Many of the philosophers commonly described as “existentialist” have made original and decisive contributions to aesthetic thinking. In most cases, a substantial involvement in artistic practice (as novelists, playwrights or musicians) nourished their thinking on aesthetic experience. This is true already of two of the major philosophers who inspired 20th century existentialism: Søren Kierkegaard and Friedrich Nietzsche. For reasons of space, however, this entry is restricted to 20th century thinkers who at one point or another accepted the tag “existentialist” as an accurate characterisation of their thinking, and who have made the most significant contributions to aesthetics: Albert Camus, Simone de Beauvoir, Gabriel Marcel, Maurice Merleau-Ponty and Jean-Paul Sartre.
Existentialism owes its name to its emphasis on “existence”. For all the thinkers mentioned above, regardless of their differences, existence indicates the special way in which human beings are in the world, in contrast with other beings. For the existentialists, the human being is “more” than what it is: not only does the human being know that it is but, on the basis of this fundamental knowledge, this being can choose how it will “use” its own being, and thus how it will relate to the world. “Existence” is thus closely related to freedom in the sense of an active engagement in the world. This metaphysical theory regarding human freedom leads into a distinct approach to ontology, i.e., the study of the different ways of being.
This ontological aspect of existentialism ties it to aesthetic considerations. Existentialist thinkers believe that, under certain conditions, freedom grants the human being the capacity of revealing essential features of the world and of the beings in it. Since artistic practice is one of the prime examples of free human activity, it is therefore also one of the privileged modes of revealing what the world is about. However, since most of the existentialists followed Nietzsche in the conviction that “God is dead,” art’s power of revelation is to a large extent devoted to expressing the absurdity of the human condition. For the existentialists, the world is no longer hospitable to our human desire for meaning and order.
This ontological approach to art underpins some of the most distinctive features of existentialist aesthetics. Because it views art in terms of “revelation,” it favors representative art and is suspicious of formalist avant-gardes. And because it grounds expressive capacity on the notion of human freedom, it demands that artistic representation be strongly informed by ethical and political concerns. This is why at times existentialist aesthetics can appear out of touch with the aesthetic avant-gardes of the 20th century.
Some of the existentialists wrote substantial analyses about different art forms and how they can be compared, elaborating something like a “system of the arts” similar to that of classical aesthetics. All the existentialist thinkers, with the exception of Merleau-Ponty, thought that the form that best enabled the revelatory potential of art was the theatre, followed by the novel.
- 1. Metaphysical foundations of existentialist aesthetics
- 2. The phenomenological core of existentialist aesthetics
- 3. Art as revelation of the world
- 4. Art as expression of human freedom
- 5. Art and the absurd
- 6. Ontology of the artwork
- 7. Theory of expression
- 8. The artist
- 9. The audience
- 10. The existentialist “system of the arts”
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The term “aesthetics” as it first emerged in modern philosophy (in A. G. Baumgarten’s 1750 Aesthetica) encompassed the theory of perception, the theory of beauty and the theory of art. This remained true of all classical philosophical aesthetics in the late 18th and 19th centuries. In this brand of aesthetics, the aesthetic moment is but one aspect of the general theory of how humans perceive, know, and act in the world; the theories of beauty and of artistic practice depend on the theories of perception, knowledge and judgement, and those in turn are premised upon more fundamental considerations regarding the nature of reality and our relationship to it. By contrast with the specialised aesthetic theories developed in the last few decades, existentialist aesthetics is a continuation of this grand tradition. Existentialist aesthetics is intimately connected to certain metaphysical views, and it owes its richness and consistency to the fact that it is part of a complex and coherent philosophical system. Therefore we should begin by delineating the most salient features of this metaphysical outlook.
The key insight that defines and unites existentialism as a philosophical position, despite all the divergences between the authors included under that denomination, is the emphasis on the radical nature of human freedom, and the metaphysical and ontological imports of that freedom. The metaphysical and ontological significance of freedom precedes its moral, ethical, and political aspects, since the ways in which human beings “hook up” to the world should be considered before issues of duty or justice. For existentialism, human freedom grounds the very possibility of knowledge in its deepest form, i.e., the capacity of human beings to reveal something about reality. A Christian existentialist like Gabriel Marcel interprets the metaphysical reach of human freedom in terms of the capacity and responsibility of individuals to make themselves “available” to the mystery of their participation in creation, in particular by responding to the appeal of the great “Thou” (see in particular Marcel 1960b). Atheistic existentialists (Camus, Sartre, de Beauvoir, Merleau-Ponty), on the contrary, do not ground freedom in faith and the hope of accessing the transcendent; instead they emphasise the difficulty of assuming that freedom, since nothing can ensure that our attempts at finding meaning in the world will actually yield something objectively present in it. But in all cases freedom is the ultimate ground of human beings’ capacity to relate to the world.
For the 20th century existentialists, a decisive philosophical inspiration was phenomenology, the philosophical method devised by the German philosopher, Edmund Husserl, during the late 19th and early 20th centuries, and which his famous student, Martin Heidegger, developed into a combination of existential analysis and deep ontology. Even Camus, who does not define himself as a phenomenologist, and indeed sometimes rejects the tag of “existentialist” (1945), appropriates the notion of intentionality, central to Husserl’s phenomenology, in his most famous work, The Myth of Sisyphus (Camus 1942b, 44–50). It follows that existentialist aesthetics and the phenomenological approach to aesthetic perception and judgement (Ingarden 1962, 1965) are two closely related areas. Mikel Dufrenne situates his work precisely at this intersection (see especially Dufrenne 1973). However, the existentialists’ approach to phenomenology is highly original, and has significant and distinctive implications for aesthetics.
What does intentionality mean, and why is it such a central notion in existentialist thinking about art? Husserl shows that when any type of meaning is articulated (in cognitive, moral, affective, aesthetic attitudes, etc.), a specific act of consciousness occurs. The specificity of the meaning in question depends on the particular way in which consciousness “intends” its content in each case, i.e., the specific way in which it relates to a given (e.g., an object to know, judge, perceive, enjoy, and so on). In other words, different types of meaning depend on the specific structure of the acts of consciousness that carry them; in particular, they depend on the specific temporality of these mental acts. To give an example that made its way into some of the most famous existentialist literary works (e.g., in the famous descriptions in Nausea, Sartre’s first novel): there is a specific temporality involved in perceiving an object in space. The object is not given in an instant, and every perception points to a potential new perception which will confirm or revise the previous ones. This temporality of perception implies recourse to memory and a unification of past moments of perception. This emphasis on the way human consciousness “intends” the world in different ways accounts not just for the content of human knowledge, but also, more radically, for the relationship of the human being to reality. It is not just an epistemological but a metaphysical position.
This approach to the basic problem of metaphysics is highly significant because it circumvents the dualisms of classical philosophy: subject vs. object, impression vs. a priori principles as the basis of knowledge, freedom vs. determinism, and so on. The emphasis on intentionality avoids these dualisms because it entails, on the one hand, that all meanings are constituted through acts of human consciousness, thus insisting on the active role of the subject in the formulation of any meaningful aspect of the world. On the other hand, however, the theory of intentionality also implies that the world already contains the meanings that consciousness reveals, either because these meanings are potentialities from the point of view of human action (this is Sartre’s view), or simply because these meanings are already in the world (Merleau-Ponty’s view, but also that of Marcel, for whom true knowledge arises from the openness to the fullness of Being).
