Supplement to Social Ontology

This is a supplementary document to the entry Social Ontology. The bibliography for this supplement is included in the main entry’s bibliography.


A.1 Ancient Philosophers on Nature Versus Agreement

Ancient Greek inquiries into the nature of social phenomena introduced questions that remain active today: Which features of the world are products of humans or society, and which are products of nature? What does it mean to say that something is a social creation?

A central concern of Sophism, a school of Greek thought in the fifth century BCE, is the contrast between nature (phusis) and custom, law, habit, or convention (nomos). They debate, for instance, the sources of justice: Does justice arise from nature and innate human inclinations? Or, instead, is justice a product of the customs of the cities we inhabit?

Sophist responses to these questions depend on their views of how nature and law/custom are related to one another. Protagoras, for instance, sees law/custom as part of the natural order, developed for the preservation of society and the perpetuation of the species (Plato, Protagoras 320c–328a). Antiphon, on the other hand, argues for a fundamental difference between law/custom and nature. The decrees of nomoi, he writes, are

the products of agreement, not of natural growth, whereas those of phusis are the products of natural growth, not of agreement. (Antiphon DK 87A44a)

In his view, law and nature may conflict with one another. When they do, human law causes suffering since it interferes with the natural order. Still other Sophists hold that laws/customs come in different types. Those produced by human agreement are flawed, because they conflict with nature. Good laws/customs, in these views, are a product of the divine order (Heraclitus DK 22B114), or of the agreement of the gods (Plato, Euthyphro 9e). Similar debates also form the heart of ancient discussions of the nature of language (e.g., Plato’s Cratylus), and money (e.g., Aristotle, Politics 1.8–10; Paulus, Pandects 18.1).

These ancient inquiries explore the mix between natural and human contributions in the construction of familiar features of the world. They do not, however, theorize much about exactly what people do in order to create the social world. Instead, they speak of agreements, compacts, conventions, habits, laws, customs, and so on, without paying particular notice to separating these from one another. This tendency continues with later authors and their analysis of other social phenomena that are assumed to be included within the law. Augustine, for instance, writing in the fifth century CE, discusses the problem of the private ownership of property. He argues that property ownership is not justified on the basis of God’s law, but rather is a product of the laws agreed to in that society. In his view, ownership—like the rest of human law—is a product of human agreement (Tractate on the Gospel of John, 6.25).

A.2 Early Modern Debates on the Sources of Social Entities

The central concern in early modern debates over the social echoed that of the ancients: what are the sources of social entities and phenomena? But theories of these sources broadened considerably, as did the variety of social phenomena being investigated. Early modern theorists also laid the foundations for a new inquiry that blossomed in later centuries—not into the sources of social phenomena, but into their constituents or building blocks.

A.2.1 Hobbes: the commonwealth as a product of covenants

Hobbes, in Leviathan (1651), addresses the nature of the state or commonwealth, among other topics. He argues that a stable commonwealth is generated by covenants among all the people in a society. A covenant, according to Hobbes, is a contract that involves performance into the future, while a contract is a voluntary agreement between two people to transfer rights to one another. A commonwealth is generated by every person forming the covenant with every other to transfer their future rights of self-governance to a sovereign.

Hobbes thus analyzes the stable commonwealth in terms of a particular form of agreement. Hobbes’s analysis is reflexive: the people who institute the commonwealth are those who are members of the commonwealth. Hobbes also provides an analysis of agreement, a crucial part of which is to explain what makes agreements binding. An agreement is valid, he argues, only if there is an external power to enforce it. That is, someone external to the parties has enough power over them to force compliance with the agreement’s terms.

Central to Hobbes’ account is the development of a commonwealth from a “state of nature”, the anarchic time prior to the formation of the social covenants. The notion of a state of nature, as well as challenges to it, influence the subsequent development of social ontology. One controversy is over the role a history of the development of a social entity plays in accounts of its nature. Hume 1748 denies the plausibility of Hobbes’ history of the formation of the commonwealth. And even if the historical account were true, an account of the development of the commonwealth seems to be distinct from an account of the nature or the sources of the norms of a commonwealth. Another controversy is over the picture of individual people as being “non-social” or “pre-social” parties to a covenant. More contemporary theorists have questioned both the historical truth and even the conceptual possibility of “pre-social” people as the building blocks of society (Macpherson 1962, Okin 1989; see also sections A.3.2, 3.1, and 3.2).

