Callicles and Thrasymachus
Callicles and Thrasymachus are the two great exemplars in philosophy of contemptuous challenge to conventional morality. Both are characters in Platonic dialogues, in the Gorgias and Book I of the Republic respectively; both denounce the virtue of justice, dikaiosunê, as an artificial brake on self-interest, a fraud to be seen through by intelligent people. Together, Thrasymachus and Callicles have fallen into the folk mythology of moral philosophy as ‘the immoralist’ (or ‘amoralist’). These are perhaps not quite the right words, but it is useful to have a label for their common challenge—more generally, for the figure who demands a good reason to abide by moral constraints, and denies, implicitly or explicitly, that this demand can be met. Because of this shared agenda, and because Socrates’ refutation of Callicles can be read as an unsatisfying rehearsal for the Republic, it is tempting to assume that the two share a single philosophical position. But in fact Callicles and Thrasymachus are by no means interchangeable; and the differences between them are important both for the interpretation of Plato and philosophically, for our understanding of the varieties of immoralism and the motivations behind it. This article discusses both the common challenge presented by these two figures and the features which separate them, treating them strictly as players in Plato’s philosophical dramas. (Thrasymachus was a real person, a famous diplomat and orator of whose real views we know only a little; of Callicles we know nothing, and he may even be Plato’s invention.) It will also compare them to a third Platonic version of the immoralist challenge, the one presented by Glaucon and Adeimantus in Republic Book II, and to the writings of sophist Antiphon—the best-known real-life counterpart of all three Platonic views, and perhaps their historical original. Certain aspects of Plato’s own arguments against immoralism will also be discussed, insofar as they help to clarify what Callicles and Thrasymachus themselves have to say.
- 1. Justice
- 2. Thrasymachus
- 3. Socrates vs. Thrasymachus
- 4. Callicles
- 5. Socrates vs. Callicles
- 6. Conclusion: Thrasymachus, Callicles, Glaucon, Antiphon
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What exactly is it that both Thrasymachus and Callicles reject? Greek handily distinguishes between ‘justice’ as a virtue [dikaiosunê] and the abstractions ‘justice’ [dikê, sometimes personified as a goddess] and ‘the just’ [or ‘what is just’, to dikaion, the neuter form of the adjective ‘just’, masc. dikaios]. The history of these concepts is complex, and it would be wrong to assume that Greek moral concepts were ever neatly defined or uncontested. Still, Hesiod’s Works and Days (c. 700 B.C.E.), a very early and canonical text for traditional Greek moral thought, provides a useful baseline for later debates. Hesiod does not define justice, but the injustices he denounces include bribery, oath-breaking, perjury, theft, fraud, and the rendering of crooked verdicts by judges. There are two kinds of underlying unity to this list, each of which relates justice to another central concept in ancient Greek ethics. First, all such actions are prohibited by nomos. This crucial term may be translated either ‘law’ or ‘convention’, depending on the context; nomoi include not only written statutes but unwritten laws and traditional, socially enforced norms of behavior. Hesiod’s just man is above all a law-abiding one, and the association of justice and nomos runs deep in Greek thought. However, nomos is also an ambiguous and open-ended concept: in the fifth century B.C.E. sophistic thinkers come to use it with the very different sense of mere convention—or, as we might now say, social construction—and this development is an important part of the background to immoralism. The second common denominator of Hesiodic injustice is that unjust actions are ones typically prompted by pleonexia, best translated ‘greed’ (see Balot 2001). The unjust man is motivated by the desire to have more [pleon echein]: more than he has, more than his neighbor has, more than he is entitled to, and, ultimately, all there is to get. These polarities of the lawful/unlawful and the restrained/greedy are later used by Aristotle to structure his discussion of justice in Nicomachean Ethics V, which is in many ways a rational reconstruction of traditional Greek thought about justice.
Hesiod also sets out the origins, authority, and rewards of justice. Here he is explicit:
The son of Kronos [i.e., Zeus] has set down this law [nomos] for human beings:
Fish and animals and winged birds
Eat each other, since there is no justice [dikê] among them.
But to humans he has given justice [dikê], which turns out the best
By far. And if one knows and is willing to proclaim what is just [ta dikaia],
Zeus far-sounding gives him wealth. (Works and Days 276–81)
Justice derives from nomos in the sense of a divinely ordained Law; and Hesiod emphasises that Zeus’ laws are enforced. Punishment may not be visited directly on the unjust individual, however: rather, a whole city suffers for the injustice of its leaders, and retribution may fall on a man’s descendants. Moreover, Hesiod seems at one point to waver, and allows that if the wicked go unpunished, we would not have good reason to be just (270–3). Doubts about the reliability of divine rewards and punishments are later an important part of the motivation for the immoralist challenge; in Republic Book II, Adeimantus complains that the poets are inconsistent on this point, and anyway the rewards and punishments they promise do not show what is good and bad about justice and injustice in themselves (362d–367e).
Hesiod represents only one side of early Greek moral thought. The other foundational poet of the Greek tradition, Homer, has less to say explicitly about justice; more important for later debates is his broader conception of aretê, which can equally well be translated ‘virtue’ or ‘excellence’. Justice is understood to be a part of aretê; or, as we would say, it is a virtue. More particularly it is the virtue governing social interactions and good citizenship or leadership. In the world of the Iliad and Odyssey, aretê is understood as that set of skills and aptitudes which enables someone—paradigmatically, a noble warrior—to function successfully in his social role. The key virtues of the Homeric warrior are courage and practical intelligence, which enable him to be an effective ‘speaker of words and doer of deeds’.
Now this ‘functional’ conception of virtue, as we may call it, can easily come into conflict with Hesiodic ideas about justice. In Plato’s Meno, Meno proposes an updated version of the functional conception: a man’s virtue consists in the political skills which enable him to harm his enemies and help his friends, without incurring harm to himself (71e). Such a view would have been at least intelligible to Homer’s warriors; but it seems to involve giving up on Hesiodic principles of justice. When acting as a judge, does the virtuous man give verdicts in accordance with the law, or does he give whatever verdicts (‘crooked’ ones by Hesiod’s standards) will harm his enemies or help his friends?
