Feminist Epistemology and Philosophy of Science
Feminist epistemology and philosophy of science studies the ways in which gender does and ought to influence our conceptions of knowledge, knowers, and practices of inquiry and justification. It identifies how dominant conceptions and practices of knowledge attribution, acquisition, and justification disadvantage women and other subordinated groups, and strives to reform them to serve the interests of these groups. Various feminist epistemologists and philosophers of science argue that dominant knowledge practices disadvantage women by (1) excluding them from inquiry, (2) denying them epistemic authority, (3) denigrating “feminine” cognitive styles, (4) producing theories of women that represent them as inferior, or significant only in the ways they serve male interests, (5) producing theories of social phenomena that render women’s activities and interests, or gendered power relations, invisible, and (6) producing knowledge that is not useful for people in subordinate positions, or that reinforces gender and other social hierarchies. Feminist epistemologists trace these failures to flawed conceptions of knowledge, knowers, objectivity, and scientific methodology. They offer diverse accounts of how to overcome these failures. They also aim to (1) explain why the entry of women and feminist scholars into different academic disciplines has generated new questions, theories, methods, and findings, (2) show how gender and feminist values and perspectives have played a causal role in these transformations, (3) promote theories that aid egalitarian and liberation movements, and (4) defend these developments as epistemic advances.
The central concept of feminist epistemology is of situated knowledge: knowledge that reflects the particular perspectives of the knower. Feminist philosophers explore how gender situates knowing subjects. They have articulated three main approaches to this question—feminist standpoint theory, feminist postmodernism, and feminist empiricism—which have converged over time. Conceptions of how gender situates knowers also inform feminist approaches to the central problems of the field: grounding feminist criticisms of science and feminist science, defining the proper roles of social and political values in inquiry, evaluating ideals of objectivity, and reforming practices of epistemic authority and epistemic virtue.
- 1. Situated Knowers
- 2. Feminist Standpoint Theory
- 3. Feminist Postmodernism
- 4. Feminist Empiricism
- 5. Interactions of Feminist Standpoint Theory, Postmodernism, and Empiricism
- 6. Feminist Science Criticism and Feminist Science
- 7. Feminist Defenses of Value-Laden Inquiry
- 8. Feminist Critiques and Conceptions of Objectivity
- 9. Epistemic Authority, Epistemic Injustice, Epistemologies of Ignorance, and Virtue Epistemology
- 10. External Criticisms of Feminist Epistemology
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Situated Knowers
Feminist epistemology conceives of knowers as situated in particular relations to what is known and to other knowers. What is known, and how it is known, reflects the situation and perspective of the knower. Here we are concerned with claims to know, temporarily bracketing the question of which claims are true or warranted.
Situated knowledge in general. People may understand the same object in different ways that reflect the distinct relations in which they stand to it. (1) Embodiment. People experience the world by using their bodies, which have different constitutions and are differently located in space and time. (2) First-person vs. third-person knowledge. Individuals have first-personal access to some of their own bodily and mental states, and knowledge about themselves, which differs from third-person knowledge about them. (3) Emotions, attitudes, interests, and values. People often represent objects in relation to their emotions, attitudes and interests, which differ from how others represent these objects. A thief represents a lock as a frustrating obstacle while its owner represents the lock as a comforting source of security. (4) Personal knowledge of others. Because people behave differently toward others, and others interpret their behavior differently, depending on their personal relationships, what others know of them depends on these relationships. (5) Know-how. People have different skills, which may also be a source of different propositional knowledge. (6) Cognitive Styles. People have different styles of investigation and representation (e.g. preferring lumping or splitting). (7) Background beliefs and worldviews. People form different beliefs about an object, in virtue of different background beliefs. Such differences may lead a patient to interpret his symptoms as signs of a heart attack, while his doctor diagnoses heartburn. Differences in global metaphysical or political worldviews may also generate different beliefs about particulars on a broader scale. (8) Relations to other inquirers. People may stand in different epistemic relations to other inquirers—for example, as informants, assistants, students—which affects their access to information and their ability to convey their beliefs to others.
Situatedness influences knowers’ access to information and the terms in which they represent what they know. They bear on the form of their knowledge (articulate/implicit, formal/informal, and so forth). They affect their attitudes toward their beliefs (certainty/doubt, dogmatic/open to revision), their standards of justification, and the authority with which they lay claim to their beliefs and offer them to others. They affect knowers’ assessment of which claims are significant or important.
Social situation. Feminist epistemology focuses on how the social location of the knower affects what and how she knows. It is thus a branch of social epistemology. Individuals’ social locations consist of their ascribed social identities (gender, race, sexual orientation, caste, class, kinship status, trans/cis etc.) and social relations, roles, and role-given interests, which are affected by these identities. Individuals are subject to different norms that prescribe different virtues, habits, emotions, and skills thought to be appropriate for their roles. They also have different subjective identities—identities incorporated into their self-understandings—, and attitudes toward their ascribed identities, such as affirmation, rejection, pride, and shame.
Gender as a mode of social situation. In feminist theory, “gender” refers to systems of meanings, social identities, roles, norms, and associated behaviors, traits and virtues, ascribed or prescribed to individuals on the basis of their real or imagined sexual characteristics (Haslanger 2000). It also includes individuals’ subjective identifications with and orientations to such meanings. Psychological traits are considered “masculine” and “feminine” if they dispose their bearers to comply with the gender norms assigned to men and women, respectively. From a performative perspective, masculinity and femininity are not fixed traits but contrasting styles of behavior that may be manifested by individuals of any ascribed or subjective gender identity in almost any role (West & Zimmerman 1987; Butler 1990). Finally, “gender symbolism” comprises metaphorical ascriptions of gendered ideas to animals and inanimate objects.
Gendered knowledge. By joining the account of situated knowledge with the account of gender as a social situation, we can generate a catalog of ways in which what people know, or think they know, can be influenced by their own gender (roles, norms, traits, performance, identities), other people’s genders, or by ideas about gender (symbolism).
The phenomenology of gendered bodies. People’s bodies are both differently sexed and differently gendered. Early child socialization trains boys’ and girls’ bodies to different norms of bodily comportment. Once internalized, such norms profoundly affect the phenomenology of embodiment. They inform men’s and women’s distinct first-personal knowledge of what it is like to inhabit a body, to express capacities unique to one sex or another (e.g., breast feeding), and to have experiences that are manifested through different body parts in differently sexed bodies (e.g., orgasm). They also cause men’s and women’s experiences of gendered behaviors that both can perform to differ—in fluidity, self-consciousness, confidence, awkwardness, shame, and so forth. Some feminist epistemologists argue that dominant models of the world, especially of the relation between minds and bodies, have seemed compelling to mostly male philosophers because they conform to a male or masculine phenomenology (Bordo 1987; Young 1990).
Gendered first-personal knowledge. It is one thing to know what sexual harassment is in third-personal terms. It is another to recognize “I have been sexually harassed.” Many women know that women in general are disadvantaged have difficulty recognizing themselves as sharing women’s predicament (Clayton & Crosby 1992). The problems of self-knowledge are pressing for feminist theory, because it is committed to theorizing in ways that women can use to improve their lives. This entails that women be able to recognize their lives in feminist accounts of women’s predicament. Feminist epistemology is therefore concerned with investigating the conditions of feminist self-understanding and the social settings in which it may arise (MacKinnon 1989).
Gendered attitudes, interests, and values. A representation is androcentric if it depicts the world in relation to male or masculine interests, attitudes or values. A “male” interest is an interest a man has, in virtue of the goals given to him by social roles designated as appropriate for men to occupy, or in virtue of his subjective gender identity. A “masculine” interest is an interest a man has in virtue of attitudes thought appropriate to men. Such attitudes and interests structure the cognition of those who have them. For instance, they may influence how heterosexual men classify women as, e.g., differently eligible for sexual intercourse with them. A representation is gynocentric if it depicts the world in relation to female or feminine interests, attitudes, or values. An interest, attitude, or value might also be symbolically gendered. For example, the ethics of care represents moral problems in terms of symbolically feminine values—values culturally associated with women’s gender roles (Gilligan 1982). It is a symbolically gynocentric perspective, even if men also adopt it. Feminist epistemology raises numerous questions about these phenomena. Can situated emotional responses to things be a valid source of knowledge about them (Jaggar 1989, Keller 1983, Pitts-Taylor 2013)? Do dominant practices and conceptions of science reflect an androcentric perspective, or a perspective that reflects other dominant positions, as of race and colonial rule (Merchant 1980; Harding 1986, 1991, 1993, 1998, 2006, 2008; Schiebinger 2007)? Do mainstream philosophical conceptions of objectivity, knowledge, and reason reflect an androcentric perspective (Bordo 1987; Code 1991; Flax 1983; Rooney 1991)? How would the conceptual frameworks of particular sciences change if they reflected the interests of women (Anderson 1995b, Rolin 2009)?
Knowledge of others in gendered relationships. Gender norms structure the social spaces to which people with different gender identities are admitted, as well as the presentation of self to others. Inquirers with different gender identities therefore have access to different information about others. Male and female ethnographers may be admitted to different social spaces, and have different effects on their informants. Research that elicits information about others through personal contact therefore raises the question of how findings might be influenced by gendered relations between researchers and subjects, and whether gender-inclusive research teams are in a better position to detect this (Bell et al 1993; Leacock 1981; Sherif 1987).