A.2.2 Pufendorf and Hume: products of convention

As an alternative to ‘compact’ or ‘agreement,’ the legal theorist Samuel Pufendorf, in De Officio Hominis et Civis of 1673, uses the term ‘convention’ as the basis for law and language. He argues that conventions do not need be explicitly formed or agreed to. Instead, we can have tacit conventions—i.e., conventions that we may not even be aware we have.

Pufendorf also differs from his predecessors when it comes to what conventions accomplish. He does not merely speak of a convention as an agreement to cooperate or act in some way. Instead, by putting conventions in place, we create new features of the social world. For instance, Pufendorf holds that one kind of property ownership has its source in tacit convention. We have the tacit convention that the first person to occupy a piece of virgin soil becomes its owner. Without the convention, the first person to occupy a piece of virgin soil is no more than an occupant. The convention, however, generates new social institution: a form of ownership according to which being first occupant suffices to make a person an owner (De Officio, XII, 2).

Hume greatly advances the analysis of convention and of social phenomena in terms of it (Hume 1740, Book III). He expands the scope of convention to include a wide variety of social entities—not only law, property, and language, but also money, government, justice, and promises. Hume is also the first to provide a sophisticated analysis of convention. In his view, convention consists of each member of a community having a sense of common interest with others, recognizing that other people have that sense as well, and all of them acting in common ways to benefit public utility. Hume thus analyzes convention in terms of the attitudes and actions of individuals, and his analysis accommodates tacit as well as explicit conventions.

A.2.3 Filmer and Locke: products of God and Nature

Other early modern philosophers root the social world in the natural—both in divine commandment and in human nature. Robert Filmer, a seventeenth century monarchist, argues in Patriarcha (1680) that the state is a family. This implies, according to Filmer, that state authority is no different from the authority of a father over his family. Patriarchal authority is divinely sanctioned, as recorded in the commandments of the Bible. The authority of kings over their subjects is identical, he argues: it is inherited from the paternity of Adam, who begat a large family and then passed authority to a succession of leaders. Thus the absolute authority of monarchs, for Filmer, is rooted in the divinely established natural order. This analysis extends to the nature of laws and property. The monarch may choose to institute laws for practical purposes, just as a father may institute rules for a household. And the monarch may grant property rights to subjects. But those laws and rights consist in nothing more than the will of the monarch and may be overridden whenever the monarch chooses.

Locke’s Two Treatises on Government (1689) sharply criticize Filmer and provide a competing analysis, though Locke, too, sees God and nature as the sources of the state and of property. Locke rejects Filmer’s comparison of the state with a family, arguing instead that political authority has its source in the natural rights of each individual created equally. Moreover, private property cannot be derived from the state, according to Locke, since we establish civil society for the very purpose of protecting property rights. The source of property, for Locke, is the natural rights of each individual. Among the rights arising from God’s creation are self-ownership and, hence, ownership of one’s own labor. When a person performs labor on a part of the world, the labor mixes with that part and joins to become one with it. Since people own their own labor, the part of the world mixed with labor thus becomes the person’s property.

A.2.4 Locke: products of the individual mind

Locke’s theory of “nominal essence” is important for a number of contemporary approaches to social ontology, even though Locke does not himself associate nominal essences with the social world in particular. A nominal essence is a definition of a species or sort of thing, which people assemble in their minds out of ideas. Individuals generate these definitions when they observe things in the world and classify them according to their apparent similarities. For instance, a person might observe different marital statuses among men, and use those observed qualities to define the sort or species bachelor. The essential conditions for something to be a bachelor, for that person, are just what the person has defined them to be: that person’s species bachelor is “the workmanship of the understanding” (see the entry on Locke on real essences). In Locke’s view, all sorts or species have nominal essences: he does not single out those things that are products of people or society. Several contemporary philosophers, however, distinguish natural kinds (e.g., water, gold) from non-natural kinds (e.g., bachelor, nation), and employ a Locke-style approach with regard to the non-natural kinds. (See Schwartz 1980, Abbott 1989, Marconi 2013. Debates on this were sparked by Kripke 1972 and Putnam 1975. Putnam 1975 and Kornblith 1980 oppose the nominal kinds approach.)