The existentialists explicitly embraced the philosophical solution that phenomenology provided. For example, Sartre’s What is Literature?, the key text of existentialist aesthetics, starts off by reformulating the fundamental lesson of Husserlian phenomenology:
Each of our perceptions is accompanied by the consciousness that human reality is a “revealer”, that is, it is through human reality that “there is” being, or, to put it differently, that man is the means by which things are manifested. It is our presence in the world which multiplies relations. It is we who set up this relationship between this tree and a bit of sky. Thanks to us, that star which has been dead for millennia, that quarter moon, and that dark river are associated in the unity of a landscape. It is the speed of our car and our aeroplane which organises the great mass of the earth. With each of our acts, the world reveals to us a new face. But, if we know that we are directors of being, we also know that we are not its producers. If we turn away from this landscape, it will sink back into its dark permanence. At least, it will sink back; there is no one mad enough to think that it is going to be annihilated (Sartre 1948a, 26).
Sartre draws a basic aesthetic implication from the thesis that meaning in the world depends on acts of consciousness: the fundamental aim of the work of art is to deliberately and consistently exert this uniquely human quality to introduce meaningful order and regularities into the world. Whereas in the “natural attitude” this happens without the agent’s awareness (in the form of natural perception, folk and scientific knowledge), in artistic practice the order, regularities, perspectives, and meaningful relationships are formalised, emphasised, systematised, and wilfully arranged. The simultaneous effect is to “reveal” significant features of the world and to gain a reflexive sense of being revealers of the world and ‘manifesting’ it. Thus, our sense of freedom is tremendously increased:
One of the chief motives of artistic creation is certainly the need of feeling that we are essential in relationship to the world. If I fix on canvas or in writing a certain aspect of the fields or the sea or a look on someone’s face which I have disclosed, I am conscious of having produced them by condensing relationships, by introducing order where there was none, by imposing the unity of mind on the diversity of things (Sartre 1948a, 27).
Thus the first aspect of aesthetic pleasure is this double “joy” (Sartre 1948a, 41) of “disclosing” the world and fully appropriating the unique power to do so, becoming aware and exercising our radical freedom. This first aspect of aesthetic pleasure can be called “metaphysical”, since it arises from the fundamental relation between humans and the world (Howells 1988).
Indeed, such is the metaphysical reach of human freedom that every attempt to disclose a portion of the world tends to aim for the disclosure of the “totality” of beings. This is because (as Husserl already insisted) the most partial or minute act of perception entails a reference to a broader horizon of future potential perceptions. Many existentialist writers have stressed this primordial, metaphysical function of the work of art as a partial revealing that aims to uncover the totality of Being. This idea is found, most notably, in Simone de Beauvoir’s defence of the metaphysical novel (de Beauvoir 1946, 1965, 73; see also, Merleau-Ponty’s reflections in his review of de Beauvoir’s first novel, 1945c).
Such an intimate link between metaphysics and art explains why existentialists often place certain artists on a level equal or superior to the philosophers: Camus with Dostoievski, Marcel with Bach, Merleau-Ponty with Cézanne, Sartre and de Beauvoir with Faulkner and Kafka. It also partly explains why most existentialist philosophers were equally, or in fact more, active as creative writers. According to them, metaphysical inquiry and artistic practice share a fundamental aim: both are ways of revealing to human beings their own freedom and responsibility.
The metaphysical and ethical dimensions of human freedom are intimately related. This is the most significant difference between the existentialists and Husserlian phenomenology: the existentialists link the power to disclose the world to the necessity of human beings to decide who they should be, in terms of the fundamental values directing a person’s life. The concept of “existence” designates precisely this ethical dimension of human life. The existentialists argue that, of all the beings existing in the world, the human being is the only one that can decide what it should be; indeed, it is forced to do so since it has no fixed nature. As the existentialist motto goes, “man is condemned to be free.” Here, freedom is not just independence in the sense of independence from, but in the sense of being able to decide who and what one should be. This ethical dimension of freedom as the power of self-determination (which also entails the duty to use it) explains the central place of the notion of “ engagement (commitment).” Before it designates any necessity to choose in particular situations, “engagement” refers to the fundamental position of the human individual, whose very being consists in having to make use of its freedom. On the existentialists’ outlook, the only positive feature of “human reality,” strictly speaking, is responsibility towards others and towards oneself (and, for the Christian existentialists, towards God). Many human beings refuse this burden and flee from their ontological responsibility by accepting pre-given roles. This is what Sartre’s “bad faith” and Marcel’s “functional man” designate.
What is the link between the metaphysical and the ethical dimensions of human freedom, and how does this latter concern aesthetics?
Let us begin with the first part of the question. We will first approach it by using a mode of argument typical of phenomenology. Many existentialists insist that the ways in which a human consciousness “intends” the world (that is, imposes a certain order and regularity in external phenomena) is intrinsically dependent on the values the person has set for herself. A mountain climber views a mountain in a way radically different from an intellectual who has devoted his or her life to books. The difference in their perspectives relates to the deep projects of selves that distinguish these two persons. In other words, behind every perception there is a value influencing the perception in advance and thus ultimately determining its precise content. On a deeper, ontological level, the experience that there is something at all, the experience of being, cannot be conceived if there is not a desire for it (an “ontological exigency” says Marcel). The very capacity of human beings to conceive something in the world at all is premised on their capacity to posit values (Sartre 1943a; Marcel 1960a, for the religious perspective).
If that is true, however, then every “revelation” of the world in the first, metaphysical sense also entails a revelation of the fundamental ethical (or, as the existentialists preferred, existential) project underpinning this perception. This answers, then, the second part of the question regarding the relation between the work of art and the ethical aspect of freedom. For the existentialists, as we saw, the work of art brings to a higher level of reflexivity and consistency the innate capacity of human beings to disclose the world. However, since this capacity is itself rooted in the ethical or religious nature of human beings, the work of art plays a central role in conveying a more acute sense of ethical responsibility. It follows that there is an intimate link between art and engagement: every aesthetic ordering of the world brings with it a conception of human freedom and suggests ways to use it.
Hence, Sartre’s definition of the literary work, which applies broadly to all works of art: “… an imaginary presentation of the world inasmuch as it requires human freedom” (1948a, 45). In other words, the artwork serves the purpose of “making us feel essential in relation to the world.” The work of art presents the world not just in the sense that it reveals aspects of it, but also in the sense that it calls for human involvement, notably in collective action (or, for Marcel, ‘communion’) (Goldthorpe 1992).
This definition of the artwork remains ambiguous inasmuch as it does not specify whose freedom is required. A number of features can be delineated as a result, depending on whose freedom is emphasised in each case.
The freedom required by the world is first of all that of the artist. Every artwork reveals a fundamental, existential attitude towards the world, and is the expression of an existential choice. We will return to the fundamental notion of expression below, but we can already note that putting existential weight on every act of disclosure leads directly to the conclusion that artistic practice is intimately linked to ethical and political choices.
However, the ‘expressive’ aspect of the artwork, the fact that it is the manifestation of a unique subjectivity, is not the most interesting one for the existentialists; from this perspective, existentialist aesthetics is quite distant from romanticism. This is because existence, freedom and self-determination are, for the existentialists, essentially active and practical notions. The existential choice is not simply a choice of who one should be, in the sense of a choice of personality or character; the theory of existence does not translate into a theory of genius. Rather, the emphasis is on the active relationship within the world, and especially with others. Accordingly, one defines who one is by what one does with one’s freedom in the world, through the ways in which one proposes to change the world, notably in relation to other human agents. When the artist presents the world, whether he or she likes it or not this presentation also proposes to others ways to live in the world and possibly (at least for the most politically minded authors, such as Sartre, de Beauvoir and Merleau-Ponty) ways to change it. In Sartre’s words, every “imaginary presentation of the world” is an act of “a” freedom speaking to “other” freedoms about possible ways of engaging freedom in the world. Extending Sartre’s definition of the novel, then, we could say that every artwork is an “appeal” (Sartre 1948a, 32).