Gendered skills. Some skills are labeled masculine or feminine because men and women need them to perform their respective gender roles. To the extent that the skill is perceived by the agent or others as proper to someone with a different gender, performance of it, or social recognition of success in performance, may be impaired. These phenomena raise various epistemic questions. Does the “masculine” symbolism of certain scientific skills, such as of assuming an “objective” stance toward nature, interfere with the integration of women into science? Do actually or symbolically “feminine” skills aid the acquisition of scientific knowledge (Keller 1983, 1985a; Rose 1987; Ruetsche 2004)?
Gendered cognitive styles. Some theorists believe that men and women have different cognitive styles (Belenky et al 1986; Gilligan 1982). Whether or not this is true, cognitive styles are gender symbolized (Rooney 1991). Deductive, analytic, atomistic, acontextual, and quantitative cognitive styles are labeled “masculine,” while intuitive, synthetic, holistic, contextual and qualitative cognitive styles are labeled “feminine.” It is seen as masculine to make one’s point by argument, feminine to make one’s point by narrative. Argument is commonly cast as an adversarial mode of discourse, like war, while narrative is viewed as a seductive mode of discourse, like love. These phenomena raise epistemic questions: does the quest for “masculine” prestige by using “masculine” methods distort practices of knowledge acquisition (Addelson 1983; Moulton, 1983)? Are some kinds of research unfairly ignored because of their association with “feminine” cognitive styles (Keller 1983, 1985b)?
Gendered background beliefs and worldviews. Representational schemes that are functional for different gendered roles and attitudes make different information salient. The resulting differential background knowledge may lead differently gendered individuals to interpret commonly accessed information differently. A man might read a woman’s demure smile as a coy come-on, where another woman may interpret it as her polite and defensive reaction to unwanted attention. Such differences can spring from differential access to empathetic and phenomenological knowledge. These phenomena raise epistemological questions. Are there epistemic obstacles to legal institutions recognizing rape and sexual harassment, insofar as they confine their thinking within a “masculine” perspective (MacKinnon 1989)? Do sexist or androcentric background beliefs cause scientists to generate sexist theories about women, despite adhering to ostensibly objective scientific methods (Harding 1986; Harding & O’Barr, 1987)? How might the social practices of science be organized so that variations in background beliefs of inquirers function as epistemic resources (Longino 1990; Solomon 2001)?
Relations to other inquirers. Gender differences in knowledge can be reduced if differently gendered people participate in inquiry together. Each gender can take on testimony what the other can acquire through direct experience. Each may also learn how to exercise imaginative projection more effectively, and to take up the perspective of another gender. However, gender norms influence the terms on which men and women communicate (Kalbfleisch 1995). In some contexts, women are not allowed to speak, or their questions, comments, and challenges are ignored, interrupted, and systematically distorted, or they aren’t accepted as experts. Gendered norms of conversation and epistemic authority thus influence the ability of knowledge practices to incorporate the knowledge of men and women into their processes of inquiry. Feminist epistemologists explore how gender norms distort the dissemination of testimony and relations of cognitive authority among inquirers (Addelson 1983; Code 1991; Fricker 2007) and how the social relations of inquirers could be reformed, especially with regard to the allocation of epistemic authority, so as to enable more successful practices of inquiry (Jones 2002; Longino 1990; Nelson 1990, 1993).
Problems of and Approaches to Gendered Situated Knowledge. Mainstream epistemology takes as paradigms of knowledge simple propositional knowledge about matters in principle equally accessible to anyone with basic cognitive and sensory apparatus: “2+2=4”; “grass is green”; “water quenches thirst.” Feminist epistemology does not claim that such knowledge is gendered. Paying attention to gender-situated knowledge enables questions to be addressed that are difficult to frame in epistemologies that assume that gender and other social situations of the knower are irrelevant to knowledge. Are certain perspectives epistemically privileged? Can a more objective perspective be constructed from differently gendered perspectives?
Feminist epistemologists have considered situated knowledge within three traditions: standpoint theory, postmodernism, and empiricism. The next three sections explain how these three traditions were originally articulated, while section 5 discussion their interactions and convergence.
2. Feminist Standpoint Theory
Standpoint Epistemology in General. Standpoint theories claim to represent the world from an epistemically advantaged socially situated perspective. A complete standpoint theory must specify (i) the social location of the advantaged perspective, (ii) its scope: the subject matters over which it claims advantage, (iii) the aspect of the social location that generates epistemic advantage: for example, social role, or subjective identity; (iv) the ground of its advantage: what justifies its claim to superiority; (v) the type of epistemic superiority it claims: for example, greater accuracy, or greater ability to represent fundamental truths; (vi) the other perspectives relative to which it claims advantage, and (vii) modes of access to that perspective: is occupying the social location necessary or sufficient for getting access to the perspective? Many limited claims to epistemic advantage on behalf of particular perspectives are uncontroversial. Auto mechanics are in a better position than auto consumers to know what is wrong with their cars. Practical experience in fulfilling the mechanic’s role grounds mechanics’ epistemic advantage, which claims superior reliability.
Standpoint theories usually claim that the perspectives of subordinated social groups have an epistemic advantage regarding politically contested topics related to their subordination, relative to the perspectives of the groups that dominate them. Classically, standpoint theory claims that the standpoint of the subordinated is advantaged (1) in revealing fundamental social regularities; (2) in exposing social arrangements as contingent and susceptible to change through concerted action; and (3) in representing the social world in relation to universal human interests. By contrast, dominant group standpoints represent only surface social regularities in relation to dominant group interests, and misrepresent them as necessary, natural, or universally advantageous.
Grounds of Feminist Standpoint Theory. Feminist standpoint theory claims that the standpoint of women has an epistemic advantage over phenomena in which gender is implicated, relative to theories that make sexist or androcentric assumptions. Variants of feminist standpoint theory ground this epistemic advantage in different features of women’s social situation, by analogy with different strands of Marxist epistemology.
Centrality. Marxist feminists, such as Hartsock (1987) and Rose (1987) focus on women’s centrality to the system of reproduction—of childrearing and caring for bodies. Because women tend to the needs of everyone in the household, they are in a better position than men to see how patriarchy fails to meet people’s needs. Men, in virtue of their dominant position, can ignore how patriarchy undermines subordinates’ interests.
Collective self-consciousness. MacKinnon (1989) argues that men constitute women as women by sexually objectifying them, i.e., by representing their natures as essentially sexually subordinate to men and treating them accordingly. Women unmask these ideological misrepresentations by achieving and acting on a shared understanding of themselves as women—as a group unjustly constituted by sexual objectification. Through collective feminist actions in which women refuse to act as sexual objects—as in campaigns against sexual harassment and rape— women show that representations of women as sexual objects are not natural or necessary. Their privileged knowledge is collective agent self-knowledge, made true by being put into action in feminist campaigns.
Cognitive style. Some early versions of standpoint theory (Flax 1983, Hartsock 1987, Rose 1987) accept feminist object relations theory, which explains the development of gender identity in male and female children raised by female caregivers. Males acquire a masculine identity by distinguishing themselves from their mothers, through controlling and denigrating the feminine. Females acquire their gender identity through identification with their mothers, blurring boundaries between self and other. Males and females thereby acquire distinct cognitive styles. The masculine cognitive style is abstract, theoretical, emotionally detached, atomistic, and oriented toward control or domination. The feminine cognitive style is concrete, practical, emotionally engaged, relational, and oriented toward care. These cognitive styles are reinforced by the gendered division of labor—men having a near monopoly on positions of political, economic, and military power calling for detachment and control; and women being assigned to emotional care for others. The feminine cognitive style claims epistemic advantage because ways of knowing based on caring for everyone’s needs produce more valuable representations than ways of knowing based on domination (Hartsock 1987). Institutionalizing feminine ways of knowing requires overcoming the division of mental, manual, and caring labor that characterizes capitalist patriarchy (Rose 1987).
Oppression. Women have an interest in representing social phenomena in ways that reveal their oppression. They also have personal experience of sexist oppression, unlike men, whose power enables them to ignore how their actions affect women. If epistemic advantage is grounded in oppression, the multiply oppressed have additional epistemic authority. Thus, Collins (1990) grounds black feminist epistemology in black women’s personal experiences of racism and sexism. She uses this epistemology to supply black women with self-representations that enable them to resist demeaning racist and sexist images of black women, and to take pride in their identities. The epistemic advantage of the oppressed is sometimes founded on“bifurcated consciousness”: the ability to see both from the perspective of the dominant and from the perspective of the oppressed (Harding 1991, Collins 1990).
Access to the Feminist Standpoint. Every standpoint theory must explain how one gains access to it. Most standpoint theories represent the epistemically advantaged standpoint not as given, but as achieved through critical reflection on the power structures constituting group identities. If the group and its interests are defined objectively, the facts that constitute the group and its interests are publicly accessible. So anyone can theorize phenomena in relation to the interests of that group. However, if epistemic advantage lies in collective agent-knowledge, its site lies in the group defining itself as a collective agent. The privileged standpoint is not that of women, but of feminists (MacKinnon 1989). Men can participate in the feminist movement. But they cannot assume a dominant role in defining (hence knowing) its aims, given the feminist interest in overcoming male dominance.
