Notes to Absolute and Relational Theories of Space and Motion

1. Descartes held that all other properties arise from the configurations and motions of such bodies — from geometric complexes. See Garber 1992 for a comprehensive study.

2. Norton (1995) offers an extensive discussion of the two interpretations possible for Mach's discussion of inertia, arguing that on balance it seems most likely that Mach advocated only a reformulation of Newtonian mechanics — i.e., what we are calling "Mach-lite".

3. Many authors have differentiated the Galilean relativity principle from the Special Principle of Relativity, on the grounds that the meaning of "frame of reference" changes with the introduction of the latter theory. The Special Principle is thus sometimes equated with the assertion of the Lorentz covariance of physical laws. But Brown (2005) convincingly argues that the Special Principle properly speaking — the principle introduced by Einstein and used in the derivation of the Lorentz transformations — is in fact exactly the same as Galileo's.

4. Special relativity applies the Galilean relativity principle to electromagnetic theory. Since the speed of light is determined by basic equations of that theory, if the relativity principle is to hold, we can conclude that the speed of light must be the same for observers in any inertial frame, regardless of the velocity of the light's source. This is profoundly counter-intuitive, once one explores what it means. Three of the immediate consequences of the constancy of light's velocity are the relativity of simultaneity, length contraction (apparent shortening, in the direction of motion, of rapidly moving objects), and time dilation (apparent slowing down of fast-moving clocks). We can explain an instance of the first phenomenon here, using an example first crafted by Einstein. Suppose a fast-moving train is passing a signal light on the ground. Just as the center of the car you are in passes the lamp, it emits a flash of red light. Since you know the speed of light is a fixed constant c in inertial frames, and you are in an inertial frame, you conclude that the flash of light arrives simultaneously at the back and the front of your train car. The two arrival events, for you, are simultaneous. But now consider how an observer standing next to the signal lamp on the ground views events. The light travels at the same speed c toward the back of the train and toward the front. But the train is moving, fast, forward. So the light will reach the rear of your car first, and then the forward-going light rays, having to catch up to the rapidly advancing front, will arrive some time later. That is: for the observer on the ground, the two events (light arrives at back of car; light arrives at front) are definitely not simultaneous. And if the Special Principle of relativity is to be taken seriously, we must admit that neither observer's perspective is “correct”; judgment that two events in different locations are “simultaneous” is simply relative – relative to state of motion, or reference frame. (The other two surprising effects just mentioned can be deduced from similarly simple thought-experiments, but we will not do so here.) For a complete introduction to special relativity, the reader may wish to look at one of the following reliable web-based tutorials:

5. This is perhaps an unfair description of the later theories of Lorentz, which were exceedingly clever and in which most of the famous "effects" of STR (e.g., length contraction and time dilation) were predicted. See Brown 2005 for a sympathetic philosophical exposition of such precursors to STR.

6. “Something like” must be understood in a fairly loose sense; GTR by itself cannot model the chemical reactions that drive a rocket, for example, nor the solid material body of the rocket itself. What seems clear from studies of both existence theorems and numerical methods is that a large number of as-yet unexplored solutions exist that display “absolute accelerations” (especially rotations) of a kind that Mach's Principle was intended to rule out. See Living Reviews in Relativity for review articles covering these issues.

7. The claim that length contraction and time dilation are, in a sense, not real effects at all, is not meant to deny the reality of phenomena such as the net time dilation of the Twin Paradox, or indeed to deny the reality of the results of applying certain measurement protocols to bodies in motion, vs. applying them to the same bodies at rest. What this view maintains is that there is an important sense in which the “moving” body does not really contract. Indeed, there is a corresponding, important sense in which the moving body is not really “moving”. That’s the point of the relativity of inertial motion: there is no fact of the matter about whether a particular non-accelerating object is “really” moving or not; from the perspective of one set of frames it is not, and from the perspective of other frames it is (with a velocity that is, in turn, obviously frame-relative.) The difference in time ticked off on the clocks of the twins in the Twin Paradox is intrinsic and not frame-relative, and corresponds to the intrinsic length difference between two different paths in spacetime that begin and end at the same points. That clocks in relative (and inertial) motion run slow with respect to each other is, by contrast, a merely perspectival, frame-dependent phenomenon.

Copyright © 2015 by
Nick Huggett <>
Carl Hoefer <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]