Therefore the artwork involves a freedom that is not just that of the artist, but also that of the audience. In existentialist language, it is freedom considered as ‘engaged,’ that is, irreducibly caught up in engagement and forced to do something about it. Hence, Sartre offers another definition of the artwork that identifies the different poles of the metaphysical power of art: “… the writer has chosen to reveal the world and particularly to reveal man to other men so that the latter may assume full responsibility before the object which has thus been laid bare” (Sartre 1948a, 14).
In their own artistic practice and their work as critics, the existentialists tended to interpret this conception of art’s mission (as revelation and appeal) as an argument in favour of representational approaches, and against formalistic and puristic approaches. They were generally sceptical of ‘autotelic’ conceptions of the artwork that view it as a self-contained object answerable only to its own formal rules. In this respect, again, they differ from some modernist views. Indeed, this insistence on the representative dimension of art might appear old-fashioned, inasmuch as the more modern insistence on the autonomy of the artwork has marked most late 19th century aesthetic projects and their 20th century descendants. The existentialists’ insistence on the intrinsic ethical and political significance of the artwork further distances them from these other aesthetic approaches.
So far we have only considered the subjective side of the link between human revelation of the world and the world itself. Existentialism, however, also emphasizes the objective side of the link; that is, the world itself as object of perception and knowledge, and as the context in which human action takes place. Here, there are some notable differences between ‘optimistic’ and ‘tragic’ conceptions of the world in terms of our human endeavours.
The ‘optimistic’ ontologies, like those of Marcel or Merleau-Ponty, see the world as being on the whole a welcoming place for human knowledge and action. Marcel, despite his critical analyses of what he sees as the ills of modern society, is the most optimistic of all, mainly due to the theological grounding of his ontology. Ultimately there is no gap for him between the yearning for full participation in the world (including in God) and the world itself, since we owe our very existence and capacity for participation to the ultimate origin of this world. As he writes in his diary: “Knowledge is within being, enfolded by it” (1935, 115). Although Merleau-Ponty does not share this theological conviction, he agrees with Marcel on a crucial point: our incarnation in the world through our bodies is the fundamental beginning of our learning to inhabit the world meaningfully. As a result of our being both in and of the world through our bodies, Merleau-Ponty believes that on the whole our presentations of the world reveal objective features of it.
The ‘tragic’ ontologies of Sartre, de Beauvoir and Camus, on the other hand, insist on the inhospitality of the world towards human endeavours insofar as the world is mostly reticent to our attempts at introducing meaning and unity into it. For Camus, the ‘absurd’ mainly designates this resistance of the world to our endeavours. Whilst we crave for sense and harmony, the world has nothing to offer but chaos and a random play of blind forces. All our efforts to impose order and sense upon a world that can ultimately accommodate neither are therefore doomed to fail. The absurd, then, denominates both the most fundamental state of the world and the absurdity of human attempts at overcoming this basic fact.
However, whilst Camus’ ‘absurd’ names the essentially tragic state of humanity, it is counterbalanced by his awe towards the indifferent majesty of Nature. For Camus, one of the ways of liberating oneself from the illusion of meaning and unity is to open up to the beauty of Nature and partake in it, abandoning oneself in privileged moments of hedonistic communion with wild environments, such as the rugged Algerian landscape or the Mediterranean, or in eroticism (1938a; see the moments of happiness in The Outsider, for example, 1942a, 23–24, 116–117).
Sartre, on the other hand, insists on the “disgusting”, “nauseating” aspect of a world reticent to meaning, order and beauty. His first novel, Nausea, painstakingly chronicles this ontological disgust towards the strangeness of the world. A proffered hand becomes “a big white worm,” a glass of beer a hostile partner whose “gaze” the hero attempts to avoid for half an hour; a pebble on the beach reveals the “nausea” that is communicated from the world “through the hands.” Even here, however, aesthetic experiences trigger some exceptional moments in which the hero manages to escape ontological ‘nausea’. This occurs, for example, when the novel’s main character suddenly hears a jazz song in a café, which, like a “band of steel,” points to a different time beyond the drudgery of the everyday (Sartre 1938, 21–23).
Many of the existentialists’ literary creations attempt to describe the entanglements of human freedom in these fundamental ontological features of the world. Admittedly, this applies to some existentialist authors more than others. For instance, Marcel’s plays explore the difficulties that modern individuals encounter in responding to the appeal of transcendence, and in giving in to faith and hope. But these obstacles arise mainly from social institutions (notably around marriage) and historical events (the tragic circumstances of the 20th century and what Marcel sees as the dangerous objectivism of modern society). Similarly, de Beauvoir’s novels tend to portray individuals seeking their true selves beyond the strictures of social morality. In contrast, a great part of Camus’ and Sartre’s literary work is dedicated to describing the difficulties that people face when trying to find their place, not just in their social, but also in their natural and material environments. As we have noted, some of the best-known passages in their literary writings also describe moments in which the obtrusiveness of the world is overcome, yielding fleeting yet sublime experiences of sensuous communion with nature and others.
Sartre drew some particularly interesting conclusions from the definition of the functions of art on the basis of an existentialist metaphysics. These conclusions relate to what, in contemporary discussions, is called the ‘ontology’ of the artwork: the type of reality of the artwork’s different elements and their internal relations. Mikel Dufrenne has most thoroughly pursued this ontological approach.
Sartre’s early texts on the imagination already provided significant insights in that regard (in particular, see Dufrenne’s lengthy discussions of them in his The Phenomenology of Aesthetic Experience, 1973). The freedom that characterises human subjectivity is manifested most vividly in a specific type of intentionality: the imagining of an object. Imagination exemplifies the power of human consciousness because it is a type of intentionality that posits in the same act both the existence of the object and its inexistence, since it “intends” it precisely as a virtual object. In imagination, the object is indeed intended by consciousness, but “as absent”, as “containing a certain part of nothingness” inasmuch as it is posited as not existing here and now (Sartre 1940). This distinguishes it from the type of intentionality involved in perception, one of the key aspects of which is precisely the positing of its object as existent.
This emphasis on the ‘derealising’ aspect of the consciousness of an image has important implications for the ontological status of the artwork. The real, material elements of the artwork are, properly speaking, not the actual elements on which the aesthetic judgement is fixed. These are fixed instead on a virtual object, i.e., the work’s ideal qualities, wherein the work’s meaning, power and beauty are manifested (Sartre 1940, 213; see also Dufrenne 1973, 3). On this account, the material aspects of the artwork are “occasions” for the manifestation of the ideal aspects. Sartre insists that one should reject any suspicion of dualism here: “There is no realisation of the imaginary, nor can we speak of its objectification,” (ibid.) as though a prior mental representation had been “objectified” and realised in the actual artwork. Rather, the “real” artwork has two sides: a real and an “unreal” (irréel, virtual, or ideal) side. These two are, however, indistinguishable. “The painting should then be conceived as a material thing visited from time to time by an unreal which is precisely the painted object” (ibid; see Dufrenne 1973, 3–18). The real, says Sartre, is the analogue of the ideal. Merleau-Ponty puts it in similar terms, at first in terms of sense and non-sense, and later on in terms of the visible and the invisible: the ideal content of the artwork is “in transparency behind the sensible or in the heart of the sensible.” It “doubles up the lights and sounds from beneath, is their other side or their depth” (Merleau-Ponty 1964a, 150–151, but already in 1945a, 182–183).