Goals of Feminist Standpoint Theory. Feminist standpoint theory is a type of critical theory. Critical theories aim to empower the oppressed. To serve this aim, social theories must (a) represent the world in relation to the interests of the oppressed; (b) enable the oppressed to understand their problems; and (c) be usable by the oppressed to improve their condition. Claims of superiority for critical theories are thus fundamentally based on pragmatic virtues (Harding 1991, Hartsock 1996).
Criticisms of Feminist Standpoint Theory. Longino (1993b) argues that standpoint theory cannot provide a noncircular basis for deciding which standpoints have epistemic privilege. Crenshaw (1999) argues that it is implausible to hold that any group inequality is central to all the others; they intersect in complex ways. Hence, women cannot have privileged access to understanding their oppression, since this takes different forms for different women, depending on their race, sexual orientation, and other identities. This critique has been developed by feminist postmodernists, who question the possibility of a unified standpoint of women, and see, behind the assertion of a universal woman’s viewpoint, the perspective of relatively privileged white women (Lugones & Spelman 1983).
3. Feminist Postmodernism
General Postmodernist Themes. Postmodernism draws inspiration from poststructuralist and postmodernist theorists, including Derrida, Foucault, Irigaray, Lacan, Lyotard, and Saussure. It questions attempts to transcend situatedness by appeal to such ideas as universality, necessity, objectivity, essence, and foundations. It stresses the locality, partiality, contingency, instability, uncertainty, ambiguity and essential contestability of any particular view of the world and the good. The postmodernist emphasis on revealing the situatedness and contestability of any claim or system serves both critical and liberatory functions. It delegitimizes ideas that dominate and exclude by undermining their claims to ultimate justification. And it opens up space for imagining alternative possibilities that were obscured by those claims.
Postmodernists claim that what we think of as reality is “discursively constructed.” According to Saussure, “the linguistic sign acts reflexively, not referentially” in a “discursive field.” This amounts to radical holism about meaning: signs get their meaning not from their reference to external things but from their relations to all the other signs in the discourse. Introducing new signs (or discarding old ones) thus changes the meanings of the signs already in use. Signs therefore lack a fixed meaning over time. These ideas support the rejection of what Lyotard calls “totalizing metanarratives.” There can be no complete, unified theory of the world that captures the whole truth. A discourse with different terms would contain meanings not available in the discursive field of the theory that claims completeness. The assertion of any particular theory is an exercise of “power”—to exclude certain possibilities from thought and authorize others. Postmodernist claims that objects are “discursively constructed” or “socially constructed” assert a kind of nominalism: that the world does not dictate the categories we use to describe it, that innumerable incompatible ways of classifying the world are available to us. The selection of any one theory is a choice that cannot be justified by appeal to “objective” truth or reality.
Social practices also function as linguistic signs. For example, the elevation of the judge’s bench metaphorically signifies the judge’s superior authority over others in the courtroom. As words get their meaning from their relations to other words, so do actions get their meaning from their relations to other actions, rather than from their relation to some pre-linguistic realm of human nature or natural law. Thus, the superior authority of judges consists in the conventions of deference others manifest toward them. It is not underwritten by an underlying normatively objective authority. The latter thought expresses an essentialist and objectivist power play, attempting to foreclose contests over practices by fixing them in a supposedly extra-discursive reality. The meanings of actions can be subverted by other actions that, in changing the context, changes their meanings. This is why postmodernists celebrate ironic, parodic, and campy renditions of conventional behaviors as politically liberating (Butler 1993).
The self is likewise constituted by signs. There is no unified self that underlies the play of a stream of signifiers. Although subjectivity is constituted through the production of signs, the self is entangled in a web of meanings not of its own creation: our identities are socially imposed. However, this does not foreclose agency, because we occupy multiple social identities (a woman might be a worker, a mother, lesbian, Mexican, etc.). Tensions among these identities open up spaces for disrupting the discursive systems that construct us.
Feminist Postmodernism. Feminist postmodernist ideas are deployed against theories that purport to justify sexist practices—notably, ideologies that claim that observed differences between men and women are natural and necessary, or that women have an essence that explains and justifies their subordination. The claim that gender is socially or discursively constructed—that it is an effect of social practices and systems of meaning that can be disrupted—finds a home in postmodernism (Butler 1990). However, postmodernism has figured more prominently in internal critiques of feminist theories. One of the most important trends in feminist thinking has been exposing and responding to exclusionary tendencies within feminism itself. Women of color and lesbian women have argued that mainstream feminist theories have ignored their problems and perspectives (Collins 1990; Hull, Scott, and Smith, 1982; Lorde 1984).
The critique of the concept “woman.” Feminist postmodernists have criticized many of the leading feminist theories of gender and patriarchy as essentialist (Butler 1990, Flax 1990, Spelman 1988). Essentialism here refers to any theory that postulates a universal, transhistorical, necessary cause or constitution of gender or patriarchy. Feminist postmodernists object that, in claiming that gender identity is one thing or has one cause, such theories convert discursively constructed facts into norms, difference into deviance. They either exclude women who don’t conform to the theory from the class of “women,” or represent them as inferior. Critiques of feminist theories by lesbian women and women of color reinforce skepticism about the unity of the category “woman” by highlighting intersectioning identities of gender, race, class, trans/cis, and sexual orientation. The faultlines for fragmentating the category “woman” are thus other identities along which social inequalities are constructed.
This critique of “woman” as a unified object of theorizing entails that “woman” also cannot constitute a unified subject of knowing (Lugones & Spelman 1983). The theories of universal gender identity under attack are ones in which the authors, white middle class heterosexual women, could see themselves. Critics claim that the authors fail to acknowledge their own situatedness and hence the ways they are implicated in and reproduce power relations—in this case, the presumption of white middle class heterosexual women to define “the standpoint of women”—to speak for all other women. Feminist standpoint theorists, who claim an epistemic privilege on behalf of their standpoint, thereby unjustifiably assert a race and class privilege over other women. This lesson applies to subaltern feminist standpoints as well. The assertion of a black feminist standpoint, for example, objectionably essentializes black women. Once the postmodernist critique of essentialism is granted, there is no logical stopping point in the proliferation of perspectives.
Perspective shifting. Feminist postmodernism envisions our epistemic situation as characterized by a shifting plurality of perspectives, none of which can claim objectivity—that is, transcendence of situatedness. This position rejects both objectivism and relativism for the ways they let knowers escape responsibility for the representations they construct (Haraway 1991). People are not epistemically trapped inside their cultures, their gender, or any other identity. They can think from other perspectives. Thus, although we will always have plural perspectives, their constitution is always shifting, without a stable correspondence between individuals and perspectives. Negotiating the array of situated knowledges involves two types of epistemic practice. One is acceptance of responsibility: acknowledging the choices of situation involved in constructing one’s representations (Haraway 1991), and considering how they affect the content of one’s representations (Harding 1993). The second is “world traveling” (Lugones 1987) or “mobile positioning”—trying to see things from many other perspectives. Mobile positioning can never be transparent or innocent. Imagining oneself in another’s situation is risky, requiring sensitive engagement with and sympathy for occupants of those positions. Both transform situated knowing into a critical and responsible practice.
Criticisms of Feminist Postmodernism. Both features of feminist postmodernism—the rejection of “woman” as a category of analysis, and the fragmentation of perspectives—are controversial. Wholesale opposition to broad generalizations about women may preclude critical analysis of large-scale social forces that affect women (Benhabib 1995). That women in different social positions experience sexism differently does not entail that they have nothing in common—they still suffer from sexism (MacKinnon 2000). Intersectionality may be accommodated through a structural analysis of gender that allows for racialized and other particularized modes of sexist oppression (Haslanger 2000). Postmodernist fragmentation threatens both the possibility of analytical focus and of politically effective coalition building among diverse women. Yet, virtually all feminists acknowledge that a plurality of situated knowledges appears to be an inescapable consequence of social differentiation and embodiment.
4. Feminist Empiricism
Relations of Feminist Empiricism to Empiricism in General. Empiricism is the view that experience provides the sole or primary justification for knowledge. Classical empiricists held that the content of experience could be described in fixed, basic, theory-neutral terms—such as in terms of sense-data. Most also supposed that philosophy could provide an external justification for scientific method. Quine revolutionized empiricism by rejecting these ideas. For Quine, observation is theory-laden. It is cast in terms of complex concepts not immediately given in experience, which are potentially subject to revision in light of further experience (Quine 1963). Moreover, epistemology is just another project within science, in which we empirically investigate our practices of inquiry (Quine 1969). Many feminist empiricists accept these views while rejecting Quine’s sharp division of facts from values, which they regard as inconsistent with naturalized empiricism. Feminist empiricists consider how feminist values can legitimately inform empirical inquiry, and how scientific methods can be improved in light of demonstrations of sex bias in science (Campbell 1998, Clough 2003, Nelson 1990). Quine also presupposes an individualist account of inquiry, while most feminist empiricists advocate a socialized epistemology, in which inquiry is treated as a social practice, and the subjects of knowledge may even be communities.
The Paradoxes of Bias and Social Construction. Two apparent paradoxes encapsulate the central problematics of feminist empiricism. First, much feminist science criticism consists in exposing androcentric and sexist biases in scientific research. This criticism seems to rest on the view that bias is epistemically bad. Yet, advocates of feminist science argue that science would improve if it allowed feminist values to inform scientific inquiry. This amounts to a recommendation that science adopt certain biases. This is the paradox of bias. Second, much feminist science criticism exposes the influence of social and political factors on science. Scientists advance androcentric and sexist theories because they are influenced by sexist values in the wider society. This might suggest adopting an individualist epistemology to eliminate these social biases. Yet most feminists urge that scientific practices should be open to different social influences. Call this the paradox of social construction.