So Plato’s characters inherit a complex and not wholly coherent moral tradition. Fifth-century moral debates were powerfully shaped by the problematic relation of these ‘functional’ and ‘Hesiodic’ ideas about the virtues (see Adkins 1960); and the Gorgias and Book I of the Republic locate Callicles and Thrasymachus in just this context. In the Gorgias, Socrates’ first interlocutor is the rhetorician Gorgias, who is led into self-contradiction by his unclarity on the question of whether his profession includes the teaching and practice of justice. His student Polus repudiates Gorgias’ pretensions to justice, and claims that while it may be more admirable than injustice, injustice is more beneficial to its practitioner. Socrates shows that Polus’ position too is ultimately incoherent, and thus the stage is set for Callicles to reject justice (as conventionally understood) altogether, arguing that it is neither admirable nor beneficial. The Republic depicts a strikingly similar dialectical progression, again from age to youth and from respectability to ruthlessness. It begins with a discussion between Socrates and the elderly, decent-seeming businessman Cephalus, who offers (or at any rate assents to Socrates’ suggestion of) a markedly ‘Hesiodic’ account of justice as telling the truth and returning what one owes (331c). But Cephalus’ son Polemarchus, on ‘inheriting’ the argument, glosses returning what one owes in Meno-esque terms: justice is rendering help to one’s friends and harm to one’s enemies (332a–b). We seem to move instantly from Hesiod to a degenerate version of the ‘functional’ conception, expressive of Athenian politics in an era of brutal, almost gangster-like factional strife. Neither Cephalus nor Polemarchus seems to notice the conflict, but it runs deep: justice cannot be at the same time (1) the Hesiodic virtue of the good neighbour and solid citizen, involving obedience to law and the restraint of pleonexia, and (2) a part of aretê functionally understood, in a society in which pleonexia and factional ruthlesssness are seen as the keys to success. In sum, both the Gorgias and Book I of the Republic reveal a society in some moral disorder, vulnerable to moral conflict and instability, with generational change used to dramatize a crumbling of Hesiodic norms. In both cases the upshot, to which Socrates must respond, is a fully formed challenge to justice traditionally conceived.
Though the Gorgias was almost certainly written first of the two dialogues, Thrasymachus’ position can be seen as a kind of stepping-stone to Callicles’, so that it makes sense to begin with him. Thrasymachus’ stance on justice is foreshadowed by his behavior: he enters the discussion “like a wild beast about to spring” (336b5–6; tr. Grube-Reeve 1992 here and throughout, sometimes with minor revisions), and this tone of impatient aggression is sustained throughout his discussion with Socrates. As a professional sophist, however, Thrasymachus withholds his definition of justice until Socrates’ other interlocutors have promised to pay him for it. So from the very start, Thrasymachus is depicted as dominated by the characteristic drives of the two lower parts of the soul to be identified in Book IV: the appetitive part [epithumêtikon], which lusts after pleasure and the money to pay for it with, and the spirited part [thumos], which loves competition and victory. Though he proves quite a wily debater, Thrasymachus’ reasoning abilities are used only as a means to these other, non-rational ends; and this subjugation of rationality to non-rational ends is, as we discover in Book IV, exactly what Plato holds injustice to consist in. Thrasymachus largely disappears from the debate after Book I, but he evidently stays around for the whole of the discussion; somewhat mysteriously, in Book VI Socrates refers to Thrasymachus and himself as “just now having become friends” (498d, cf. 450a–b).)
Thrasymachus eventually proposes a resounding slogan: “Justice is nothing other than the advantage of the stronger” (338c2–3). He explains that each kind of regime makes laws in the interest of the ruling party: the mass of poor people in a democracy, the rich in an oligarchy, the tyrant in a tyranny. “And they declare what they have made—what is to their own advantage—to be just for their subjects…. This, then, is what I say justice is, the same in all cities, the advantage of the established regime” (338e–339a). Thanks to this gloss of the ‘stronger’ in terms of the ruling power, Thrasymachus’ position has often been interpreted as a form of ‘conventionalism’: justice in a given community is whatever the laws of that community dictate, i.e., so he cynically explains, whatever serves the ruling party’s interests. This conventionalist reading of Thrasymachus is probably not quite right, but it makes a convenient starting-point for seeing what he does have in mind. The conventionalist position can be seen as a more formal version of the Hesiodic association of just behavior with law-abidingness, and does not necessarily involve the cynical spin that Thrasymachus gives it: in Xenophon’s Memorabilia, Socrates himself argues that the lawful [nomimon] and the just [dikaion] are the same (IV 4). Closer to Thrasymachus in spirit is the conventionalism to be found in the surviving fragments of On Truth by the sophist Antiphon (cf. section 6). According to Antiphon, “Justice [dikaiosunê]... is not violating the rules [nomima] of the city in which one is a citizen” (tr. Gagarin and Woodruff 1995). Antiphon goes on to contrast these rules of justice, which frustrate our nature and are only erratically enforced, with the authoritative and irresistible decrees of nature [phusis]. This contrast between nomos and phusis is a central tool of sophistic thought, used by a wide range of thinkers, Callicles included (see below, Section 4), in many different ways (see Kerferd 1981, Guthrie 1971). Thrasymachus himself, however, never uses this theoretical framework (or, unless we count his concept of the ‘real ruler’, any other)—a sign, perhaps, that he is meant to represent the immoralist position in its roughest and least theoretical form, purporting to spring directly from empirical observation of how law and justice work.
To these two opening claims, ‘Justice is the advantage of the stronger’ and ‘Justice is the advantage of the ruler’, Thrasymachus adds a third, in the course of praising injustice later on: ‘Justice is the advantage of another person’ (343c). This certainly sounds like a non-conventionalist claim about the underlying nature of justice, and it greatly complicates the interpretation of his position. Thrasymachus advances all three theses willingly, indeed with great conviction, and the third seems intended as a clarification of the first two. Yet on the face of it they are far from equivalent, and it is not at all obvious which (if any) is most basic or best represents his real position. For instance, what if I am the stronger (or the ruler): is it the action to my own advantage which is just, or the one which serves the other person? Worse, if either ‘the advantage of the stronger’ or ‘the advantage of the ruler’ is taken strictly as a general definition, then the selfish behavior of a strong, rapacious tyrant would have to count as just. But it obviously does not serve the interests of the other people affected by it; and indeed Thrasymachus, in conformity to normal usage, describes the tyrant as perfectly unjust (344a–c)—and praises him for being so.
In recent decades interpretive discussion of Thrasymachus has revolved around proposed solutions to this puzzle, none of which has met with general agreement. Argument continues as to whether his three theses can be rendered consistent with each other, whether to do so requires limiting the scope of one or all of them in some way (e.g., by excluding rulers and applying only to the ruled), whether any of them should be given priority as Thrasymachus’ intended definition of justice, and if so which one. Interpreters determined to render Thrasymachus the possessor of a coherent theory of justice have worked through the philosophical possibilities here with great ingenuity and resourcefulness. However, all such readings require taking some of the things he says as less than fully or literally meant, and it is anyway not obvious that Plato intends to present him as the proponent of a consistent and rigorous definition. The obvious alternative is to read his theses as rough slogans rather than attempts at definition, and as picking out the typical effects of just behavior rather than attempting to analyse it or state its essence. So read, Thrasymachus is offering a critique of justice, understood in rather traditional terms, not a new theory or analysis of what justice is (cf. Anderson 2016 on ‘genealogy’). As his later, clarificatory rant in praise of injustice makes clear (343b–4c), he assumes the traditional Hesiodic understanding of justice, as obedience to nomos and restraint of pleonexia: his slogans are intended not to replace or revise that traditional conception but rather to offer a debunking or critique of justice so understood. (Hence his proclamation that justice is ‘nothing other’ than the advantage of the stronger: the locution is one of cynical debunking, marking his own view as a ‘seeing-through’ and demystification.) This critique is organized around two central points. One is about the effects of just behavior, namely that it benefits other people at the expense of just agents themselves (this is justice as the advantage of the other). The other is about the function of moral language: talk of ‘justice’ is an instrument of social control, a tool used by the powerful to manipulate the weak (this is justice as the advantage of the stronger, i.e. the rulers). If we take these two points together, it turns out that just persons are nothing but patsies or fools: they have internalized the moralistic propaganda of the ruling party so that they serve their interests rather than their own.