This general “negative” dimension of the artwork (the fact that as an ideal object it is not reducible to the materiality that carries it) applies also to each of the artwork’s elements and their relations (the colours and shapes in a painting, the words and sentences in a novel, and so on). Existentialist aesthetics generally insists on the unity that artistic expression brings to the world. As a consequence of this emphasis on organic unity, it seems to propound a rather conventional image of the aesthetic qualities of the artwork (see, for example, from a theologically informed perspective, Marcel’s discussion of the symphony and the fugue as examples of self-enclosed “perfection” [1960b, 53–54]).
However, Sartre’s analyses of the relationship between the artwork’s elements shows that the insistence on unity as a criterion of artistic beauty is perhaps not as banal as it might sound. Sartre’s pre-war texts on the imagination are especially informative on this topic. In them, Sartre shows the substantial relationship between the power of human consciousness to “nihilate” the world (to overlook some of its aspects and emphasise others on the basis of an existential set of values) and the internal coherence of the artwork:
… each stroke of the brush (is) not for itself, (…) it (is) given together with an unreal (irréel) synthetic whole and the aim of the artist is to construct a whole of real colours which enable this unreal to manifest itself. (…) It is the configuration of these unreal objects that I designate as beautiful (Sartre 1940, 216).
This implies that the consistency of the existential project, from which the world is revealed in a special way, also commands the consistency of the artwork. But the quote above also indicates the relation between the different elements that make up the overall composition: in the end, every particular material element that contributes to the general composition is related to the others through a relation of negativity.
The theory of meaning that underpins this view of the artwork’s structure thus seems to anticipate a Saussurean definition of language. Famously, Saussure analysed the functioning of language as a ‘diacritical’ system in which each sign owes its signification not to a substantial, one-to-one relation between word and referent, but rather to its place within the overall linguistic system. Basically, a sign means what it means on the basis of ‘not being’ any of the other signs. ‘Dog’ means what it does because the signifier (the material sound) and the signified (the intended meaning) differs from all others, and especially the proximate ones: ‘log’, ‘fog’, ‘god’, and so on; ‘wolf’, ‘cat’, and so on.
In the same manner, the existentialist philosophers who dedicated the most attention to the articulation of meaning (Sartre and Merleau-Ponty) insist on the essentially diacritical essence of the aesthetic element in a given composition: an element has aesthetic significance on the basis of its relation to the other elements, rather than owing to any substantial meaning of its own. It follows that, for example, in a painting the pleasure derived from a particular colour in isolation from the rest of the work is not ‘aesthetic’ in the strong sense but only in a lower sense: as a pleasure for the senses only. This also implies that often the meaning and aesthetic power of a composition (a text, a painting and so on) rests just as much on what is not said or not shown; what lies in-between the elements of the composition, rather than on the elements explicitly shown. The existentialists all insist that meaning is largely to be found in a certain form of silence. In the case of a novel:
… the literary object, though realised through language, is never realised in language. On the contrary, it is by nature a silence and a contestation of speech. The hundred thousand words aligned in a book can be read one by one without the meaning of the work emerging; meaning is not the sum of the words, but its organic totality (Sartre 1948a, 30).
This means that the different elements of the artwork should not be approached separately or in their immediate reality, but in terms of how they function organically, systematically and negatively. The colours in a painting, and the choice of words and the rhythm of sentences in a novel are all but traces, ellipses, elisions, and caesuras that suggest in the negative, just as much as the elements positively indicate the contours of a certain perspective onto the world.
The emphasis on the capacity of human consciousness to ‘derealise’ the world amounts to a defence of the creative freedom of the artist. The artwork is the most striking example of the power of human consciousness to turn towards the world in such a way that it takes in from it certain elements and blanks out others, in accordance to a fundamental existential project. Artistic practice is one of the most eminent demonstrations of human freedom because it shows how human practice can recreate (Camus, Sartre, de Beauvoir, Merleau-Ponty) or recover (Marcel) a new, more ordered world out of the given world. Camus offers a concise formulation for a central principle of existentialist aesthetics: “To write is already to choose” (Camus 1951, 271).
The existentialist philosophers did not refrain from formulating internal (aesthetic) and external (ethical and political) constraints to artistic practice, but their aesthetics fundamentally proclaims the radical freedom of the artist, also seeing in it the privileged exemplar of human freedom in general. Camus, for example, makes artistic activity, the choice of becoming an artist, one of the privileged modes for humans to deal with the absurd (Camus 1942b, 86–88). Many existentialist texts dedicated to aesthetic matters emphasise the ‘mystery’ of creativity, the amazing ‘solution’ that an artwork represents, the ‘miracle of expression’ that elicits admiration from the audience and the philosopher.
But radical freedom is ambiguous, as it must work with a facticity (a term the existentialists adopted from Heidegger), viz., a set of given factors (physical, social and so on) that it has not created. In the case of the artist, the ambiguity resides already in the decision and the passion to become an artist. Although a set of genetic and social preconditions influences that decision, it is equally the product of an individual decision in that specific situation.
The work of art is caught up in the same ambiguity. On the one hand, it is the free creation of an unconstrained person, a purely idiosyncratic expression of an individuality. On the other, it is constrained by various factors that exert influence on its very structure: the audience, the historical period that will receive the work, the material elements that make up the artwork, and in particular, the already signifying elements that the artist reuses and recomposes to create a new work.
Merleau-Ponty’s writings of the 1950s advance an original existentialist theory of expression that addresses this latter dimension in particular. It can be argued that this theory of expression captures and makes explicit thoughts that a number of other existentialist writers shared on these questions.
In The Prose of the World (1964), Merleau-Ponty explored the emergence and logic of meaning and meaning-giving activity, of signification and expression, using the example of literary works (particularly the novel). Stendhal provided him with a paradigmatic case study. Such an attempt to draw deep philosophical conclusions from artworks is typical of existentialist practice.
Firstly, the literary work can help us understand the phenomenon of meaning and meaning-giving by seeing the writer as creating new meanings, indeed a new language (a Joycean version of English, a Flaubertian French, and so on) by recomposing a language he or she shares with an entire historical community. This is a truly ambiguous aspect that can be taken (on one hand) as the proof of the mystery of expression, evidence of a creative power required to make possible the emergence of the new out of the old, while (on the other hand) this new is possible only on the basis of the already-instituted. But this initial remark points to a much deeper level; here, it is painting that offers the most precious indications. In discussing André Malraux’s seminal essays on the history of painting (Malraux 1953), Merleau-Ponty articulated a detailed existentialist theory of meaning where the artwork plays the central role. The Husserlian metaphor of ‘perspective’ is appropriated and transformed into a general formula for both the power of perception and the metaphysical condition of the human being.
Intentionality can be said to coincide with the establishment of a perspective in a world where there is, prior to human presence, none. For reality to appear in all its different qualities and structures, human consciousness is required. What distinguishes the artist from other language-users is the consistency and coherence of a specific outlook onto the world. Such coherent perspective introduces an element of regularity and structure in the chaos of the world. It introduces directions: a high and a low, a right and a left. That is, it introduces sense.
This link between artistic expression and meaning leads to a major re-evaluation of the notion of style. Rather than a superficial way of formulating meanings that remain unchanged by their expression, style in this context now indicates a fundamental perspective from which the world can be approached; it indicates a perspective that would not have existed prior to the expressive act. It designates an “irreplaceable deviation” that is possible only from a specific way of being-in-the-world, and which is subsequently recaptured in symbolic language, whether the linguistic form of literature, or the “indirect language” of painting. Style is a coherent perspective, a “coherent deformation,” a way of being-in-the-world and of approaching the world from a certain angle. On this model, style does not express pre-existing meaning, but creates it. Camus, in the pages of The Rebel devoted to the aesthetic dimensions of rebellion, developed a concomitant conception of artistic expression:
… unity in art appears at the limit of the transformation which the artist imposes on reality. This correction, which the artist imposes by his language and by a redistribution of the elements extracted from reality, is called style and gives the recreated universe its unity and its boundaries (Camus 1951, 270).