Feminist empiricists dissolve these paradoxes by rejecting their underlying assumptions: that biases, political values, and social factors influence inquiry only by displacing the influence of evidence, logic, and other factors that lead to true or empirically adequate theories. Not all bias is epistemically bad (Antony 1993). There are three strategies for showing this: pragmatic, procedural, and moral realist. The pragmatic strategy stresses the uses to which knowledge will be put. Responsible inquiry respects a division of labor between the functions of evidence and social values—evidence helping inquirers track truths, social values helping inquirers construct representations from those truths that serve the practical aims of inquiry (Anderson 1995b). This view may be joined with a view of nature as complex. Different ways of classifying phenomena will reveal different patterns useful to different practical interests (Longino 2001). The procedural strategy argues that epistemically bad biases can be kept in check through an appropriate social organization of inquiry. A social organization that holds people with different biases accountable to one another will be able to weed out bad biases, even if no individual is free of bias (Longino 1990). This view may be joined with the idea that the subject of knowledge (Nelson 1993), epistemic rationality (Solomon 2001) or objectivity (Longino 1990, 2001) is the epistemic community. The moral realist strategy argues that moral, social and political value judgments have truth-values, and that feminist values are true. Inquiry informed by feminist values therefore does not displace attention to the evidence, because the evidence vindicates these values (Campbell 1998).
Feminist empiricists appeal to the pragmatist tradition to undermine the sharp dichotomy between fact and value (Antony 1993, Nelson 1993). They argue that the underdetermination of theory by evidence leads to a view of facts and values as mutually constituting. Whether any particular feminist, or sexist, theory is true will depend on empirical investigation informed by epistemic norms—norms which may be reformed in light of the merits of the theories they generate. This is the project of naturalized epistemology, whereby the vindication of norms of inquiry is sought within empirical investigation.
Criticisms of Feminist Empiricism. Feminist empiricists are criticized for naively holding that science will correct the errors and biases in its theories about women and other subordinated groups by itself, without the aid of feminist values or insights (Harding 1986, 1991). These criticisms apply to what Harding called “spontaneous feminist empiricism”—the view that elimination of sexist bias, without further modification of scientific methods as traditionally understood, is sufficient for feminist critique. However, the naturalized epistemology of most feminist empiricists views knowers as socially situated, empirical evidence as theory-laden and critically revisable in light of theoretical and normative reflection, and objective knowledge of human phenomena as requiring inclusion of feminist inquirers as equals in the social project of inquiry (Longino 1993a, 1993b). Hundleby (1997), a standpoint theorist, criticizes feminist empiricism for overlooking the role of feminist political activity,especially the development of oppositional consciousness, as a superior source of hypotheses and evidence for challenging sexist and androcentric theories.
5. Interactions of Feminist Standpoint Theory, Postmodernism, and Empiricism
Harding’s (1986) tripartite classification of feminist epistemologies cast them as three contrasting frameworks. In the last thirty years, feminist epistemologists have blurred the distinctions among these views, as Harding both predicted and promoted (1990, 1991, 1998). Early theorizing in feminist epistemology tended to explore global questions about gender and knowledge: are dominant conceptions or practices of science, objectivity, and knowledge masculine or androcentric? The field has evolved toward local investigations of the ways gender affects inquiry in specific investigations by particular communities using distinct methods. This turn to the local has facilitated the convergence of the three types of feminist epistemology.
Feminist standpoint theory. The postmodernist critique of standpoint theory, in conjunction with the proliferation of subaltern women’s standpoints (black, Latina, lesbian, postcolonial, etc.) has led most standpoint theorists to abandon the search for a single feminist standpoint. They acknowledge plural standpoints of intersecting marginalized groups (Harding 1991, 1998; Collins 1990). Inquiry that draws on their insights and starts from their predicaments is more fruitful than inquiry that draws only on the insights and starts from the predicaments of relatively privileged groups (Harding 1993, 1998). It also offers pragmatic advantages in enabling us to envision and realize more just social relations (Hartsock 1996). Standpoint theorists (Collins 1996; Harding 1996; Hartsock 1996) have shifted from claims of general epistemic privilege to claims of practical advantage in response to postmodernist critics such as Hekman (1996). Wylie (2003) argues that consensus has emerged among feminist epistemologists on two points: (1) rejection of essentialism (the idea that the social groups defining any standpoint have a necessary and fixed nature, or that their members do or ought to think alike) and (2) rejection of attempts to grant automatic epistemic privilege to any particular standpoint. Instead, the social situation of “insider-outsiders” (members of subordinated groups who need accurate knowledge of the worlds of the privileged to navigate them) sometimes affords a contingent epistemic advantage in solving particular problems. Standpoint theorists’ pluralism reflects a productive interaction with feminist postmodernism; their shift toward pragmatism and contingent epistemic advantages of the oppressed reflects convergence with feminist empiricism.
Theorists have devoted effort to specifying the contingent cognitive advantages claimed by a feminist standpoint with sufficient precision that these claims are empirically testable. Solomon (2009) suggests that the achievement of a feminist standpoint involves characteristics empirically associated with creative thinking. Ruetsche (2004) suggests that it could involve Aristotelian second-nature capacities to recognize certain kinds of evidence—for example, social interactions among primates—relevant for understanding primate social organization. Other standpoint theorists stress the cognitive advantages of a feminist standpoint for revealing and uncovering phenomena in domains of interest to feminists. Rolin (2009) points to the superior capacity of a feminist standpoint to reveal how power relations obscure their operations and effects, and enable inquirers to overcome these obstacles to understanding by empowering those subordinated by power relations. Scientists who have investigated the causes of women’s underrepresentation in the sciences from a feminist standpoint have produced more empirically adequate theories, using more normatively adequate conceptions of bias and discrimination, than nonfeminist researchers (Rolin 2006, Wylie 2009).
Feminist postmodernism. Haraway (1989) stands out among feminist postmodernists for the tributes she pays to the achievements of feminist scientists working within empiricist standards of evaluation. Fraser and Nicholson (1990) urge a reformulation of the lessons of postmodernism toward pragmatism, fallibilism, and contextualization of knowledge claims—all features compatible with naturalized feminist empiricism.
Feminist empiricism. While early feminist science criticism by working scientists may have presupposed a naive version of empiricism, feminist empiricists today stress the pervasiveness of situated knowledge, the interplay of facts and values, the absence of transcendent standpoints, and the plurality of theories. These themes converge with postmodernism. After thirty years of development, it is also getting harder to identify points of disagreement between feminist empiricism and feminist standpoint theory. Intemann (2010, 2016) proposes feminist standpoint empiricism as a synthesis of the two theories, arguing that feminist empiricists should accept standpoint theory’s claim that better (i.e., feminist) values produce better theories. Feminist empiricists have already done so, as long as these claims are kept contingent and local (Anderson 2004, Wylie and Nelson 2007). Some feminist standpoint theorists, however, also claim that exclusion of sexist standpoints, or bad values, can be epistemically justified (Intemann 2010, Hicks 2011).
6. Feminist Science Criticism and Feminist Science
The history of feminist interventions into most disciplines follows a common pattern. Feminist science critics begin by criticizing accepted disciplinary methods, assumptions, and theories, exposing their androcentric and sexist biases. As feminist inquiries mature, they develop constructive projects, and deploy feminist perspectives as epistemic resources. This history helps us see how feminist epistemology negotiates the tension between the two poles in the paradox of bias in feminist empiricism—viewing bias as error, and as resource.
Feminist Science Criticism: Bias as Error. Feminist science criticism originated in the critiques that working biologists, psychologists, and other scientists made of the androcentric and sexist biases and practices in their own disciplines—especially of theories about women and gender differences that legitimate sexist practices. Exemplary works in this tradition include Bleier (1984), Hrdy (1981), Leacock (1981), Sherif (1987), and Tavris (1992). Feminist science criticism includes several types of research. (1) Studies of how the marginalization of women scientists impairs scientific progress (e.g., Keller 1983). (2) Studies of how applications of science in technology disadvantage women and other vulnerable groups and devalue their interests (e.g., Perez 2019). (3) Studies of how science has ignored women and gender, and how tending to these issues may require revisions of accepted theories (e.g., Hays-Gilpin and Whitley (1998). (4) Studies of how biases toward working with “masculine” cognitive styles—for example, toward centralized, hierarchical control models of causation as opposed to “feminine” (contextual, interactive, diffused) models—have impaired scientific understanding(e.g., Keller 1985b, Spanier 1995). (5) Studies of how research into sex differences that reinforces sex stereotypes and sexist practices fails to follow standards of good science (Fine 2010, Lloyd 2006, Tavris 1992). Theories may also manifest gender bias in their conceptual framework—for example, in representing subjective gender identification as a dichotomous variable, thereby eliminating other modes of gender identity from consideration (Bem 1993). In these cases, gender bias is represented as a cause of error. As philosophers and historians of science joined feminist science criticism, additional models of gender bias were developed (Bluhm 2013; Haraway 1989; Harding 1986, 1991, 1993, 1998; Lloyd 2006; Meynell 2012; Schiebinger 1989; Wylie 1996). Some of this work argues that interests in technological control that underlie modern science limit its scope and what it takes to be significant knowledge (Lacey 1999, Merchant 1980, Tiles 1987). Feminist science criticism in the bias-as-error tradition generates methodological principles for engaging in nonsexist science (Eichler 1988).