On this reading, Thrasymachus’ three theses are coherent, and unrestricted in their scope; but they are not definitions. They are exercises in social critique rather than philosophical analysis; and yet Thrasymachus’ debunking is not, and could not be, grounded purely on philosophically neutral ‘sociological’ observation. Thrasymachus is—on almost any reading – relying on a further pair of assumptions, which we can also find on display in the speeches of Callicles and of Glaucon in Book II, as well as other contemporary texts. One is that wealth and power, and the pleasures they provide, are the goods in relation to which our ‘advantage’ must be assessed. (‘Good’ [agathon] and ‘advantage’ [sumpheron] are equivalent terms in this context, and ‘happiness’ [eudaimonia] is what they produce.) The other is that these goods are zero-sum: for one member of a community to have more of them is for another to have less. That is why just behavior on my part, which involves forgoing opportunities for my own advantage out of respect for the law, inevitably serves the advantage of other people—in particular, those who are willing to ‘take advantage’ of me (as we still say), and above all the self-interested rulers who made the laws. These twin assumptions about the nature of the good also shape Thrasymachus’ conception of rationality. The rational or intelligent man for him is one who, seeing through the mystifications of moral language, acts clear-sightedly to serve himself rather than others. When Socrates asks whether, then, he holds that justice is a vice, Thrasymachus instead defines it as a kind of intellectual failure: “No, just very high-minded simplicity,” he says, while injustice is “good judgment” and is to be “included with virtue and wisdom” (348c–e).
Thrasymachus’ conception of rationality as the clear-eyed pursuit of pleonexia is most fully expressed in his idea of the ‘real ruler’. This Thrasymachean ideal emerges only under interrogation by Socrates; but it is evidently central to his thinking, and provides the framework for the arguments with Socrates which follow. Socrates begins by subjecting Thrasymachus to a classic elenchus—that is, a refutation which elicits a contradiction from the interlocutor’s own assertions or admissions (339b–340b). Thrasymachus has claimed both that (1) to do what the rulers prescribe is just, and (2) to do what is to the rulers’ advantage is just; and he readily admits that (3) rulers sometimes prescribe what is not to their advantage. It follows that (4) in some cases, it is both just and unjust to do as the rulers prescribe. On the assumption that nothing can be both just and unjust, one of claims (1)–(3) must be given up. It comes as a bit of a surprise that Thrasymachus chooses to repudiate (3), which seems to be a matter of obvious fact, rather than (1) or (2). Plato emphasises the point by having Cleitophon and Polemarchus provide color commentary on the argument, with the former charitably suggesting that Thrasymachus meant that the just is whatever the stronger decrees, thinking it is to his advantage—in effect, an amendment to (2) which would make it equivalent to (1). But this solution is vehemently rejected by Thrasymachus (340a–c). Instead, he affirms that, ‘strictly speaking’, no ruler ever errs. For a ruler is properly speaking the practitioner of a craft [technê], just like a doctor; and, Thrasymachus explains, when in premises (1) and (2) he speaks of the ruler it is in this strict sense. And this expert ruler qua ruler does not err: by definition he acts as his craft of ruling demands.
Thrasymachus, it turns out, is passionately committed to this ideal of the rational ruler ‘in the strict sense’, construed as the intelligently exploitative tyrant, and Socrates’ arguments against him soon zero in on it. Moreover, the ideal of the wholly rational ruler is the keystone of Plato’s own political philosophy, soon to be elaborated as the ‘philosopher-king’ of Republic V-VII (and again later in his dialogue Statesman). So it is very striking that it is first introduced in the Republic not as a Socratic concept but as a Thrasymachean one. Plato thus seems to mark it as an idea appropriated from the sophistic enemy; it is at any rate a precious piece of common ground which can provide a starting-point for arguments between Socrates and Thrasymachus, who otherwise agree on so little.
Before turning to those arguments, it is worth asking what Thrasymachus’ ideal of the ruler in the strict sense adds to his account of justice. It seems to confirm that he is no conventionalist: conventionalism involves treating all socially recognised laws as equal, whereas on Thrasymachus’ account not every ruler or act of legislation counts as the real thing. A trickier point is that Thrasymachus’ glorification of tyranny renders retroactively ambiguous his slogan, ‘Justice is the advantage of the stronger’. As initially presented, the point of this seemed to be the claim noted earlier about the standard effects of just behavior: just persons are the victims of everyone who is willing to take advantage of them, and the ruling class in particular. But Thrasymachus’ praise of the expert tyrant (343b–c) suggests another interpretation. Perhaps his slogan also stands for a revisionist normative claim: that it really is right and proper, part of the correct order of things, for the strong to take advantage of the weak. This is precisely the claim that, as we will see, is expressed in the Gorgias by Callicles’ theory of ‘natural justice’. If Thrasymachus too means to make this claim then he, like Callicles, turns out to have a substantive normative ethical theory—a view about how the world ought to be. However, as we have seen, Thrasymachus only flirts with the revision of ordinary moral language which this view would entail; when Socrates suggests that according to him justice is a vice and injustice a virtue, he at first attempts to eschew such moral categories altogether, reverting again to the pose of the cynical sociological observer (348c–d). This hesitation seems to mark Thrasymachus as caught in a delicate, unstable dialectical way-station, in between a debunking of Hesiodic tradition (and for that matter conventionalism) and a full-blown Calliclean reversal of moral values. Thrasymachus occupies a position at which the traditional language of ‘justice’ has been debunked as merely a tool of the powerful, but no convincing redeployment replacement has been found.