This in turn gives a more specific meaning to the relation of the new and the old in expression. True expression (whether the first genuine self-expression of the learning speaker, a new scientific meaning, or true artistic achievement) is both totally idiosyncratic, and a re-composition of shared elements; it transforms the old. For true expression to occur, two forms of speech are thus required: “speaking speech” and “spoken speech” (Merleau-Ponty, 1945a, 197). This explains the puzzling fact that a true expression must be at once a true creation, something unheard of, and yet can be understood only if the language it uses (natural, scientific or artistic) is known. In other words, expression is always also a form of communication between one “speaker” and the community of speakers. Assuming that Merleau-Ponty’s analyses are representative of views that were shared by the other existentialist writers (see Sartre, 1948a, 56, in which the germane concept of “mediation” is used; “communication” is the central notion in Marcel’s philosophy of theatre), we can note that once again existentialist aesthetics seems at odds with many modern artistic currents, which have insisted on drawing a radical distinction between the functions and uses of artistic and everyday languages. For example, a major poet and theorist of literature like Paul Valéry was inspired by Mallarmé’s famous characterisation of poetry as “giving a purer sense to the words of the tribe.” We can also mention surrealist and expressionist painters and film directors who sought to break through everyday imagery in order to transfigure reality.
Artistic communication also has a certain capacity to transcend the ages and cut across languages. Beyond the historical situatedness of artistic communication (the fact that an artistic language re-uses the language of its contemporaries), the task of giving sense on the basis of being-in-the-world is part of the metaphysical condition of being human, and so applicable to all humans throughout history. As a result, considering that art is a ‘higher degree’ of communication, the work of art is not just a striking example of genuine expression, but also exemplifies the fact that every act of meaning is open to the past and the future of other human acts of expression.
At this point, we can note a tension within the aesthetics of many existentialist writers (a tension that is quite acute in Sartre’s work) between the relative trans-historical meaningfulness of artworks and their utter situatedness: artworks offer an image of engaged freedom in particular situations that are truly accessible only to its contemporaries (Sartre 1948a, 50–52). Merleau-Ponty, for his part, insists on the underlying unity of the history of painting, which allows us to find traces and echoes of past painters in modern ones. The history of painting is a microcosmic image of history, and a testament to the capacity of present generations to understand the actions and passions of the past (Merleau-Ponty 1964b, 72). Merleau-Ponty’s vision of the possibility of empathy across the ages does not deny the historical relativity of sense formations. It shows how, despite the spatiotemporal distance that separates historical contexts, humans can still understand each other, historians can understand previous times, anthropologists other peoples, and we can somehow access some of the meanings of past artistic practices. The expressive achievements of other peoples are both radically alien, and yet the result of expressive gestures that are commensurable to ours, inasmuch as they are the product of a common human capacity, viz., the capacity to transcend the natural world and recreate it as a meaningful and ordered universe.
A central, shared assumption of existentialist aesthetics, beyond the stark religious and political differences of the existentialists, is the essential ambiguity of the human condition: I am radically free as consciousness, yet radically determined by my facticity, the physical, social and other circumstances in which my consciousness comes to the world. On this particular point Heidegger’s existential analytic is a shared reference that brings together otherwise diverse (or, indeed, antagonistic) thinkers. An important implication of the emphasis on human facticity is that it forges a vital link between philosophy and the arts, which from this perspective similarly aim to explore the metaphysical ambiguity of the human condition.
This grants the artist a special status from at least two standpoints:
1) Artistic activity as an existential choice is a privileged mode of assuming and realising the paradoxical nature of being human. In Camus’ words, artistic activity is one of the key attitudes to face the absurd. Camus’ celebration of art in The Myth of Sysiphus (1942b, 127), which crowns artistic expression as the ultimate form of “joy,” would ring true for the other existentialists despite their noted differences on the question of the absurd. Indeed, many other existentialist writers made similar statements reflecting their own life choices, in particular their decision to pursue a philosophical and literary career. The personal dimension that can be found in many existentialist writings grants these texts a special status in the history of philosophy, since it blurs a boundary that has been essential to the definition of the genre of philosophical writing, viz., the boundary between the theoretical and the biographical, the personal and the general. Marcel’s “metaphysical diary” is a good case in point. More than just an original form of philosophical analysis, the diary illustrates Marcel’s own conception of the true self as a gradual awakening to the “appeal” of being through the combined practices of ontological inquiry, artistic creation and personal engagement. Sartre also wrote an autobiographical account of his discovery of the world of words, Les Mots, without doubt one of his masterpieces. The same can be said of Camus’ last narrative text, La Chute, which mixes autobiography with an ironical account of his philosophy.
Beyond their own personal practice, the existentialists also find philosophical significance in the lives of great artists, and are interested in the moment they chose to become artists and how this primordial choice unfolded over the course of their lives. Artists provide paradigmatic case studies for the paradoxes of “existence” and “expression” (Sartre 1947b, 1971). Indeed, this is true not just of writers and painters but also of actors. For Camus, in fact, actors are those “who draw the best conclusion” from the metaphysical truth of human existence (1942b, 107).
2) The artist’s activity is also deeply significant in terms of its power of articulating a coherent world. Every person has to make existential choices and has a need for expression, but artists present particularly pure and powerful exemplars of these facets of human existence. Their achievements are worthy of admiration because they involve the creation of virtual worlds. Every consciousness, every being-in-the-world is expressive, but only rarely is this expression truly new. Most of the time, human expression is only the repetition of instituted meanings, as in the quasi-automatic use of spoken language. Only the great artists show the power of expression in its purity, its newness and coherence. To recreate a virtual world that can do justice to the complexity of the real world is an almost “miraculous” fact, as Merleau-Ponty says of Cézanne. As we can see, the existentialists are no longer that far from the romantics in what respects their emphasis on genius.
Since the expressive world of a genuine artist is a new perspective onto the world that is identical with the artist’s whole idiosyncratic mode of being-in-the-world, there will be a deep, underlying continuity in his or her work. The communication that the work of art establishes across time and space operates, first and foremost, within the oeuvre itself, with themes and stylistic traits echoing each other throughout it (Camus 1942b, 102–103; Merleau-Ponty 1964b, 67). But there is an inherent fatalism in artistic activity. Expressive activity can only ever be an attempt at expression, and it is structurally doomed to fail because there is too much to reveal in the world. The means of expression are finite, and they operate in a twisted manner, just as much through direct designation as through ellipse and allusion. This leads Camus to conclude that creative activity, like all free activities, is in the end only another absurd attempt at dealing with the absurdity of human life (1942b, 130).
An essential ambiguity characterises also the experience of the audience. On the one hand, the genuine artist creates a new virtual world that expresses a coherent, idiosyncratic perspective on the world shared by all. When the audience meets the artwork successfully, the spectators suddenly change their own mode of perception and have to adopt a new perspective. To use a linguistic metaphor, the tired, instituted language of everyday communication (‘spoken’ or sedimented language) is rejuvenated by a ‘speaking’ language, a true expression that imposes itself on the audience (be it the reader or the spectator). Therefore, the artwork, in a sense, creates its own audience (Merleau-Ponty 1964b, 86, and also 12-13; see also Dufrenne, 1973, 63–71).