Bias in a research program is shown to be limiting or partial, but not erroneous, if it avoids clear error and has some empirical successes, while rival theories in the same domain also avoid clear error and have different empirical successes or other epistemic virtues. Such biases are legitimate: it is rationally acceptable to conduct scientific inquiry under their influence. When biases are partial but not erroneous, they serve a generative function, producing new concepts, methods, and hypotheses that open up new aspects of the world for understanding. They are epistemic resources. Feminist philosophers of science argue that we have an epistemic interest in ensuring that certain limiting biases do not dominate research to the exclusion of other generative biases that yield rival theories possessing a different range of important empirical successes. Exposing androcentric and sexist biases lying behind certain theories makes salient the room for alternative programs not based on such biases.
Feminist Science: Bias as Resource. Most advocates of feminist science argue, in this vein, that scientific inquiries informed by feminist values are based on legitimate, generative limiting biases. This picture of science is pluralistic: science is disunified because the world is rich with a multitude of cross-cutting structures, which no single theoretical vocabulary captures. Different communities have interests in different aspects of reality, so leaving them free to follow their interests will reveal different patterns and structures in the world (Harding 1998; Longino 2001).
Against this pluralistic view, some advocates of feminist science define it in terms of adherence to specific ontologies and methodologies expressing a “feminine” cognitive style (Duran 1991, Keller 1983, 1985a). On this view, for example, feminist science should have a relational rather than an atomistic ontology, favor the concrete over the abstract, and encompass intuition, emotional engagement, and other “feminine” cognitive styles. For example, Stanley and Wise (1983) argue that only qualitative methods that accept women’s reports of their experiences in their own terms, refusing to generalize, uphold feminist values of respecting differences among women and avoiding the replication of power differences between researchers and research subjects.
Pluralist feminist scientists and philosophers of science contest these attempts to define feminist science in terms of preferred content and “feminine” method. Many questions of interest to feminists are best answered with quantitative methods (Jayaratne & Stewart, 1991). Feminists properly make use of diverse methods (Harding 1987, Nielsen 1990, Reinharz 1992). Feminist science is not defined by its content, but rather by pragmatic interests in uncovering the causes of women’s oppression, revealing dynamics of gender in society, and producing knowledge that women can use to overcome the disadvantages to which they are subject. Forms of knowledge that simply valorize the “feminine” may not be helpful to women who would be better off not having norms of femininity imposed on them, and might not be better at generating empirical success (Longino 1989).
On the pluralist view, feminist science amounts to “doing science as a feminist”—using science to answer questions generated by feminist interests—. There is no presumption that certain methods, evidence, etc. are uniquely available to serve feminist cognitive interests. Nevertheless, some common threads in doing science as a feminist tend to contingently favor certain types of representation (Longino 1994). Gender bias may reinforce sexism through the perpetuation of categorical, dichotomous thinking which represents masculinity and femininity as “opposites,” femininity as inferiority, and gender nonconformity as deviant. This gives feminists an interest in the value of “ontological heterogeneity”—using categories that permit the observation of within-group variation, and that resist the representation of difference from the group mean as deviance. Gender bias also reinforces sexism through single-factor causal models that attribute intrinsic powers to men by neglecting their wider context. The value of “complexity of relationship” favors the development of causal models that facilitate the representation of features of the social context that support male power. Other feminist cognitive values involve the accessibility of knowledge, that diffuses power in being usable to people in subordinate positions. Such feminist cognitive values do not displace or compete with tending to evidence, because doing science as a feminist, like doing science with any other interest in mind (for example, medical or military interests) involves commitment to the cognitive value of producing empirically adequate theories.
7. Feminist Defenses of Value-Laden Inquiry
The Challenge of Value-Neutrality. Against the project of feminist science, many philosophers hold that good science is neutral among social, moral, and political values. Lacey (1999) distinguishes the following claims of value-neutrality: (1) Autonomy: science progresses best when uninfluenced by social/political movements and values. (2) Neutrality: scientific theories do not imply or presuppose judgments about noncognitive values, nor do scientific theories serve any particular noncognitive values more fully than others. (3) Impartiality: The only grounds for accepting a theory are its relations to the evidence. These grounds are impartial among rival noncognitive values.
Of these claims, neutrality is the most dubious, because it depicts the grounds for accepting social, political and moral values as detached from evidence about human potentialities and about what happens when people try to realize these values in practice. If this were true, then the defenders of keeping mathematics a male preserve would not have bothered arguing that women were not intellectually capable of doing mathematics—and feminists would not have bothered disputing this claim. Neutrality is less a claim about the character of science than about the purportedly “fact-free” justification of social and political values. As a claim about the latter, it is false (Anderson 2004, Taylor 1985, Tiles & Oberdiek 1995).
The core claim of value-neutrality is impartiality. Only facts can supply the warrant for other facts. Autonomy, in turn, is defended as a means to ensure impartiality. Social movements are thought to threaten impartiality because their influence on science is thought to consist in pressuring scientists to ignore the facts and validate their worldviews. Defenders of value-neutral science object to the idea of feminist science because they view it as threatening autonomy, and thereby impartiality.
The Basic Underdetermination Argument. Feminist empiricists reply to this challenge by extending Quine’s argument that theory is underdetermined by evidence (Longino 1990, Nelson 1993). Any body of observations counts as evidence for particular hypotheses only in conjunction with certain background assumptions. Vary the background assumptions, and the same observations will support different hypotheses. For example, the failure to observe stellar parallax in the 16th century was taken as evidence that the Earth stands still by geocentrists, and as evidence that the stars are very far away by heliocentrists. No logical principle stops scientists from choosing different background assumptions. In practice, scientists face constraints in selecting background assumptions, based on cognitive values such as simplicity and conservatism (resistance to revising assumptions on which many other beliefs depend). But with respect to open questions, such cognitive values rarely limit the scope for choice down to one option, and their interpretation and weights are contestable in any event (geocentrism was overturned by overriding conservatism). Feminist empiricists conclude that, given the scope for choice in background assumptions, no methodological principle forbids scientists from selecting their background assumptions on account of their fit with social and political values. Hence, feminist scientists may select their background assumptions on account of their fit with feminist values.
Standing alone, the underdetermination argument does not help us discriminate error-generating biases from biases that serve as cognitive resources. Additional criteria are needed. Anderson (2004) argues that the chief danger of value-laden inquiry is wishful thinking or dogmatism (Anderson 2004). To avoid this danger, the value-laden character of the background assumptions linking evidence to theories should not foreclose the possibility of discovering that one’s values are mistaken, because (for example) they are based on false beliefs about human potentialities or the consequences of putting certain values into practice. If women really can’t do math, the values incorporated into feminist science should not close off this possibility in advance. Although, in setting out to test this sexist hypotheses, women scientists presuppose their own mathematical competence, this does not preclude their discovering otherwise. To avoid dogmatism and wishful thinking, they need only make their calculations accountable to public criticism.
The Basic Pragmatic Strategy. The above reflections provide a standard for determining when socially value-laden inquiry has gone wrong. But how can social values function as an epistemic resource? Some feminist epistemologists stress the pragmatic functions of inquiry (Anderson 1995b). All inquiry begins with a question. Questions may be motivated by practical interests in understanding the nature and causes of situations judged to be problematic, and in finding out how to improve those situations. Defenders of the value-neutrality of science acknowledge that pragmatic factors legitimately influence the choice of objects of study. Feminist epistemologists argue that practical interests properly shape the product of inquiry by introducing new dimensions of evaluation to theories. We can ask not only whether theories are backed by evidence, but whether they are cast in forms that are cognitively accessible to the situated knowers who want to use these theories, whether they help these knowers solve their problems, and whether they answer the questions they were designed to answer. A set of statements can be true, yet fail these pragmatic tests. The basic pragmatic strategy for defending feminist science, and any inquiry shaped by social and political values, is to show how the pragmatic interests of that inquiry license or require a particular mode of influence of values on the process, product, and uptake of the product of inquiry, while leaving appropriate room for evidence to play its role in testing hypotheses. Values do not compete with evidence in determining conclusions, but play different, cooperative roles in properly conducted inquiry (Anderson 1995b, 2004).
Types of Legitimate Influence of Social Values in Science. Feminist philosophers of science stress the variety of roles for social and political values in science, and the contingency of their effects (Wylie and Nelson 2007). We must examine how particular values operate in particular scientific investigations and judge whether they are closing off the possibility of discovering unwelcome facts, leading scientists to reason dogmatically, or insulating their findings from critical scrutiny—or rather whether the values are enabling new discoveries. Feminist epistemologists and philosophers of science have defended the following types of influence of social values on theory choice.
