Notes to Sociobiology

1. They are also referred to as “evolutionary psychology” with a lower case “e” and “p” by Buller (2005); this terminology is not used in this article because of its tendency to underplay the difference between the psychological focus of the so called “Santa Barbara school” of evolutionary psychology and the behavioral focus of human behavioral ecology.

2. A local fitness currency is a property of an organism or its environment that reliably correlates with the fitness of that organism (e.g. the quantity of food collected by the organism per unit time, the number of mating opportunities presented to an organism, etc.)

3. Note that there are common exceptions to this, in particular, frequency dependent models such as ESS models do not predict a single, most adaptive trait at fixation but a variety of different strategies at different frequencies in the population under study.

4. In this “Pop Sociobiology” literature, Kitcher includes Wilson’s On Human Nature and the first and last chapters of Sociobiology, but also works by authors such as Richard Alexander, Robert Trivers, Richard Dawkins, Pierre van den Berghe, David Barash and Napoleon Chagnon (Kitcher, 1985, 15). For reasons of space and relative importance, this discussion will focus on Wilson.

5. This is perhaps the fairest description of what the Pop Sociobiologists were about; for another sociobiologist explicit about the speculative nature of this work on humans at the time see Barash (1977, Chapter 10).

6. Kitcher (1985) takes Wilson’s discussion of the lability of human behavior to be a description of the content of Wilson’s “genetic determinism”; however, Wilson seems to be using it as evidence for his view, rather than as the content of it.

7. The earliest reference to this possibility the author has found is in Barash (1977, 281-282), in other words, this was recognized by an early “Pop” Sociobiologist!

8. There is of course a weaker sense in which such cultural traits might be considered to be adaptations, in that they have been spread by a process that spread traits that assist their possessors (human beings) at the expense of traits that do not. They might also be considered “second order adaptations”, in that it is possible that the selective learning mechanisms which help differentially transmit useful cultural traits might themselves be adaptations, and for the purpose of spreading and acquiring adaptive cultural traits for their possessors. However, cultural traits so transmitted can't be studied using standard evolutionary models: special cultural evolutionary models are required instead.

9. Of course, the question about whether TIT FOR TAT is an ESS is more complicated than this; for example, altruists can easily invade a population of TIT FOR TAT players, and then this population can be reinvaded by defectors. This is a question for a different entry, however.

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Catherine Driscoll <>

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