3. Socrates vs. Thrasymachus
After the opening elenchus which elicits Thrasymachus’ ideal of the real ruler, Socrates offers a series of five arguments against various elements of his position, of which the first three revolve around the shared hypothesis that ruling is a craft [technê]. Socrates’ first argument (341b–342e) is that real crafts, such as medicine, are disinterested, serving some good distinct from the good of the practitioner: the end served by the doctor qua doctor is the health of the patient. So Thrasymachus’ selfish tyrant cannot be practising a craft; the real ruler properly understood is the one who expertly serves his weaker subjects. This argument is bitterly resisted by Thrasymachus (343a–345e). With what looks like genuine disgust, he upbraids Socrates for infantile naïveté: he might as well claim, absurdly, that shepherds and cowherds fatten their flocks for the good of the sheep and cows themselves. To reaffirm and clarify his position, Socrates offers a further argument about wage-earning (345e–347d). It is precisely because real crafts (such as medicine and, Socrates insists, shepherding too) do not in themselves benefit their practitioners that extrinsic ‘wages’ are given in return; and the best ‘wage’ for a ruler is not to be governed by someone worse than himself. So again, the Thrasymachean ruler is not genuinely practising a craft.
Third, Socrates argues that Thrasymachean rule is formally or structurally unlike the real crafts (349a–350c). A craftsperson does not seek to ‘outdo’ [pleonektein] fellow craft practitioners but to do the same as they, i.e., to perform whatever action the craft requires. The just person, who does not seek to ‘outdo’ other just people, fits this pattern, while the Thrasymachean ruler again does not. And since craft is a paradigm of goodness and cleverness in its specialized area, “a just person has turned out to be good and clever, and an unjust one ignorant and bad” (350c). Socrates takes this as equivalent to showing that “justice is virtue and wisdom and that injustice is vice and ignorance” (350d). The slippery slope in these last moves is questionable, and use of pleonektein in this argument is confusing (and perhaps confused). Nonetheless it raises an important point, which confronts head-on one of Thrasymachus’ deepest assumptions: the goods realized by genuine crafts are not zero-sum. The doctor’s restoration of the patient’s health does not make anyone else less healthy; if one musician plays in tune, so may another.
All these arguments rely on the hypothesis that the ‘real ruler’ is practising a craft [technê], and appeal to various features of the recognised crafts to establish that real ruling has a Socratic rather than a Thrasymachean profile. This is not only a direct attack on Thrasymachus’ account of the real ruler, it raises the very basic question of how justice is related to practical reason. The real ruler is, for Socrates and Thrasymachus both, an ideal of successful rational agency; and the recognized crafts provide a model for spelling out what that ideal must involve. By asking what ruling as a technê would be like—self-interested or other-directed, dedicated to zero-sum goals or not—they are really addressing a more general and still-vital set of questions: what does practical reason as such consist in? Is it reducible to the intelligent pursuit of self-interest, or does it involve some responsiveness to non-self-interested reasons? The dispute can also be framed in terms of the nature of the good, which the rational person is assumed to pursue: does it consist in zero-sum goods like wealth and power (and the pleasures they can provide), or in ones which can be attained in a cooperative rather than a pleonectic way?
Once he has established that justice, like the other crafts and virtues, is an other-directed form of practical reason aimed at non-zero-sum goods, Socrates turns to consider its nature and powers more directly. Injustice, he argues, is by nature a cause of disunity, strife, and, therefore, disempowerment and ineffectiveness (351a–352b). Even a gang of thieves can only function successfully when they are just amongst themselves. Likewise within the human soul: justice is what harmonizes the soul and makes a person effective. At this point Thrasymachus more or less gives up on the discussion, but Socrates adds a fifth argument as the coup de grace (352d–354c): justice, as the virtue of the soul (here deploying the conclusion of the third argument), is what enables the soul to perform its functions well, so that the just person lives well and happily. This final argument is a close ancestor of the famous ‘function argument’ used by Aristotle in Nicomachean Ethics I.7: it shows that Plato (and for that matter Aristotle) by no means rejects the Homeric ‘functional’ conception of virtue as such. Rather, the whole argument of the Republic amounts to a proof that it can be reconciled with the demands of Hesiodic justice, if only we understand rightly what successful human functioning consists in.
The focus of the argument has now come to rest where, in Plato’s view, it really belongs: on the psychology of justice, and its effects on the human soul. In fact, these last two arguments amount to a specification of what justice in the soul must be. Justice is a virtue of the soul—in a way, it is the virtue par excellence, since by unifying the soul (as it does the city, or any human group) it enables the other virtues to be exercised in successful action. But of course this does not yet tell us what justice itself is, or how it produces these characteristic effects. And no doubt this is one reason (perhaps among many) that no one ever finds Socrates’ arguments against Thrasymachus very satisfying or convincing: not Glaucon and Adeimantus, who demand from Socrates an argument which will reveal what justice really is and does (366e, 367b, e), not modern readers and interpreters, and certainly not Thrasymachus himself. Even Socrates complains that, distracted by Thrasymachus’ praise of injustice, he erred in trying to argue that justice is advantageous without having first established what it is (354a–c). Instead of defining justice, the Book I arguments have taken as their target Thrasymachus’ assumptions about practical rationality and advantage or the good, deployed in his conception of the ‘real ruler’. Socrates’ larger argument in Books II-IX will also engage with these, providing substantive alternative accounts of the good, rationality, and political wisdom. However, this larger-scale vindication of justice is presented as a response not directly to Thrasymachus, but to the restatement of his argument which Glaucon and Adeimantus offer (in the hope of being refuted) in Book II. And since their version of the immoralist position departs in significant ways from its inspiration, it is somewhat misleading to treat the Republic as a whole as a response to Thrasymachus. Rather, this division of labor confirms that for Plato, Thrasymachean debunking is dialectically preliminary. It is useful for its clearing away of conventional assumptions and hypocritical pieties: indeed Socrates’ later arguments largely leave intact Thrasymachus’ initial debunking theses about the effects of just behaviour and the manipulative function of moral language (unless you count a strikingly perfunctory appendix to the argument in Book X, 612a–3e). His role is simply to present the challenge these critical insights lead to; for immoralism as part of a positive vision, we need to turn to Callicles in the Gorgias.
Nothing is known of any historical Callicles, and, if there were one, it is odd that such a forceful personality would have left no trace in the historical record. All we can say on the basis of the Gorgias itself is that he is an Athenian aristocrat with political ambitions and personal connections to Gorgias. E.R. Dodds notes that, given Plato’s usual practices, “the probabilities are strongly against” Callicles’ being simply a literary invention (1959, 12); but as Dodds also remarks, it is tempting to see in Callicles a fragment of Plato himself—a frightening vision, perhaps, of what he might have become without Socrates (1959, 14). At any rate the Gorgias repeatedly marks him as a kind of antithesis or double to Socrates as the paradigmatic philosopher. Socrates opens their debate with a somewhat jokey survey of how much the two have in common (481c–d); they later exchange speeches arguing for their diametrically opposed ways of life, with repeated allusions to the contrasted brothers Zethus and Amphion in Euripides’ play Antiope (485e, 486d, 489e, 506b). These dramatic touches express the philosophical reality: more than any other character in Plato, Callicles is Socrates’ philosophical antithesis and polar opposite.
Callicles’ version of the immoralist challenge turns out to involve four main components, which I will discuss in order: (1) a critique of conventional justice, (2) a positive account of ‘justice according to nature’, (3) a theory of the virtues, and (4) a hedonistic conception of the good.