Selection and weighting of cognitive values. Kuhn (1977) argued that scientists need to appeal to cognitive values to take up the slack between theory and evidence. His list of cognitive values includes accuracy, scope, simplicity, fruitfulness, internal consistency, and consistency with other beliefs (conservatism). Longino (1994) argues that feminists have reason to prefer theories that manifest other cognitive values, such as diffusion of power. Diffusion of power, like simplicity, is not a truth-oriented cognitive value. Both count as cognitive values because they make theories cognitively accessible. Diffusion of power recognizes that cognitive accessibility is relative to the situation of the knower. Both simplification and diffusion of power stand in tension with truth, in that theories that embody them not only ignore many complex truths, but may even make false claims. Whether this is bad depends on whether the truths ignored or the inaccuracies allowed are important. This can be judged only relative to the interests that the investigation ought to serve. All legitimate research programs must seek empirical adequacy, which requires that theories account for observations. How much accuracy this requires depends on how much the expected usefulness of the knowledge will be compromised by larger risks or margins of error. The situation and pragmatic interests of the inquirer or of the users of a theory may therefore legitimately affect the selection and weighting of cognitive values in theory choice.
Standards of Proof. The argument from inductive risk holds that theories should be accepted or rejected depending on the relative costs of type I error (believing something false) and type II error (failing to believe something true). In medicine, clinical trials are routinely stopped and results accepted as genuine notwithstanding higher P-values than the conventional <5%, if the results are dramatic enough and the costs to patients of not acting on them are high enough. Hare-Mustin and Maracek (1994) argue, by parallel reasoning, that whether studies that find gender differences, or that fail to find them, should be accepted depends on the relative costs of Alpha Bias (exaggerating differences) and Beta Bias (neglecting differences) in the context at hand.
Classification. The ways phenomena are classified may legitimately depend on social values. In medicine, the distinction between health and disease reflects both causal judgments and ethical judgments about human welfare and appropriate ways of dealing with problems. A condition judged bad for human beings is not classified as a disease unless medical intervention is considered an appropriate and potentially effective way to deal with it. Feminist inquiries, too, raise questions about the causes of women’s oppression that require classifying phenomena as instances of rape, sexual objectification, sex discrimination, and so forth—classifications tied to their meeting both empirical and evaluative criteria (Anderson 1995a, 1995b). In general, when inquiry seeks to answer a question about value-laden phenomena, such as the impact of certain practices on human welfare, or whether certain institutions are fair or discriminatory, the contours of the empirical phenomena to be studied will be defined by evaluative judgments (Intemann 2001, 2005).
Methods. The methods selected for investigating phenomena depend on the questions one asks and the kinds of knowledge one seeks, both of which may reflect social interests. Experimental methods in social science may be good for discovering factors that can be used to control people’s behavior in similar settings. But to grasp their behavior as action—that is, as attempts by agents to govern their behavior through their understandings of what they are doing—requires different empirical methods, including participant observation and qualitative interviews (which allow subjects to delineate their own systems of meaning). Standpoint theories, as critical theories, seek to empower the subjects of study by helping them forge liberatory self-understandings. These may require different methods of inquiry—for example, consciousness-raising (MacKinnon 1989).
Causal Explanations; Models; Explanations of Meaning; Narratives. The number of factors that affect the occurrence of most human phenomena is too large to comprehend or test in a single model. Investigators must therefore select a subset of causal factors to include in their models. This selection may be based on fit with the values and interests of the investigator (Longino 1990, 2001). These interests often reflect background social and moral judgments of blame, responsibility, and acceptability of change. Conservatives are more likely to study divorce and out-of-wedlock birth as causes of women’s poverty, whereas feminists are more likely to focus on other causes—for example, the exclusion of women from better-paid jobs, failures of state support for dependent-care work within the family, the weak bargaining power of women in marriage, and norms of masculinity that lead fathers to avoid significant participation in child-rearing. These causal explanations are not incompatible. Normative interests may also determine whether one models only main effects or also interaction effects on outcomes relevant to human welfare. A variable—say, a certain lifestyle—that has a positive main effect on a population may have a negative effect on some subpopulations. Whether one models and tests for such effects may depend on whether one believes that one lifestyle does or should fit all, or whether one values pluralism and ontological heterogeneity (Anderson 2004).
Often inquirers seek not merely a set of facts, but what the facts mean. The meaning or significance of facts depends on their relations to other facts. Even if two inquirers agree on the causal facts, they may still disagree about their meaning because they relate the facts in different ways, reflecting their background values. Feminists may agree with conservatives that divorce is a cause of the feminization of poverty, but deny that this means that women are better off married. They argue that marriage itself, with its gendered division of domestic and market labor, constitutes one of the major structural disadvantages women face, setting them up for worse outcomes in the event of divorce. Conservatives, viewing marriage as an indispensable condition of the good life, are no more willing to view marriage in this light than most people would be willing to blame oxygen for the occurrence of house fires. It might be thought that scientists should stick to the facts and avoid judgments of meaning. But most of the questions we ask demand answers that fit facts into larger, meaningful patterns. Scientists therefore cannot help but tell stories, which require the selection of narrative frameworks that go beyond the facts (Haraway 1989). This selection may depend both on their fit with the facts and on their fit with the background values of the storyteller.
Framework Assumptions. As we ascend to higher levels of abstraction, general framework assumptions constitute the object of study. Some of these are disciplinary. Economics studies humans as self-interested, instrumentally rational choosers. Social psychology studies humans as responding to socially meaningful situations. Behavioral genetics studies human conduct as influenced by their genes. The selection of framework assumptions may depend on their fit with the interests of the inquirer (Longino 1990, Tiles 1987). Feminists, being interested in promoting women’s agency, tend to prefer frameworks that permit the representation of women as agents. This does not guarantee that empirical findings will confirm the background assumption that women’s agency is critical to the phenomena under investigation. The value-laden selection of framework assumptions thus need not lead to a vicious circle of reasoning, because it is still left up to the evidence to determine how successful the assumptions are in explaining the phenomena of interest.
Pluralism and naturalized moral epistemology as upshots of value-laden inquiry. Because inquirers select background assumptions in part for their fit with their varied interests and values, their background assumptions will also vary. Feminist epistemologists urge us to embrace this fact (Haraway 1991, Harding 1998, Longino 2001). Pluralism of theories and research programs should be accepted as a normal feature of science. As long as the different research programs are producing empirical successes not produced by the others, and avoiding clear error and viciously circular or dogmatic reasoning, we should treat the value-biases animating them as epistemic resources, helping us discover and understand new aspects of the world and see them in new perspectives. Feminist science takes its place as one set of legitimate research programs among others. This does not imply relativism. Value-laden research programs are still open to internal and external critique. A naturalized epistemology that rejects neutrality allows that observations may undermine any background assumptions, including value judgments (Anderson 2004).
One way to support this last claim is to advance Quinean holism, and insist that any evidence may bear on any belief or value (Nelson 1990). While accepting the bi-directional influence of facts and values, Anderson (2004) rejects holism, arguing that some observations bear closer relevance relations than others to specific values. Further progress in understanding legitimate and fruitful interactions of facts and values in scientific inquiry will likely involve naturalizing moral epistemology, to get a clearer view of the bearing of observations on values. Tobin and Jaggar (2013) offer one way to naturalize feminist moral epistemology.
8. Feminist Critiques and Conceptions of Objectivity
Feminist Critiques of Objectivity. Feminists regard the following conceptions of objectivity as problematic: (a) Subject/object dichotomy: what is really (“objectively”) real exists independently of knowers. (b) Aperspectivity: “objective” knowledge is ascertained through “the view from nowhere,” a view that transcends or abstracts from our particular locations. (c) Detachment: knowers have an “objective” stance toward what is known when they are emotionally detached from it. (d) Value-neutrality: knowers have an “objective” stance toward what is known when they adopt an evaluatively neutral attitude toward it. (e) Control: “objective” knowledge of an object (the way it “really” is) is attained by controlling it, especially by experimental manipulation, and observing the regularities it manifests under control. (f) External guidance: “objective” knowledge consists of representations whose content is dictated by the way things really are, not by the knower. These ideas are often combined into a package of claims about science: that its aim is to know the way things are, independent of knowers, and that scientists achieve this aim through detachment and control, which enable them to achieve aperspectivity and external guidance. This package arose in the 17th-18th centuries, as a philosophical account of why Newtonian science was superior to its predecessor. According to this account, the predecessor science, which represented objects as intrinsically possessing secondary qualities and ends, confused the way things are in themselves with the ways they are related to emotionally engaged human knowers, who erroneously projected their own mental states and value judgments onto things. Adoption of the objective methods listed above enabled the successor scientists to avoid these errors and achieve an “absolute” conception of the universe (Williams 1978). Feminists object to each element in this package as a normative ideal and as a general description of how science works.
Subject/object dichotomy. If the object of science is to grasp things as they are, independent of knowers, then one must sharply distinguish the knower from the known. However, when the objects of inquiry are knowers themselves, this dichotomy rules out the possibility that knowers’ self-understandings help constitute the ways knowers are. It thus rules out the possibility that some of our characteristics are socially constructed. This may lead people to make the projective errors objectivity is supposed to avoid: attributing to the natures of the objects of study what are products of people’s contingent beliefs and attitudes about those objects (Haslanger 1995).
