Notes to Singularities and Black Holes

1. A generalized affine parameter is defined as follows. Fix a curve on spacetime and an arbitrary zero point; fix as well an orthonormal frame at the zero point, i.e., a basis for the vector space of tangent vectors at the point comprising four mutually orthogonal vectors (one timelike and three spacelike) each of unit length. Now, propagate this frame along the curve parallel to itself with respect to the affine structure of spacetime. The tangent vector to the curve can be written at each point as a weighted sum of the vectors in the frame at that point, the weighting factors being the components of the tangent vector in the coordinate system the frame defines in the tangent space over the point. We can define in this tangent space the Euclidean length of the vector by the standard formula in terms of the coordinate system, which will always be a positive number for a non-zero vector. The generalized affine parameter at that point, then, is the ordinary integral of those Euclidean lengths of the tangent vectors along the curve starting from the zero point. It is, in other words, just the ordinary, necessarily positive length of the curve according to the Euclidean distance function the family of orthonormal frames determines.

2. Certain gravitational plane wave spacetimes provide good examples of this phenomenon: an observer traveling along the incomplete timelike geodesic constituting the singular structure would experience unbounded tidal acceleration, whereas any observer traveling arbitrarily close by would not (Ellis and Schmidt 1977).

3. This occurs in Taub-NUT (Newman, Unti and Tamburino) spacetime. See Hawking and Ellis (1973, pp. 170-178) for a technical exposition of the spacetime. Misner (1967) offers a delightful guide to the menagerie of exuberant weirdness this spacetime manifests.

4. Hayward (1994a) has offered a generalized definition of a black hole, not requiring any of the special global structures that the traditional definition relies on. Hayward defines a black hole in terms of what he calls a trapping horizon, roughly speaking a surface on which all inward-directed light rays are converging and all outward-directed light rays are instantaneously parallel to it, trying to capture the idea that a black hole is a surface at which the gravitational intensity is such that not even light can escape: any light ray incident on the surface the smallest bit inward will get sucked in, and any ray incident on the surface perfectly tangent to it will remain there endlessly. This definition has the virtue that the boundary of the black hole now has clear, local physical significance: an observer could determine when she crossed it by making only local measurements. Perhaps one of the most intriguing aspects of Hayward's definition is that a black hole would no longer necessarily be a region of no escape: an observer entering the trapped region could later escape it. (Hayward 1994b).

Copyright © 2009 by
Erik Curiel <>
Peter Bokulich

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]