(1) Conventional Justice: Callicles’ critique of conventional justice emerges from his diagnosis of the orator Polus’ failure in the preceding argument. Polus had accused Gorgias of succumbing to shame in assenting to Socrates’ suggestion that he would teach justice to any student ignorant of it; Callicles accuses Polus of succumbing to shame himself, and being tricked by Socrates, whose arguments equivocate between natural and conventional values. According to convention [nomos], doing injustice is more shameful than suffering it, as Polus allowed; but “by nature all that is worse is also more shameful, like suffering what’s unjust” (483a, tr. here and throughout Zeyl, sometimes revised). Callicles locates the origins of the convention in a conspiracy of the weak: “the people who institute our laws are the weak and the many… they assign praise and blame with themselves and their own advantage in mind” (483b). This diagnosis of ordinary moral language as a mask for self-interest is reminiscent of Thrasymachus; but there is also a contrast, for Thrasymachus presented the laws as adapted to serve the strong, i.e., the rulers. Callicles is perhaps more narrowly focussed on democratic societies, which he depicts as involving the tyranny of the weak many over exceptional individuals. The many “mold the best and the most powerful among us … and with charms and incantations we subdue them into slavery, telling them that one is supposed to get no more than his fair share” (483e–484a). This rhetorically powerful critique of justice inaugurates a durable philosophical tradition: Nietzsche, Foucault, and their successors in various projects of genealogy and ‘unmasking’ are all Callicles’ heirs.
(2) Natural Justice: Callicles’ denunciation of conventional justice is bound up with a ringing endorsement of its opposite, the just ‘according to nature’; in fact his opening speech is perhaps our most important text for the sophistic contrast between nature [phusis] and convention [nomos]. Nomos is, as noted above (in section 1), first and foremost Law in all its grandeur, attributed by Hesiod to the will of Zeus. But in sophistic contexts, nomos is often used to designate some norm or institution—language, religion, moral values, law itself—as merely a matter of social construction. That is why nomos varies from polis to polis and nation to nation, and can be changed by our decisions. What is by nature, by contrast, is a kind of ethical and political ‘given’, outrunning our wishes or beliefs; and the contrast involves at least an implicit privileging of nature as inherently authoritative (see Kerferd 1981a, Chapter 10). This project of disentangling the contributions of nature and convention in human life can be seen as an extension to the human realm of Presocratic natural science, with its attempts to identify the eternal explanatory first principles [archai] behind the ever-changing, diverse phenomena of the cosmos.
The implications of the nomos-phusis contrast always depend on how the ‘natural’ is understood. Callicles looks both to international politics and to the animal world to identify what is natural rather than conventional: “both among the other animals and in whole cities and races of men, it [nature] shows that this is what justice has been decided to be: that the superior rule the inferior and have a greater share than they” (483d). He adds two examples at the level of ‘cities and races’: the invasions of Greece by the Persian Emperor Xerxes, and of Scythia by his father Darius (483d–e). He also imagines an individual within society who would exercise superiority to the full: if a man of outsize ability manages to throw off our moralistic shackles, “he would rise up and be revealed as our master, and here the justice of nature would shine forth” (484a–b). So what the justice of nature amounts to is simple: it is for the superior man to appropriate the power and possessions of the inferior (484c). Thus Callicles’ genealogy of morals, like Glaucon’s in Republic II, presents pleonexia as an eternal and universal first principle of human nature; and he goes further than either Thrasymachus or Glaucon in taking this nature as the basis for a positive norm.
For all its ranting sound, Callicles has a straightforward and logically valid argument here: (1) observation of nature can disclose the content of ‘natural justice’; (2) nature is to be observed in the realms where moral conventions have no hold, viz among states and among animals; (3) such observation discloses the domination and exploitation of the weak by the strong; (4) therefore, it is natural justice for the strong to rule over and have more than the weak. From a modern point of view, premise (1) is likely to appear the most dubious, for it violates the plausible principle, most famously advanced by David Hume, that no normative claims may be inferred from purely descriptive premises (‘no ought from an is’). But then, legitimate or not, this kind of appeal to nature runs through almost all of ancient ethics: it is central to the moral theory of Plato himself, as well as Aristotle, the Epicureans, and the Stoics. So Socrates’ objection is instead to (2) and (3): Callicles gets nature wrong. In truth, Socrates insists later on, “partnership and friendship, orderliness, self-control, and justice hold together heaven and earth, and gods and men, and that is why they call this universe a world order, my friend, and not an undisciplined world-disorder” (507e–508a). Callicles advocates pleonexia only because he ‘neglects geometry’ (508a): instead of predatory animals, we should observe and emulate the orderly structure of the cosmos as a whole.
(3) Callicles’ theory of the virtues: As with Thrasymachus, Socrates’ response is to press Callicles regarding the deeper commitments on which his views depend. He first prods Callicles to articulate the conception of the ‘superior’ which his account of natural justice involves. Callicles has said that nature reveals that it is just for the ‘superior’, ‘better’ or ‘stronger’ to have more: but who are they (488b–c)? In practice, as Socrates points out, ‘the many’, whom Callicles has condemned as weak, are in fact stronger: they are able, as Callicles himself has complained, to suppress the gifted few. So, like Thrasymachus when faced with the fact that rulers sometimes make mistakes in the pursuit of self-interest, Callicles now has to distinguish the ‘strength’ he admires from actual political power. (This leaves it unclear whether and why we should still see the invasions of Darius and Xerxes as examples of the ‘strong’ exercising the ‘justice of nature’; since both their expeditions were notorious failures, the examples are rather perplexing anyway.)
Callicles goes on to articulate (with some help from Socrates) a conception of ‘superiority’ in terms of a pair of very traditional sounding virtues: intelligence [phronêsis], particularly about the affairs of the city, and courage [andreia], which makes men “competent to accomplish whatever they have in mind, without slackening off because of softness of spirit” (491a–b). These are the familiar ‘functional’ virtues of the Homeric warrior, and the claim that such a man should be rewarded with a ‘greater share’ is no sophistic novelty but a restatement of the Homeric warrior ethic: the best fighter in the battle of the day deserves the best cut of the meat at night. At the same time, Callicles is interestingly reluctant to describe his ‘superior’ man as possessing the virtue of justice [dikaiosunê], which we might have expected him to redefine as conformity to the justice of nature. Instead, he seems to dispense with any conception of justice as a virtue; and he explicitly rejects the fourth traditional virtue which Plato will take as canonical in the Republic, sôphrosunê, temperance or moderation.