Nevertheless there is also an active side to artistic enjoyment, as in reading, for example. Without the spectator’s contemplation, or the reader’s reading, the artwork’s expression remains purely subjective. It becomes objective, manifesting its sense in actuality, only through the symbolic consumption of the audience. This act, however, is not passive: it mobilises the audience’s own power of expression and imagination. Reading, watching, or listening are, as Sartre puts it, “directed creations”: “To write is to make an appeal to the readers that they lead into objective existence the revelation which I (the artist) have undertaken by means of language” (Sartre 1948a, 32; Dufrenne 1973, 47–60). Marcel’s conception of the theatre as an experience of ‘communion’ also implies this active participation of the audience.
The ambiguity of aesthetic experience is linked directly to the above mentioned theory of the negativity of the expressive means. The work of art functions when it is able to define a coherent perspective onto the world, yet this perspective is mainly defined in the negative, as the trace of iterable and consistent attitudes in the world. Therefore, the spectator is required to translate the traces, caesuras and elisions that negatively defined the new world of expression into positive traits: “… the imagination of the spectator has not only a regulative function but a constitutive one. It does not play: it is called upon to recompose the beautiful object beyond the traces left by the artist” (Sartre 1948a, 33).
A metaphor Sartre and Merleau-Ponty employ frequently is that of the two sides of the artwork, comparable to the two sides of a mirror. The artist only sees his or her own work from the inside; he or she lives the artwork in a sense, since the expressive power is rooted in an idiosyncratic form of being-in-the-world. For the work to become an objective entity with a manifest meaning, the understanding and imagination of the audience needs to reconstruct the meaningful silence in between the traces. And this understanding cannot be passive, since the truly expressive meaning involves a new form of being-in-the-world. The spectator or reader is called upon to effectuate the same original mode of being-in-the-world: “If he is a writer, that is, if he knows how to find the ellipses, elisions and caesuras of conduct, the reader will respond to his appeal and meet him at the centre of the imaginary world he animates and rules” (Merleau-Ponty 1964b, 89). Once again, a key feature of aesthetic experience is communication, the ‘echo’ that a subjective attitude to the world finds in others.
This vision of the artwork as a privileged medium of expression and communication (in the substantive, metaphysical senses given to these words in existentialist philosophy) leads to a relatively coherent approach to the different art forms, something like a loose existentialist ‘system of the arts.’ A system of the arts explains not just what art is in essence, seeking a definition of art and determining its social, political or philosophical functions. It also ranks the arts in a hierarchy, giving an account of how each form uses specific material and expressive means to fulfil those functions. In the end, one art-form in particular is usually regarded as privileged, exemplary of the mode of fulfilling the mission of art. All classical philosophical aesthetics, from Kant and his immediate followers to Alain, have presented their own, more or less developed “système des beaux-arts” (Alain 1920, Natanson 1968).
For most of the existentialists, theatre is the prime art form, i.e., the one that best allows the artist to use his or her freedom to create a virtual world that simultaneously appeals to the audience’s own freedom (regardless of how we define that freedom, theologically or politically). For Camus, de Beauvoir, Marcel and Sartre, philosophical activity and recognition as playwrights were intimately linked (Goldthorpe 1986). Marcel defined himself as “philosophe-dramaturge” (philosopher-dramatist, see Lazaron 1978), to insist on what was, for him, an indissoluble unity between philosophical meditation and playwriting. Indeed, it is well worth noting that, apart from de Beauvoir (whose single attempt at writing for the theatre was not very successful [see de Beauvoir 1945b and 1962, 672–673]), they were all equally famous as playwrights and as philosophers in their time.
Arguably, Sartre’s theoretical reflections on the theatre of his time have remained the most widely read today. In describing what were for him the defining features of existentialist theatre, Sartre also aimed to identify some of the main aspects of theatre itself. As these features are grounded in his theory of freedom, theatre is, for Sartre, the art par excellence.
The identification of art in general with the theatre is already evident in the fact that the same word – ‘situation’ – simultaneously encapsulates the metaphysical position of the human being-in-the-world, and summarises theatre’s core aesthetic element (Sartre 1976, 35). The two ‘enemies’ in French existentialism, Sartre and Marcel, agree on the centrality of the concept of ‘situation.’ What is literature? had defined the mission of literature as the attempt “to reveal the world and particularly to reveal man to other men so that the latter may assume full responsibility before the object which has been thus laid bare” (Sartre 1948a, 14). Centred as it is on the praxis of real human beings confronted with the contradictions of concrete situations, theatre is the best medium to present in purified form the tragic responsibility of human freedom, the fact that “we are condemned to be free” in a world inhospitable to our projects.
This emphasis on action and situation leads to a series of highly prescriptive rules, as we see in the criteria that Sartre used in his critical reviews of contemporary theatre writing and production. To rise to the task of achieving a “theatre of situations,” writing and production must resist the temptation of focusing on the characters; they need to present archetypical situations in which human freedom is most radically at stake, notably through different types of universal ‘conflicts of rights.’ Theatre needs to avoid psychology and concentrate on action (in clear contrast to Marcel’s theatre, which is mainly concerned with staging conflicts of inner conscience); it must be wary of a realistic approach that might take the focus away from the violence of the conflicts. For the same reason, the duration of the play and the number of the characters must be reduced. The stage must be empty and the language must be direct but non-realistic, compressing the acuteness of the situation as powerfully as possible. In short, existentialist theatre explicitly intends to return to a Greek conception, attempting to present contemporary “myths” in a world without gods (Sartre 1976).
But the situations, precisely, are situated: they always take place in specific social and political contexts. The myths that the theatre presents, therefore, have two temporal dimensions: 1) Because they are about distinguishing features of human ‘being,’ they have, like Greek and Corneillian tragedy, a transhistorical appeal; they are plays about human freedom in general. This explains the classical bent of many existentialist plays. Thus, it makes perfect sense to stage the conundrums of modern, absurd freedom through the figure of Caligula, as Camus does in one of his most famous plays. 2) The situation is always a specific one, particularly a specific social and political circumstance, with its specific conflict of rights. In the years following the Second World War, the conflict of rights is widely understood as the conflict between liberal rights and the socialist ideal. All the existentialists agreed on this, with the notable exception of Marcel. The ‘communist question’ (of whether to embrace the proposed communist solution to the problems facing the world in 1948—the date of publication of What is Literature?) was one of the most urgent political questions for them. More generally, we can mention the question of the value of individual engagement as opposed to engagement in a collective movement (a question at the centre of Malraux’s novels, notably his Human Condition, which approaches the existentialist aesthetic), and the place of individual freedom in an age of conflict between global forces. These questions were at the forefront of existentialist concerns when they devised their aesthetics, and wrote their plays and novels.
We have noted the similarity between Sartre and Marcel regarding their emphasis on the notion of situation. Although Sartre noted other features of existentialist theatre that formally apply to Marcel’s plays, there are stark differences in their approach to playwriting. Whereas for Sartre the ultimate justification of theatre is political, for Marcel it is metaphysical: it is a question of finding salvation and hope, and safeguarding the possibility of faith. Yet, like Sartre’s, Marcel’s plays staged the specific problems of the age as he saw them, e.g., how the rise of technology brings about a reductive attitude to the world and especially to other human beings, the atrocities of the century, and the moral disorientation of modern individuals. Despite his metaphysical optimism, Marcel’s theatre shares with other existentialist plays a patently sombre mood. He wants to depict “the drama of the soul in exile, of the soul that suffers from its lack of communion with itself and with others” (Preface to Troisfontaines 1953, 35). Marcel’s plays consistently portray a creeping feeling of absurdity that befalls the main characters. It is a forgotten fact that Marcel wrote more plays than any of the other existentialists.