Aperspectivity. The ideal of aperspectivity supposes that if one views things from no particular position, without any presuppositions or biases, then the only thing that guides belief-formation is the object itself (external guidance). Feminists question the intelligibility of a “view from nowhere,” and a presuppositionless, bias-free science, for both postmodernist (Haraway 1991) and pragmatist (Antony 1993) reasons. Knowers are situated. The underdetermination of theories by evidence implies that biases are needed to get theorizing off the ground. Rather than undertake a futile attempt to inquire without biases, we should empirically study which biases are fruitful and which mislead, and reform scientific practice accordingly (Antony 1993). Some feminist critics also argue that the practice of objectivity—assuming that observed regularities reflect the intrinsic natures of things, and treating those things accordingly—when adopted by those in power, produces the very regularities taken to vindicate that assumption. When male observers use their power to make women behave in accordance with their desires (for instance, to elicit female submission to their aggressive sexual advances), but assume their own aperspectivity, they misattribute the behavior to women’s intrinsic natures (feminine passivity) rather than to their own socially positioned power. This process constitutes the “objectification” of women. It harms women by legitimating the sexist practices that reinforce the projection. It misrepresents observed regularities as necessary, rather than socially contingent, as well as their cause (as generated by the intrinsic nature of the things observed, rather than by the observer’s own stance toward what is observed.) (MacKinnon 1999, Haslanger 1993).
Detachment. The ideal of detachment, according to which scientists should adopt an emotionally distanced, controlling stance toward their objects of study, is defended as necessary to avoid projective error. Keller suggests that it is responsible for the symbolically “masculine” standing of science that marginalizes women scientists, who are stereotyped as emotional. It reflects an androcentric perspective, serving men’s neurotic anxieties about avoiding the “feminine” (Keller 1985a, Bordo 1987). Emotional distance may also have epistemic defects. A “feeling for the [individual] organism” may sensitize a scientist to critical data (Keller 1983, Ruetsche 2004).
Value-neutrality. The ideal of objectivity as value-neutrality is justified as a psychological stance needed to guard against temptations toward wishful thinking and dogmatic, politically motivated or ideological reasoning. Feminists argue that this ideal is self-deceptive and unrealistic (Potter 1993; Longino 1990, 2001; Harding 1991, 1998; Wylie 1996). When scientists represent themselves as neutral, this blocks their recognition of the ways their values have shaped their inquiry, and thereby evades critical scrutiny of these values. Value-neutrality ignores the many positive roles value judgments play in guiding the process and products of inquiry noted above. Other procedures are available to block wishful thinking and political dogmatism on science, without requiring scientists to bracket their value judgments (Anderson 1995, 2004, Longino 2001).
Control. Experimental contexts, in which scientists elicit regularities in the behavior of the objects of study by manipulating them under controlled conditions, are often taken to generate epistemically privileged evidence about the objects of study. Such evidence is thought to ground knowledge of how the objects “really are,” in contrast with evidence about the objects of study generated through “subjective” methods, such as participant observation, dialogue, political engagement, and caring for their needs. Feminists argue that control is a stance of social, often male, power. The epistemic privilege it enjoys reflects both androcentrism and the prestige attached to the “masculine” (Merchant 1980). The control ideal underrates the epistemic value of experiences gained from loving or cooperative engagement with the objects of study. Theories produced by control generate only a partial view of the potentialities of the objects of study, reflecting and serving interests in control over the objects, but not interests in engaging with the objects in other ways, or in enabling the objects of study, if human, to govern themselves (Tiles 1987).
External guidance. External guidance assumes that to achieve knowledge of the way things “objectively” are, one’s beliefs must be guided by the nature of the object, not by the biases of the knower. Feminists argue that the underdetermination of theories by evidence entails that theories cannot be purely externally guided. Inquirers must make numerous choices concerning how to represent the object of knowledge, how to interpret evidence, and how to represent the conclusions drawn (Anderson 2004, Longino 1990, Nelson 1990). The pretense that sound scientific theories are the products of purely external guidance obscures the forces shaping these choices and absolves scientists from responsibility for defending them. For example, feminists have paid particular attention to the ways metaphors and narrative genres constrain scientific explanations (Haraway 1989, 1991, Martin 1996). The decision to narrate the transition from ape to hominid as a heroic drama dictates a focus on presumptively male activities, such as hunting, as the engine of evolution, obscuring alternatives equally supported by the data, that focus on presumptively female activity (balancing child care needs with gathering) or on behaviors, such as language use, shared by both males and females (Haraway 1989, Longino 1990).
These feminist criticisms of different conceptions of objectivity share common themes. The problematic conceptions of objectivity generate partial accounts of the world, which they misrepresent as complete and universal. The forms of partiality they underwrite are either androcentric, symbolized as “masculine,” or serve male or other dominant group interests. They are justified by appealing to models of cognition that represent error and bias in terms of qualities gender symbolized as “feminine” and attributed to women. Such conceptions of objectivity, in recommending avoidance of the “feminine,” exclude women from participation in inquiry or deprive them of epistemic authority. The problematic conceptions of objectivity ignore the knowledge-enhancing, epistemically fruitful uses of purportedly “feminine” approaches to theorizing. In attempting to transcend their situatedness, inquirers following these ideals of objectivity only mask it, commit the projective errors they seek to avoid, and resist correction.
Feminist Conceptions of Objectivity. Feminist conceptions of objectivity tend to be procedural. Products of inquiry are more objective, the better they are supported by objective procedures. Some influential feminist conceptions of objectivity include the following:
Feminist/nonsexist research methods. Some feminists have offered methodological guidelines for avoiding the sexist and androcentric errors and biases that feminists have identified in mainstream science (Eichler 1988). More ambitiously, feminists have sought research methods that embody feminist values (Nielsen 1990, Reinharz 1992).
Emotional engagement. Some feminist theorists defend the epistemic fruitfulness of emotional engagement with the object of study. Emotions serve epistemic functions in normative inquiry, attuning observers to evaluatively relevant features of the world (Jaggar 1989, Little 1995, Anderson 2004). In social scientific inquiry, emotional engagement with the subjects of study may be necessary both to elicit and interpret behaviors of scientific interest. Ethnographers may need to win the trust of their subjects to get them to open up, and to achieve rapport with them to gain understanding. Keller (1985a) promotes an ideal of “dynamic objectivity,” by which loving attention toward the object enhances perception of it. However, Longino (1993b) questions whether this ideal is generally epistemically superior to other modes of engagement.
Reflexivity. Harding (1993) argues that the objectivity is advanced by reflexivity, which demands that inquirers place themselves on the same causal plane as the object of knowledge. They must make explicit their situatedness and how that shaped their inquiry. Reflexivity affirms the partiality of representations without denying their claim to truth. Inclusion of marginalized groups into inquiry improves reflexivity, because the marginalized are more likely to notice and contest features of accepted representations that reflect the perspectives of the dominant. Harding’s ideal of “strong objectivity” includes both reflexivity and democratic inclusion as key features of more objective processes of inquiry.
Democratic discussion. Longino (1990, 2001) advances a conception of objectivity based on democratic discussion. Knowledge production is a social enterprise, secured through the critical and cooperative interactions of inquirers. The products of this social enterprise are more objective, the more responsive they are to criticism from all points of view. Feminists build on a tradition including Mill, Popper, and Feyerabend (Lloyd 1997a) by offering (i) a more articulate conception of “all points of view,” stressing the influence of the social positions of inquirers on their theorizing; and (ii) a greater stress on the importance of equality among inquirers. In Longino’s account, a community of inquirers is objective if it: (1) offers public venues for the criticism of knowledge claims; (2) responds to criticisms by changing its theories according to (3) publicly recognized standards of evaluation; and (4) follows a norm of equality of intellectual authority among its members. The norm of equality has been refined to distinguish legitimate differences of expertise from illegitimate exercises of social power (Longino 2001).
Pluralist Themes in Feminist Conceptions of Objectivity. Most feminist conceptions of objectivity accommodate both methodological and theoretical pluralism. Different communities of inquiry take an interest in different aspects of the world, and develop partial theories to satisfy varied epistemic and pragmatic values. Most feminists resist the thought that these varied theories must eventually be unified into a single grand theory. As long as different communities of inquiry are producing empirical successes in accordance with publicly recognized standards, while holding themselves accountable to criticism from all sides, their products may each count as objective, however irreducibly plural the content of their theories may be (Longino 2001, Harding 1991, 1998). However, Intemann (2010) questions the value of unlimited pluralism. If sexist and racist values have been found to be unjustified after sustained inquiry, then scientific theories informed by these values need not be taken seriously.
9. Epistemic Authority, Epistemic Injustice, Epistemologies of Ignorance, and Virtue Epistemology
Naturalized epistemology considers the effects of our pervasive epistemic interdependence (Nelson 1990). Because inquiry is collaborative and reliant on testimony, what we believe is influenced by who we believe. Who we believe depends on attributions of epistemic authority, which rely on views about people’s expertise, epistemic responsibility, and trustworthiness. Feminist epistemologists explore how gender and other hierarchical social relations influence attributions of epistemic authority, considering their impact on (1) general models of knowledge; (2) the epistemic standing of knowers; (3) whose claims various epistemic communities do and ought to accept; and (4) how this affects the distribution of knowledge and ignorance in society. Some of these effects amount to epistemic injustice against members of subordinated groups. Some feminist epistemologists have advanced conceptions of virtue epistemology to remedy epistemic injustice and ignorance.