This traditional side of Calliclean ‘natural justice’ is worth emphasising, since Callicles is often read as a representative of the sophistic movement and their subversive ‘modern’ ideas. (Nietzsche, for instance, discusses the sophists—with immense admiration—in a way that is hard to make sense of unless we take Callicles as a principal source (1968, 232–4; and see Dodds 1958, 386–91, on Callicles’ influence on Nietzsche’s own thought).) Despite Callicles’ opposition of nomos and phusis, and his association with Gorgias, this reading is somewhat misleading. Callicles is clearly not a professional sophist himself—indeed Socrates mentions that he despises them (520b). And his friend Gorgias is properly speaking a rhetorician, i.e. a teacher of public speaking—presumably a more practical, less intellectually pretentious (and so, to Callicles, more manly) line of work. Most of all, the work to which Callicles puts the trendy nomos-phusis distinction is essentially traditional: his position is a somewhat feral variant on the ancient elitist tradition in Greek moral thought, found for instance in Theognis as well as Homer’s warrior ethic.
(4) Hedonism: Once the ‘strong’ have been identified as a ruthlessly intelligent and daring natural elite, a second point of clarification arises: of what, exactly, do they deserve more? Socrates already pressed the point at the outset by, in his usual fashion, posing it in the lowliest terms: should the stronger have a greater share of food and drink, or clothes, or land? These suggestions are scornfully rejected at first (490c–d); but Callicles does in the end allow that eating and drinking, and even scratching or the life of a catamite (a boy or youth who makes himself constantly available to a man for the man’s sexual pleasure), count as instances of the appetitive fulfilment he recommends (494b–e).
So it is not made clear to us what pleasures Callicles himself had in mind—perhaps he himself is hazy on that point. All he says is that the superior man must “allow his own appetites to get as large as possible and not restrain them. And when they are as large as possible, he ought to be competent to devote himself to them by virtue of his courage and intelligence, and to fill him with whatever he may have an appetite for at the time” (491e–492a). This seems to leave the content of those appetites entirely a matter of subjective preference. And Callicles eventually allows himself, without much resistance, to be committed by Socrates to a simple and extreme form of hedonism: all pleasures are good and pleasure is the good (495a–e). Their arguments over this thesis stand at the start of a fascinating and complex Greek debate over the nature and value of pleasure, which is here understood as the ‘filling’ or ‘replenishment’ of some painful lack (e.g., the pleasure of drinking is a replenishment in relation to the pain of thirst). However, it is difficult to be sure how much this discussion tells us about Callicles, since it is Socrates who elaborates the conception of pleasure as replenishment on which it depends. Even the strength of Callicles’ commitment to the hedonistic equation of pleasure and the good is uncertain. At 499b, having been refuted by Socrates, he casually allows that some pleasures are better than others; and as noted above, hedonism was introduced in the first place not as a thesis he was keen to propound, but as the answer to a question he could not avoid—viz, the stronger should ‘have more’ of what? Callicles’ philosophical enthusiasm is not, it seems, for pleasure itself but for the intensity, self-assertion and extravagance that accompany its pursuit on a grand scale: he endorses hedonism so as to repudiate the restraints of temperance, rather than the other way around. One way to understand this rather oddly structured position is, again, as inspired by the Homeric tradition. Callicles’ somewhat murky ideal, the superior man, is imagined as having the arrogant grandeur of the larger-than-life Homeric heroes; but what this new breed of hero is supposed to fight for and be rewarded by remains cloudy to his imagination.
5. Socrates vs. Callicles
The most fundamental difficulty with Callicles’ position is brought out by Socrates’ final refutation at 497d–499b. This is a simple and elegant argument which brings into collision Callicles’ hedonism and his account of the virtues, roughly as follows: (1) pleasure is the good; (2) good people are good by the presence of good things; (3) good people are the virtuous, i.e., the intelligent and courageous; (4) the foolish and cowardly sometimes experience as much pleasure as the intelligent and courageous, or even more; (5) therefore, bad people are sometimes as good as good ones, or even better. Here, premises (1) and (3) represent Callicles’ hedonism and his account of the virtues respectively; (2) and (4) seem undeniable; but (1), (2), and (4) together entail (5), which conflicts with (3) and is anyway a contradiction in terms.
The problem is obvious: one cannot consistently claim both that pleasure is the good, and that courage and intelligence (which are manifestly not instances of pleasure, or derivative of it, or even reliably correlated with it) are goods. Callicles could perhaps respond that the virtues are instrumentally good: an intelligent and courageous person is ‘good’ in the indirect sense that he is, overall and in the long run, more apt than others to obtain the good of pleasure. But this is not a very plausible claim—least of all in the warfare-ridden world of the Greek polis, where the coward might be at a significant advantage for survival. And this ‘instrumentalist’ option would in any case be false to Callicles’ spirit. His praise of the virtues of the superior man expresses a hazy but genuine spirit of admiration (like Thrasymachus with his ‘real ruler’), rather than a calculation of instrumental utility. So Callicles is genuinely torn. He is urging Socrates and us to pursue two ends which are not only different but sometimes incompatible: pleasure and the virtues as he understands them. Rather oddly, this is perhaps the first clear formulation of what will later be a central contrast in more standard philosophical ethical systems: the two ends represented by ‘inclination’ and ‘duty’ (Kant), or the ‘dualism of practical reason’ (Sidgwick). And the case of Callicles can help us to see an important point often obscured in later versions, which is that some conflict along these lines can arise even if one’s conception of virtue has nothing to do with altruism. Even for an immoralist, there is room for a clash between the ends set by self-interested desire and those derived from other, disinterested origins (admiration of one’s heroes, for instance)—between the advantages it is rational for us to pursue and the sort of person we ought to try to be.
Like his praise of the justice of nature, Callicles’ non-instrumental attachment to the virtues of his superior man raises the question whether ‘immoralist’ is really the right term for him. He resembles his fan Nietzsche in being a shape-shifter: at some points he seems to attack the legitimacy of moral norms as such, but at others he offers what looks like his own morality, one indeed which is much less new and radical than he seems to want us to think. If we do want to retain the term ‘immoralist’ for him, we need to allow that the basic immoralist challenge (that is, why be just? or why be moral?) may be raised from two rather different perspectives. Rather than being someone who disputes the rational authority of ethical norms as such, as Thrasymachus seems to do, the immoralist may be someone who has his own set of ethical norms and ideals, ones which exclude ordinary morality.