The novel comes very close to theatre as the art-form of choice for the existentialists. For most existentialists, the ultimate models were not philosophers, but contemporary novelists; two of whom were especially paradigmatic, viz., Dostoievsky and Kafka. Sartre, de Beauvoir and Camus saw themselves in equal measure as writers of fiction and as philosophers. They engaged with each other’s fictional work at least as much, if not more, than with their theoretical one (Camus 1938b, 1939, Sartre 1943b). Indeed, as already noted, fiction and autobiographical writings were direct applications of their philosophical visions. “To think is to create a world,” writes Camus, showing the deep identity between philosophical and fictional creation (Camus 1942b, 87–91). The reason is the same as with theatre: narrative fiction, focused on a series of ‘situations’ in which the fundamental existential choices facing human beings can be carefully staged, is a powerful mode of engaging the free imagination of the reader, and thus of calling him or her to action: “What in fact is a novel but a universe in which action is endowed with form?” (Camus 1951, 263). The novel is a revelation of the world, notably in its social and political urgency, by a freedom for other freedoms. As Merleau-Ponty writes in “Metaphysics and the Novel”: “Intellectual works had always been concerned with establishing a certain attitude toward the world, of which literature and philosophy, like politics, are just different expressions; but only now [thanks to existentialist philosophy] has this concern become explicit” (Merleau-Ponty 1945c, 27; see also Camus 1942b, 92 and 1951, 258–267).
In existentialist aesthetics, artistic activity and its products have external aims: to reveal the world to others, both in a metaphysical and political sense. As noted, this aesthetic theory therefore conflicts with the notion that the artwork is an end in itself, or that style and form are self-justified. Thus, the existentialists were deeply suspicious of some of the main artistic movements of the time, particularly Surrealism, even if some of them admired its rebellious spirit (Camus 1951, 88–100); or, later on, the Nouveau Roman (Alain Robbe-Grillet, Nathalie Sarraute and Claude Simon) and the literature that was developed around the post-structuralist journal Tel Quel (de Beauvoir, in Francis and Gontier, 226, 233–234). Compared with Dadaism, Surrealism, and the literary avant-gardes that immediately followed the existentialist era, existentialist aesthetics has an outdated, almost conservative air to it. It unabashedly calls for a new classicism somewhere between formalism and realism (either in its naturalist or socialist versions), and beyond romanticism (Camus 1944 and 1951, 268–271), on the grounds that the moral and political dimensions of literature consist not just in a rebellion against everyday language and the social-political order of the day, but also in the more demanding (yet modest) task of properly naming the world in order to unveil the immense injustice reigning in it, while also retrieving its fleeting and inhuman beauty (Camus 1951, 272–279). In his prolific work as literary critic, Sartre consistently rejected formalism and “art for art’s sake,” even in the case of illustrious French writers such as Mallarmé or Flaubert. However, it can also be argued that, from the perspective of the relation between politics and arts in the 20th century, the existentialist demand that art retain a strong connection to everyday reality (so as to fulfil its moral and political roles) is also completely of its time.
The condemnation of “art for art’s sake” applies to all the arts and has important repercussions for aesthetic critique and the conception of style. The existentialists take great pains to note that their rejection of formalism, purism and autotelism in the arts does not amount to advocating a crude version of realism (Camus 1951, 268–270; Sartre 1948a, 44). As we have noted already in the case of theatre, the classical aspect of existentialist aesthetics impacts on the choice of stylistic means: “One is not a writer for having chosen to say certain things, but for having chosen to say them in a certain way. And to be sure, the style makes the value of the prose. But it should pass unnoticed” (Sartre 1948a, 15).
Furthermore, the existentialist definitions of meaning as negativity, and of expression as ‘coherent distortion’, mean that stylistic achievement (the ability to let new sense be revealed) relies as much on the choice of words and syntax as on the ‘silences’ and omissions that define an expressive gesture.
With their emphasis on action in situations, the existentialists have an uneasy relationship to poetry. Only Camus, following the example of Nietzsche, wrote a number of poems (in his youth writings and his notebooks, Camus 1933, 1935–1941). In many passages in Camus, poetry has a positive connotation. This connotation, however, refers to a specific quality of language, viz., the use of vivid images that manage to convey some truth about the human condition, rather than to the merits of poetry as a specific literary form.
For Sartre, the stance of 19th century novelists who engaged in ‘art for art’s sake’ is not too dissimilar to the problematic way modern poets approach language. In fact, Sartre’s studies on two of the major French poets of the 19th century, Baudelaire and Mallarmé, are tinged with the same disapprobation as his immense study of Flaubert (Sartre 1947b, 1952b, 1971–72). Modern poetry for Sartre is, in the final analysis, a misguided use of language. It uses language as an end in itself, a thing, the same way that a painter uses colour. This ignores the fact that in language the relationship between materiality and signification is the inverse to what is the case in other artistic media. Language is, for the existentialists, the favoured artistic medium because, as the mode of expression that is most directly a medium of signification, it is the one that best reveals a situation as situation in the strong sense, viz., as a part of the world where human freedom is directly engaged metaphysically, ethically and politically. Poets, on the other hand, “are men who refuse to utilise language. Now, since the quest for truth takes place in and by language conceived as a kind of instrument, it is unnecessary to imagine that they aim to discern or expound the true. Nor do they dream of naming the world” (Sartre 1948a, 5). In their use of language, modern poets seem to overlook and act against the main qualities that the existentialists grant it, namely, its representative and communicative powers. This explains why poetry remains at the margins of the existentialist system of the arts, as a literary genre that is not as eminently philosophical and political as the theatre and the novel. The existentialists are, once again, squarely at odds with the surrealists, who condemned the novel and saw in poetry the real artistic medium.
The existentialists made, however, some notable exceptions. Camus, for example, wrote a vibrant review of the work of René Char (Camus 1935–1936), and saw in the work of Francis Ponge an eminent illustration of the task of literature in the absurd situation of post-war France (Camus 1943). Sartre also dedicated a long and largely positive review to the work of Francis Ponge, seeing in it a kind of profane phenomenology (Sartre 1944 in 1947a). This positive assessment might well have rested on a misunderstanding, since Ponge seemed to have had the exact opposite view of language as Sartre, and regarded poetry precisely as the form that would best be able to “name the world” and make human freedom face its responsibility.
The existentialists’ lack of interest in poetry (which, in the case of Sartre especially, turns into outright dismissal) is based on their view that poets make a misguided use of language. For the same reason, the other non-discursive arts attract almost as little interest as poetry (however, see Camus 1951, 257). Yet, when they are discussed, they are treated more favourably than poetry, since they do not have language as their medium, and this means that the accusation against poetry becomes irrelevant. The emphasis on language as the eminent medium for the representation of human freedom reproduces a classical argument that is already at the heart of Hegel’s aesthetics (a fact that the existentialists are fully aware of [Sartre 1948a, 5]). The implication for the other arts is that they are able to produce and convey ideal contents, meaning and beauty, but that these are never as transparently accessed as in linguistic expression. Rather, the ideal content in non-linguistic art-forms remains trapped, glued, as it were, in the materiality of the artwork: “… it is one thing to work with colour and sound, and another to express oneself by means of words. Notes, colours, and forms are not signs. They refer to nothing exterior to themselves. (…) As Merleau-Ponty has pointed out in The Phenomenology of Perception, there is no quality of sensation so bare that it is not penetrated with significance. But the dim little meaning which dwells within it, a light joy, a timid sadness, remains immanent or trembles about like a heat mist; it is colour or sound” (Sartre 1948a, 1).