Nominal essences, in Locke’s approach, are generated mentalistically: they are formed from the association of ideas in the mind. Moreover, they are generated individualistically: a nominal essence defined by any given person is fully defined by that person’s own mental states. Although two people might have the same definition for bachelor, the species for each person is the product of that person’s own ideas. In this sense, Locke’s approach is not social: it takes a nominal essence to be the product of an individual’s own mental states.

A.2.5 The implicit distinction between constituents and sources

In these theories, we see Locke pursuing two distinct inquiries, both of which are pertinent to the nature of social entities. One is an inquiry into the constituents of social entities, and the other is an inquiry into the sources of social categories. Consider, for instance, the two parts of Locke’s discussion of nominal essence. First, to be a member of a species (such as the species bachelor) consists of a person having certain properties (i.e., being unmarried and being a man). Second, the sources of that species are the associations of ideas in the conceiver’s mind. Both of these are aspects of the “ontology” or “metaphysics” of bachelor. Being unmarried is part of what it is to be a bachelor—not just a cause of being a bachelor—despite the fact that marriage is a process that takes place over time. (See section 2.2 for discussion of causal versus ontological relations). Similarly, the association of ideas is a metaphysical reason, not just a causal one, for the species bachelor to have the essence it does.

A similar distinction between constituents and sources is implicit in Locke’s account of property: ownership consists in having one’s labor historically mixed with parts of the world; and the source of that method for establishing property is the nature of people as they are created (Second Treatise, 27). (See sections 2.3, 3, and 4 for contemporary theories of constituents vs. sources of social entities.)

A.3 Individuals, Aggregates, and Wholes

Advances in science and interest in political governance led Enlightenment theorists to draw analogies between the traditional domains of science—such as heavenly bodies, chemicals, and organisms—and the newly salient domains of economies and societies. The push to develop a science of society motivates a different emphasis in social ontology, as compared to earlier theories. Whereas ancient and early modern theorists largely investigated the sources or generators of social entities, these theorists devoted more attention to analyzing social entities into their constituent parts.

A.3.1 Aggregates and social order

In The Spirit of the Laws (1748), Montesquieu theorizes about cultural differences between nations or societies as a whole. He argues that nations have characters, over which generalizations can be drawn. At the same time, however, nations are implicitly understood to be aggregates of individual people. The effects of climate on the characters of European nations, for instance, is analyzed in terms of the effects of climate on individual people who are the parts of those nations.

The picture of societies as aggregates of individuals is taken up by philosophers in the Scottish Enlightenment. To it, they add the idea of spontaneous order: social order, they argue, arises from aggregates of individuals interacting with one another, even if the individuals did not plan the order. “Nations stumble on establishments”, Adam Ferguson (1767) writes, “which are indeed the result of human action, but not the execution of any human design”. Adam Smith (1776) explores this in connection with economic growth, arguing that economic benefits in the aggregate arise from the interactions of self-interested individuals.

Later attempts to develop a rigorous science of the social world also employ a similar picture of the components of society. J.S. Mill builds on Comte 1830–1842 to argue that social science is a branch of psychology. Society, according to Mill, is the aggregate of human minds, and the topic of the social sciences is to derive laws governing such aggregates (Mill 1843 VI, VII, 1). Altogether, his approach to social phenomena is “psychologistic”: he takes social phenomena to be built exclusively out of psychological states of individual people. (The interpretation and expansion of psychologism becomes an important topic in twentieth century individualism; see sections 3.1 and 3.2.)

Spencer (1895) also argues that society is an aggregate of individuals, and that social science is the study of laws of such aggregates. Spencer combines this with the claim that societies are organisms, much like biological ones. The “laws” of evolution apply to societies, in his view, and can be derived from the characteristics of individuals.