Callicles himself does not seem to realize how deep the problems with his position go. He responds to Socrates’ refutations by making a rather shrug-like suggestion that (contrary to his earlier explicit insistence) some pleasures are of course better than others (499b). In the end, Callicles’ position is perhaps best seen as a series of shifting suggestions or impulses—against conventional justice, against temperance, for the Homeric self-assertion of the strong, for pleasures and psychological intensity—rather than a coherent set of philosophical theses. The disunified quality of Callicles’ thought may actually be the key to its perpetual power: almost all readers find something to tempt them here, and are easily left with the lurking sense that the ‘real’ Calliclean position, whatever we might prefer it to be, remains unrefuted. (And indeed of the four ingredients of Callicles’ position discussed above, Socrates’ arguments target only (3) and (4): whether (1) and (2) could be reconceived on some lines not reliant on them is an open question.) This unease is strengthened by a fifth component of Callicles’ position: his attack on the value of philosophy itself. It is a prominent theme of Callicles’ opening rants that philosophy, while a valuable part of liberal education, is unworthy and a waste of time for a serious adult (485e–486d). The life of philosophy is unmanly and immature, the antithesis of an honorable public life; Socrates ought to ‘stop this refuting’ and ‘leave these subtleties to others’. Callicles’ anti-intellectualism does not prevent him from showing some skill in dialectic, and more commitment to its norms than most of Socrates’ interlocutors (e.g., at 495a). But Callicles also claims that he argues only to please Gorgias (506c); and in the end, he opts out of the discussion altogether, retreating into surly silence. What makes this rejection of philosophical dialectic disturbing is Callicles’ suggestion that Socrates’ philosophical positions are just self-serving expressions of his commitment to his own way of life—a version of the plausible ancient Greek truism that each man naturally praises his own way of life as best. According to Callicles, this means that Socrates would have to change his practices to gain insight: “This is the truth of the matter, as you will know if you abandon philosophy and move on to more important things” (484c). Callicles is here the first voice within philosophy to raise the prospect that there are truths which philosophy itself may hide from us. That is a possibility which Socrates clearly rejects; but it is hard to see how he could refute it.
6. Conclusion: Thrasymachus, Callicles, Glaucon, Antiphon
One way to compare the two varieties of immoralism represented by Thrasymachus and Callicles is to ask why Plato chose to represent the former position in the Republic and the latter in the Gorgias. The obvious answer is that the differences between the two put them in very different relations to Socrates and his defense of justice, suitably calibrated to the ambitions of the works in question. Socrates and Callicles are antitheses: they address the same questions and give directly conflicting answers. Each offers a positive account of the real nature of justice, grounded in a broader conception of human nature and the nature of things. Indeed, viewed at a high level of abstraction, and if we allow Socrates the fuller positive theory provided in the Republic, their positions are remarkably similar. For in the Republic we see that Plato in fact agrees with Callicles that the many should be ruled by the superior few—i.e., the intelligent and courageous—and that it is only natural and just for the latter to have greater happiness and pleasure than the many. Where they differ is in the content they give to this shared schema. From the point of view of Socrates or Plato, Callicles is wrong about nature (including human nature); wrong about what intelligence and virtue actually consist in; wrong about what the point and purpose of political rule is; and wrong about the nature of the good at which the superior man aims. His version of the immoralist challenge is thus, for all its tremendous rhetorical power, less philosophically threatening than it might be; for it depends on a rather rich positive theory (of the good, human nature, human virtue, and politics) which Plato thinks he can show to be false. Thrasymachus, by contrast, presents himself as more of a social critic: while persuasively debunking justice as conventionally understood, he fails to offer any account of real virtue in its stead. The closest he comes to presenting a substitute norm is in his praise of the expertly rational real ruler—an ideal which is pursued and developed more fully both by Callicles in the Gorgias and by Socrates in the Republic itself.
So where the Gorgias presents a mirroring and confrontation between two complete ethical stances, the immoralist and the Socratic, the Republic depicts a complex dialectical progression from the one to the other. It also gestures towards the Calliclean alternative with Glaucon’s speech in Book II. Glaucon presents his attack on justice as a restatement of Thrasymachus’ position (358c); but it represents a considerable advance in theoretical sophistication, and the differences bring it closer to Callicles. Like Callicles, Glaucon concerns himself explicitly with the nature and origin of justice, classifying it as a merely instrumental good (or a necessary evil) and locating its origins in a social contract. By nature we are all pleonectic; but since we stand to lose more than we could gain from unbridled pleonexia we have entered into a compact neither to do nor to allow injustice. As the famous ‘ring of Gyges’ thought-experiment is supposed to show, however, nobody has any real commitment to acting justly when they think they can get away with injustice; for if someone can commit injustice undetected there is no reason for him not to. Thus Glaucon agrees with Callicles in identifying justice as a matter of convention, and in holding that it conflicts with our nature. At the same time, he remains with Thrasymachus in not articulating any alternative moral norm; and he departs from both in not relying on the dubious division of mankind into two essentially different kinds, the allegedly ‘strong’ and the ‘weak’. He thus seems to represent the immoralist challenge in a fully developed yet streamlined form, shorn of unnecessary complications and theoretical assumptions and reducible to a simple, pressing question: given the merely conventional character of justice and the constraints it places on our pleonectic nature, why should any one of us be just, whenever injustice would be to our advantage?
This is also the challenge posed by the sophist Antiphon, in the surviving fragments of his discussion of justice in On Truth (see Pendrick 2002 for the texts of Antiphon, and Gagarin and Woodruff 1995 or Dillon and Gergel 2003 for translation). Antiphon argues that justice is only ever a matter of following the laws of one’s own community; and that there is no good reason for anyone to obey those laws when they can break them without fear of detection and punishment. For nature too has its laws, which conflict with those of society, and violation of these is punished infallibly. Antiphon’s text and meaning are unclear at some crucial points, but the idea seems to be that the laws of society require us to act against our own interests, by constraining our animal natures and limiting our natural desires and pleasures; and that it is foolish to obey these laws when we can get away with following nature instead. Without wanting to deny the existence of other contemporary figures working similar terrain, we can easily read Callicles, Thrasymachus, and Glaucon as Plato’s disentangling and disambiguation of Antiphon’s ideas into three possible positions, distinguished to clarify the various philosophical forms that a broadly immoralist stance might take. Thrasymachus represents the essentially negative, cynical, and debunking side of the immoralist stance, grounded in empirical observations of the ways of the world. At the same time his idealization of the ‘real ruler’ suggests that this is an unstable and incomplete position, liable to progress to a Calliclean ‘heroic’ form of immoralism. Callicles represents immoralism as a new morality, dependent on the contrasts between nature and convention and between the strong and the weak. Glaucon shows that the immoralist challenge has no need of the latter (nor, for that matter, of Thrasymachus’ ideal of the real ruler). Immoralism is for everybody: we are all complicit in the social compact which establishes law as a brake on self-interest, and we all have reason to cheat on it when we can. This, Plato’s presentation suggests, is ultimately the most challenging form of the immoralist stance; and it is probably the closest to its historical original in Antiphon himself. Whether the whole argument of the Republic suffices to defeat it remains a matter of live philosophical debate.
For general accounts of the Republic, see the Bibliography to the entry, Plato’s Ethics and Politics in the Republic. The following are works cited in or having particular relevance to the present entry:
The immoralist challenge
- Foot, P., 2003, Natural Goodness, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Gauthier, D., 1986, Morals by Agreement, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Prichard, H., 1912, “Does Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?” Mind (n.s.), 21 (81): 21–37.