This seems to introduce some important differences amongst the existentialists, since Merleau-Ponty, for instance, claimed that all art forms function like language. But Merleau-Ponty agrees with Sartre on the important differences between art forms. The Prose of the World established that there was a single source behind all acts of expression, which made them commensurable to language, only to acknowledge the specificity of language in a manner similar to Sartre’s. For example, the “voices” in painting — a metaphor for the ideal content of painting — are ‘voices of silence’ that speak only an ‘indirect language’ (the titles of Malraux’s famous studies on the history of painting). That is to say, they remain attached to their specific materiality, making the work a self-enclosed world. In Merleau-Ponty’s repeated metaphor, every painter starts the history of painting afresh (1960, 309–311) because the same visible world calls for an infinite number of expressive variations, each singular in its determinate coherence. The history of painting, therefore, is indeed made up of constant echoes and criss-crosses, with each generation revisiting the visual themes and techniques of the past generations, but the communication amongst the works are haphazard, indirect, and cannot be accumulated. There is no progress in the history of painting. In language, on the other hand, meanings acquired from the past are sedimented in current meanings and allow for the dialectic of spoken and speaking speech discussed earlier (Merleau-Ponty 1964b, 97-113). This means that the material of literature carries with it the sedimented historical experiences of the lifeworlds it speaks about. There is no progress in literature either, not in a sense comparable to scientific progress, but the novel, simply by using the language of the lifeworld it arises from, is a direct witness of the broader historical narrative in which it is embedded. As a result, it can portray ethical and political situations very powerfully.
Precisely, the poet’s sin is to treat language as though it were a sound or a note; it is to treat language as a thing and to revere its materiality. This ignores the nature of linguistic expression, in which the signs must be traversed towards their signification. The reverse error is that of Paul Klee, who, according to Sartre, uses colour both as sign and as object (1948a, 23). The existentialist system of the arts is ordered according to the Hegelian principle where arts that involve language rule over the others, because they best express human freedom.
In Sartre’s What is Literature? this apparent disdain for the materiality of painting seems at odds with another aesthetic principle of the existentialists, namely, the capacity of art to witness the obtrusiveness of the world, and, in exceptional moments of aesthetic communion, its inhuman beauty. Indeed, in a few, smaller texts of Sartre’s (for example, those he wrote for exhibition openings) he seems to return to this aspect of the artwork, which he himself had so powerfully demonstrated in his first novel. However, it is true that the existentialists are more interested in the ways in which human beings sort out the entanglements of their freedom in the absurd world, than in the depiction of the materiality of that world. Merleau-Ponty’s texts on the ontological grandeur of Cézanne’s painting are not representative of existential aesthetics generally, but reflect only that author’s unique perspective on art and ontology.
Music, which in some classical systems of the arts (in Schopenhauer and Nietzsche, for example) is the highest and most metaphysical, also receives an ambiguous treatment in existentialist aesthetics. In The Myth of Sisyphus, for example, Camus seems to be saying that it is the absurd art par excellence because it realises in the purest form what all art conscious of the absurd should be about, namely, the “triumph of the flesh” in the absence of any ultimate meaning:
… that game the mind plays with itself according to set and measured laws takes place in the sonorous compass that belongs to us and beyond which the vibrations nevertheless meet in an inhuman universe. There is no purer sensation. (…) The absurd man recognises as his own these harmonies and these forms (Camus 1942b, 91).
Marcel often emphasised the extent to which music had played a significant role in his philosophical inspiration. He was famous for his improvisations on classical 19th century poems, which his wife noted after the Second World War. We saw earlier that Sartre in a famous passage of Nausea had described an encounter with jazz music in a café as a sublime experience in which the beautiful inner coherence of the musical flow transcended for a moment the nauseating meaninglessness of the material world. And note also de Beauvoir’s late enthusiasm for music (in Francis and Gontier 1979, 67).
Despite these descriptions of music as a privileged meaningful experience in an absurd world, none of the existentialists has undertaken any sustained analysis on the relationship between music, philosophy and the existential condition. Camus interprets positively the formality of music, its lack of discursivity and the abstraction of its relation to the world of flesh (see also his early essay in Camus 1935–1936), features that the latter Merleau-Ponty interprets negatively; but, in the end, the existentialist writers do not give music any detailed consideration.
The most puzzling aspect about the existentialists’ systems of the arts is their relative lack of interest, in their most famous writings at least, in cinema, the privileged art form of the 20th century. Of all the arts, this would have been the one that would appear to have truly been able to present ‘situations.’
In the case of Sartre, this is all the more surprising given the intimate association of Sartre with cinema at many points in his life. Several passages in de Beauvoir’s and Sartre’s autobiographical writings attest to their shared enthusiasm for the new art (Sartre 1964). The profound influence of film on the young Sartre is well documented in his early writings, where he demonstrates great sensitivity towards the formal and political potentialities of the new medium, in contrast to most of the French intelligentsia of the time (Sartre 1924, 1931). Indeed, these early texts credit cinema with precisely the same capacities of expression that are later granted to theatre, such as the capacity to present action, the necessary yet ambiguous necessity of engagement and the capacity of artistic expression to represent the masses to the masses. Literary criticism has established to what extent Sartre attempted to reproduce in literary form the techniques employed by cinema in the representation of time, space and internal states of consciousness, and specifically how such an influence was crucial in his first major work, Nausea (Johnson 1984).
During the war, Sartre was employed as a script writer by a production company for whom he wrote eight scripts. Two of these were published after the war (Sartre 1947c, 1948b), and two of them were filmed. Most of these scripts provided the material for Sartre’s plays and novels when their realisation failed. In 1958, he also wrote two scripts for films on Freud and Joseph Le Bon. Sartre also wrote twelve articles on film in total, notably a critique of Citizen Kane in 1945, which inspired a response by André Bazin that was to become one of his most famous essays (Bazin 1947). De Beauvoir also recounts the deep impact that the cinematic experience had on Sartre’s ontological views. According to her, the cinematic representation of human actions hostage to the world’s power of resistance was a crucial source of inspiration for his mature ontology, notably for his vision of the absurdity inherent in the world’s contingency (de Beauvoir 1960).
Despite this intimate connection with cinema, the enthusiasm that is apparent in the early texts receded in the background after his discovery of phenomenology in 1933, following his study year in Germany (de Beauvoir 1962, 231). After that date, cinema no longer features as an important art form in his aesthetic writings. Indeed, in a 1958 conference, Sartre explicitly ranks theatre above cinema because it “has more freedom,” as “a film depicts men who are in the world and are conditioned by it,” whereas “theatre presents action by a man on the stage to men in the audience, and, through this action, both the world he lives in and the performer of the action” (Sartre 1976, 60–61). In other words, theatre is the true art of freedom in situations. Similarly, in later years, de Beauvoir explicitly ranked the novel over cinema for its capacity to “materialise the presence of human beings to human beings” (de Beauvoir quoted in Francis and Gontier 1979, 200). As with the Nouveau Roman, Sartre and de Beauvoir were quite reserved towards the Nouvelle Vague, the new French cinema of the 1960s (ibid.).
Rather than Sartre, it is Merleau-Ponty who gave the most lucid exposition of the evident link between cinema and existentialist philosophy in a conference at the National School of Cinema in Paris (1947b). Despite this insightful text, however, compared with the eminent philosophical status that is bestowed upon theatre, the novel, and painting for the late Merleau-Ponty, as the truly “metaphysical” art forms, cinema is remarkably absent from the most important existentialist writings in aesthetics.
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