Epistemic Authority and General Models of Knowledge. Gendered ideas about epistemic authority can distort our general models of knowledge. Code (1991) argues that contemporary analytic epistemology’s core model of propositional knowledge implicitly presupposes a male knower. The instances of knowledge analytic epistemology takes to be paradigmatic when it analyzes the formula “S knows that P” are propositions about readily observable mind-independent objects. To take these as the paradigmatic instances of knowledge invites a model of the knower as masculine, in adopting the symbolically masculine objectivity package described above. This implicitly denies epistemic authority to women. Code argues that knowledge of other persons rather than of propositions should be taken as a primary model of knowledge. Such second-person knowledge calls the implicit masculinity of knowers into question, since getting to know others typically requires intimacy, dialogue, empathy and other characteristics gender symbolized as “feminine.”
Recent epistemology’s focus on the indispensability of testimony to inquiry has led feminist epistemologists to take Code’s ideas in a different direction, by investigating the dependence of propositional knowledge on knowledge of persons. For example, anthropologists must cultivate personal relationships of trust with native informants to gain access to the natives’ situated knowledge of their cultures. This requires reflection on the ways differences in power, interest, and social situation between anthropologists and their informants influence testimony its interpretation. Feminist epistemologists question models of testimony as transparent and unidirectional, highlighting testimony’s dialogic, strategic, and empathetic features, as well as the importance and difficulty of cultivating epistemically fruitful relations of mutual trust across differences in power (Bergin 2002; Lugones 1987).
Epistemic Injustice. Other feminist epistemologists focus on the impact of gender and other hierarchical relations on attributions of epistemic authority. Dominant groups tend to accord epistemic authority to themselves and withhold it from subordinates by constructing stigmatizing stereotypes of subordinates as incompetent or dishonest. They promote, as markers of epistemic authority, characteristics stereotypically thought to be distinctively theirs (Addelson 1983; Shapin 1994). They hoard opportunities for gaining access to these markers—for instance, by denying subordinate groups access to higher education. Such practices commit epistemic injustice against members of subordinate groups, undermining their ability to participate in collaborative inquiry. Fricker (2007) calls this “testimonial injustice.” In the core case of testimonial injustice, people discount the credibility of what others say on account of prejudice against their social group. Dotson (2011) distinguishes two kinds of testimonial injustice, silencing and smothering. Silencing follows Fricker’s model, whereas smothering is a kind of self-censorship to protect oneself or one’s group from prejudicial misunderstanding. For example, women of color victimized by domestic violence might not to testify to whites about this, to avoid reinforcing white prejudice against black men. Hookway (2010) identifies epistemic injustice in practices that exclude people from participating in inquiry in non-testimonial ways, such as asking questions, suggesting hypotheses, raising objections, and drawing analogies. When others fail to take such contributions seriously out of prejudicial stereotyping of the contributor, this injustice injures the speaker not as a knower but as an inquirer.
Hermeneutical injustice occurs when the interpretive resources available to a community render a person’s experiences unintelligible or misunderstood, due to the epistemic marginalization of that person or members of her social group from participation in practices of meaning-making (Fricker 2007). An example of hermeneutical injustice is the dismissal of women as humorless or hypersensitive for getting upset at what was seen as mere cloddish courtship or joking, before the concept of sexual harassment was available to make sense of their experiences. This was an injustice because the victims of harassment were prejudicially denied effective access to the practices of meaning-making whereby they could have made their experiences intelligible to others. Mason (2011) argues that marginalized communities may have hermeneutical resources in which their oppression is understood as such, but still suffer hermeneutical injustice if the dominant community fails to take up these resources by according epistemic authority to the marginalized. Pohlhaus (2011) argues that such ignorance can be willful, leading to contributory injustice, an intentional maintenance of inadequate hermeneutical resources that harmfully obstructs the uptake of resources the oppressed have developed to make sense of their experience (Dotson 2012).
Epistemologies of Ignorance. Ignorance, like knowledge, has systematic patterns and social-structural causes (Pohlhaus 2011, Proctor & Schiebinger 2008, Sullivan & Tuana 2007, Tuana & Sullivan 2006). Injustice in according people status as knowers and inquirers generates systematic ignorance that damages the interests of subordinated groups. Society could have access to, but forget or suppress, knowledge useful to subordinated groups—for example, about plants that are effective abortifactants (Schiebinger 2007). Since accurate information on such matters is or was available, explanation is needed for why it is forgotten. Ignorance is sometimes due to to segregation of situated knowers, preventing knowledge or understandings held by subordinate groups from disseminating (Margonis 2007). Members of subordinated groups may have strategic interests in hiding knowledge about themselves from dominant groups (Bailey 2007). Most importantly, dominant groups have interests in avoiding the truth about their own injustices (Mills 2007).
Virtue epistemology. Some feminist epistemologists advance ideals of epistemic virtue to address epistemic injustice. Fricker (2007) argues that to correct for testimonial injustice, hearers need to cultivate the virtue of epistemic justice—a disposition, rooted in one’s testimonial sensibility or second-nature perception of others’ credibility, to neutralize the effects of prejudicial stereotypes on credibility judgments. Jones (2002) proposes rules for checking such biases when confronted with surprising testimony. These include undertaking independent assessments of the credibility of the witness and the plausibility of what they say; and letting the presumption against accepting astonishing testimony be rebutted when one has good reason to distrust one’s distrust of the witness. Alcoff (2010) suggests that correcting for testimonial injustice requires adopting standpoint epistemology: one must not merely neutralize prejudice, but accord epistemic privilege to the marginalized. Kwong (2015) stresses the virtue of open-mindedness, and Daukas (2011) of trustworthiness, while Sholock (2012) explores the importance of the dominant being disposed to acknowledge their own ignorance of the situated knowledge of the oppressed, so that they seek the latter’s testimony, and extend epistemic authority to them. A key theme of feminist virtue epistemology is its aspiration to cultivate dispositions that enable inquirers to produce knowledge that can overcome oppression (Daukas 2018).
Some theorists have questioned suggestions to remedy epistemic injustice with individual virtues. We must share responsibility for devising epistemic practices of resistance to epistemic injustice (Medina 2013). A structural conception of remedies does not preclude the use of virtue epistemology to address structural epistemic injustice, as long as epistemic institutions and systems can be bearers of epistemic virtue (Anderson 2012).
10. External Criticisms of Feminist Epistemology
Outside critics of feminist epistemology have argued that the entire research program is fundamentally flawed. Leading critiques of feminist epistemology include a collection of essays in the Monist, 77(4) (1994), Gross and Levitt (1994), Haack (1993), and Pinnick, Koertge and Almeder (2003). The most important criticism, found in all these works, is that feminist epistemology corrupts the search for truth by conflating facts with values and imposing political constraints on the conclusions it will accept. Truths inconvenient to a feminist perspective will be censored, and false views promoted because they support the feminist cause. Critics also accuse feminist epistemologists of a corrosive cynicism about science, claiming that they reject it as a raw imposition of patriarchal and imperialist power. Feminists are charged with holding that, since everyone else is engaged in a cynical power-play, they may as well join the battle and try to impose their beliefs on everyone else.
Defenders of feminist epistemology reply that these criticisms depend on gross misreadings of the feminist research program. Feminists do not reject objectivity and science, but rather seek to improve it by correcting sexist and androcentric biases in scientific inquiry, and by promoting criticism of research from all points of view (Lloyd 1995a, 1995b, 1997a, 1997b, Nelson 1990). Nor do they deny that science discovers truths. The complaint is rather that, as dominantly practiced, it offers a partial view of the world primarily oriented to discovering those truths that serve particular human interests in material control and maintaining current social hierarchies (Harding 1986, 1998, 1993; Tiles 1987). Feminist epistemologists observe that the democratic and egalitarian norms for cognitive authority they accept, along with their requirement that the scientific community be open and responsive to criticism from all quarters, are incompatible with censorship, and with ignoring or suppressing evidence that undermines any theory, including theories inspired by feminist values (Longino 1990, 1993a, 2001; Anderson 2004—see Other Internet Resources). Although facts and values are intertwined, attention to values does not displace or compete with regard for the evidence (Anderson 1995b).
A second charge outside critics make against feminist epistemology is that it accepts and uncritically valorizes traditional, empirically unfounded stereotypes about women’s thinking (as intuitive, holistic, emotional, etc.) (Haack 1993). Valorization of “feminine” ways of thinking may trap women in traditional gender roles and help justify patriarchy (Nanda 2003). Promotion of feminist epistemology may carve out a limited “separate sphere” for female inquirers, but one that will turn into an intellectual ghetto (Baber 1994).
Defenders of feminist epistemology reply that the critics are attacking an obsolete version of feminist epistemology that was only briefly—and even at the time, controversially—entertained when the field was launched in the 1980s (Wylie 2003, Anderson 2004—see Other Internet Resources).
Further development of external critiques of feminist epistemology awaits the critics’ engagement with the feminist epistemology’s defenders and with current developments in the field.
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Other Internet Resources
- Anderson, Elizabeth, 2004, “How Not to Criticize Feminist Epistemology: a Review of Pinnick, Koertge and Almeder, Scrutinizing Feminist Epistemology”.
- Janack, Marianne, 2004, “Feminist Epistemology,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- FEMMSS: Feminist Epistemologies, Methodologies, Metaphysics and Science Studies
- Gender, Race, and Philosophy: The Blog (includes symposia on recent work in the philosophy of race and gender)
- Gender Bias in Academe: An Annotated Bibliography of Important Recent Studies