- Tell, H., 2011, Plato’s Counterfeit Sophists, Washington D.C.: Center for Hellenic Studies.
- Williams, B., 1972, Morality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (cited in 1993 edition).
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The Greek moral tradition, the Sophists and their social context (including Antiphon)
- Adkins, A.W.H., 1960, Merit and Responsibility: A Study in Greek Values, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Balot, R. K., 2001, Greed and Injustice in Classical Athens, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Barney, R., 2009, “The Sophistic Movement”, in Gill and Pellegrin 2009, 77–97.
- Bett, R., 2002, “Is There a Sophistic Ethics?” Ancient Philosophy, 22: 235–262.
- de Romilly, J., 1992, The Great Sophists in Periclean Athens, J. Lloyd (trans.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Dillon, J. and T. Gergel (ed. and trans.), 2003, The Greek Sophists, London: Penguin Books.
- Dover, K., 1974, Greek Popular Morality in the Time of Plato and Aristotle, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
- Finkelberg, M., 1998, “Timê and Aretê in Homer”, Classical Quarterly, 48: 15–28.
- Furley, D.J., 1981, “Antiphon’s Case Against Justice”, in Kerferd 1981b.
- Gagarin, M., 2001, “The Truth of Antiphon’s Truth”, in Essays in Ancient Greek Philosophy VI, A. Preus (ed.), Albany: State Univ. of N.Y. Press.
- Gagarin, M., 2002, Antiphon the Athenian: Oratory, Law, and Justice in the Age of the Sophists, Austin: University of Texas Press.
- Gagarin, M. and P. Woodruff (ed. and trans.), 1995, Early Greek Political Thought from Homer to the Sophists, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Gill, M.L. and P. Pellegrin (ed.), 2009, A Companion to Ancient Philosophy, Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
- Guthrie, W.K.C., 1971, The Sophists (= A History of Greek Philosophy, Volume 3, Part 1, 1969), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Kahn, C., 1981, “The Origins of Social Contract Theory in the Fifth Century B.C.”, in Kerferd 1981b, 92–108.
- Kerferd, G.B., 1981a, The Sophistic Movement, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- ––– (ed.), 1981b, The Sophists and their Legacy, Wiesbaden: Steiner.
- Morrison, J.S., 1963, “The Truth of Antiphon”, Phronesis, 8: 35–49.
- Pendrick, G. (ed. and trans.), 2002, Antiphon the Sophist: The Fragments, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
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Thrasymachus and the Republic (including Glaucon)
- Anderson, M., 2016, “Socrates’ Thrasymachus’ Sophistic Account of Justice in Republic i”, Ancient Philosophy, 36: 151–172.
- Barney, R., 2006, “Socrates’ Refutation of Thrasymachus”, in Santas 2006, 44–62.
- Boter, G., 1986, “ Thrasymachus and Pleonexia”, Mnemosyne (Series 4), 39: 261–281.
- Chappell, T.D.J., 1993, “The Virtues of Thrasymachus”, Phronesis, 38: 1–17.
- –––, 2000, “Thrasymachus and Definition”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 18: 101–107.
- Cooper, J.M. (ed.), 1997, Plato: Complete Works, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
- Everson, S., 1998, “The Incoherence of Thrasymachus”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 16: 99–131.
- Gifford, M., “Dramatic Dialectic in Republic Book I”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 20: 35–106.
- Grube, G. and C.D.C. Reeve, tr., Plato, Republic, in Cooper 1997.
- Henderson, T., 1974, “In Defense of Thrasymachus”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 3: 218–228.
- Hourani, G., 1962, “ Thrasymachus’ Definition of Justice in Plato’s Republic”, Phronesis, 7 (1): 110–120.
- Kerferd, G., 1947, “The Doctrine of Thrasymachus in Plato’s Republic”, Durham University Journal (New Series), 9: 19–27.
- Nicholson, P., 1974, “Socrates’ Unravelling Thrasymachus’ Arguments in The Republic ”, Phronesis, 19(3): 210–232.
- O’Neill, B., 1988, “The Struggle for the Soul of Thrasymachus”, Ancient Philosophy, 8: 167–85.
- Penner, T., 2009, “Thrasymachus and the ὡς ἀληθῶς Ruler”, Skepsis 20: 199–215.
- Reeve, C.D.C., 1985, “Socrates Meets Thrasymachus”, Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 67 (3): 246–265.
- –––, 2008, “Glaucon’s Challenge and Thrasymacheanism”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 34: 69–104.
- Santas, G. (ed.), 2006, The Blackwell Guide to Plato’s Republic, Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
- Shields, C., 2006, “Plato’s Challenge : The Case Against Justice in Republic II”, in Santas 2006.
- Scott, D., 2000, “Aristotle and Thrasymachus”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 19: 225–252.
- Sparshott, F., 1966, “Socrates and Thrasymachus”, Monist, 50 (3): 421–459.
- –––, 1988, “An Argument for Thrasymachus”, Apeiron, 21 (1): 55–67.
- Weiss, R., 2007, “Wise Guys and Smart Alecks in Republic 1 and 2”, in The Cambridge Companion to Plato’s Republic, G.R.F. Ferrari (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- White, S. A., 1995, “Thrasymachus the Diplomat”, Classical Philology, 90: 307–27.
Callicles and the Gorgias
- Berman, S., 1991,“Socrates and Callicles on Pleasure”, Phronesis, 36 (2): 117–140.
- Cooper, J.M., 1999, “Socrates and Plato in Plato’s Gorgias”, in his Reason and Emotion, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 29–75.
- Dodds, E. R.,1959, Plato: Gorgias, Oxford: Oxford University Press (text, intro., commentary).
- Doyle, J., 2006, “The Fundamental Conflict in Plato’s Gorgias”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 30: 87–100.
- Hobbs, A., 2000, Plato and the Hero: Courage, Manliness and the Impersonal Good, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Irwin, T., 1979, Plato: Gorgias, Oxford: Clarendon Press (trans. and commentary).
- Kahn, C., 1983, “Drama and Dialectic in Plato’s Gorgias”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 1: 75–121.
- Kamtekar, R., 2005, “The Profession of Friendship: Callicles, Democratic Politics, and Rhetorical Education in Plato’s Gorgias”, Ancient Philosophy, 25: 319–39.
- Klosko, G., 1984, “The Refutation of Callicles in Plato’s Gorgias”, Greece and Rome, 31 (2): 126–139.
- Nietzsche, F., 1968, The Will to Power, trans. W. Kaufman, New York: Random House (original work published 1901).
- Rudebusch, G., 1992, “Callicles’ Hedonism”, Ancient Philosophy, 12 (1): 53–71.
- Woolf, R., 2000, “Callicles and Socrates: Psychic (Dis)harmony in the Gorgias”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 18: 1–40.
- Zeyl, D. J., tr. Plato, Gorgias, in Cooper 1997.
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