feminist than mainstream science studies, much work remains to be done; and finally, feminist disabilities studies now appear with increasing prominence.
Feminist science studies often expose instances in which gendered social values compromise scientific results. But often, feminist science studies reveal that such contextual/non-epistemic values can improve science. This recognition flies in the face of the traditional philosophical view of contextual/non-epistemic values when it comes to matters of theory justification, evidence, and objectivity. Thus, feminist philosophies of science, exemplified in Section 6, undertake to determine whether and how social values and interests play a positive role in the scientific knowledge production. Science is conventionally understood as objective in the sense that scientific work and the results of that work are free of contextual/non-epistemic values, i.e., moral, social, or political values. Feminist philosophers of science have offered alternative accounts of objectivity in order to explain how science that incorporates feminist values can be better, more objective, science. They do so with the aim of giving accounts that are empirically adequate to the case studies as they stand, without excessive rational reconstruction. This focus on case studies also calls for alternative analyses of how objectivity is understood. We have reviewed a variety of alternative approaches that use feminist empiricism and feminist standpoint theory. In summary, feminist perspectives on science arise from concerns to improve the lives of all who are affected by gender inequity by encouraging and using better understandings of the natural and social worlds.
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- ADVANCE (NSF-funded Program for the Advancement of Women in Academic Science and engineering Careers): a number of ADVANCE projects support websites that provide useful information on the issues faced by women in the sciences and on strategies for promoting “institutional transformation” developed with NSF support. Three of the most extensive are:
- FEMMSS: Association for Feminist Epistemologies, Methodologies, Metaphysics and Science Studies
- RaceSci (History of Race in Science): a website of links to websites concerned with race in science
- Society for Analytic Feminism: a forum for feminist philosophy in the analytic tradition which includes feminist philosophy of science
- Symposia on Gender, Race and Philosophy, Robert Gooding-Williams, Sally Haslanger, Ishani Maitra, Ronald Sundstrom, and Cynthia Willett (eds.): archives, book reviews, bibliography and links to related websites.
- Anderson, E., Extended critical notice of “How Not to Criticize Feminist Epistemology: a Review of Scrutinizing Feminist Epistemology”