A.3.2 Culture and holism

The historicist tradition in eighteenth and nineteenth century German philosophy inverts the relation between individuals and societies. Rather than seeing individuals as primary, these philosophers stress the primacy of societies, with individuals a product of the societies in which they are brought up. (This view too has ancient origins; see Aristotle, Politics 1253a.)

Herder argues that human perception, thought, and action depend on language. And language, in his view, is fundamentally social:

Go into the age, into the clime, the whole history, feel yourself into everything—only now are you on the way towards understanding the word. (Herder 1774; also see Herder 1769 & 1772)

Like his predecessors, Herder argues that cultures possess characters, affecting how the cultures act overall, but in Herder’s view, historical explanation requires treating societies as unified entities, and regarding individuals as products of society.

Herder’s assertion that individuals are products of society is a causal claim about how individuals come to be the way they are, rather than an ontological claim about society being metaphysically fundamental to or constitutive of the individual (Forster 2010). Despite insisting that individual perception, thought, and action depend on language, Herder does not view these as being “built out of” social constituents. Instead, he takes language to be internal to individual minds, and argues that language (and correspondingly perception, thought and action) are causally affected by society. Individuals are profoundly affected by the cultures in which they are raised, to the extent that it makes little sense to admit the possibility of a normally functioning Hobbesian pre-social individual. Still, that is not the same as the ontological claim that individuals are literally constituted in part by society.

Hegel, in contrast, does make that explicitly ontological claim. To be a self, according to Hegel, involves self-consciousness. And this is not something that an individual can possess independently of others. Instead, self-consciousness depends on our having a sense of ourselves as individuals as distinct from others, which in turn depends on our interacting with other people (i.e., recognizing other people and being recognized by them) (Hegel 1807 Secs. 176, 184).

Hegel also develops the idea, following Hölderlin, of a “World-Soul” or universal human spirit, of which individual actions are a manifestation. Hegel deduces the existence of this universal spirit from the idealist argument that objects are created by consciousness, together with the observation that the objects of our experience are shared among all people (Solomon 1985). Hegel’s universal spirit is sometimes used as an example of “ontological holism”—i.e., the claim that social entities are fundamental, independent, or autonomous entities, as opposed to being derived from individuals or non-social entities (Taylor 1975, Rosen 1984). The accuracy of this reading of Hegel is debated among Hegel scholars (see Hartmann 1972, Pippin 1989, Brandom 2001, Beiser 2005, Horstmann 2006, Kreines 2015). Fairly or not, Hegel was widely interpreted in this way in his own time and subsequently. Feuerbach 1843, for instance, accuses Hegel of postulating the existence of ghostly things, and a metaphysical reading of Hegel exerted a strong influence on T.H. Green and other British idealists.

A.3.3 Crowds and social facts

Popular revolts—and anxieties about mass movements—in the nineteenth century sparked interest in the nature of crowds. Crowd theorists, including Taine 1887, Ferri 1884, Sighele 1891, and Le Bon 1895 argued that people are radically transformed when they gather into a crowd. They ascribe mental properties, such as impetuousness and irrationality, to crowds as a whole. Tarde 1890 postulated mechanisms by which crowds acquire these characteristics, by way of the psychology of individuals and interactions among people. The most famous of these was his “law of imitation”, according to which behaviors propagate among groups by starting with a person of influence, who is then imitated by others whether or not they are conscious of doing so.

Durkheim 1894 challenged these explanations, arguing that such individualistic laws cannot be adequate to explain crowd psychology or other social phenomena. Crowds do not become menacing, according to Durkheim, because individuals transform from well-mannered citizens into irrational beasts. Instead, the power of the crowd exerts a coercive influence on individuals. More generally, Durkheim argues that “social facts” are autonomous of individuals and have the power to constrain and affect their actions.

In social ontology, Tarde is often seen as a representative of “individualism” and Durkheim of “holism” regarding the social world, and their positions remain a touchstone for contemporary debates (see section 3). But it is controversial how to characterize Durkheim’s view in particular. See Lukes 1985, Greenwood 2003, Borch 2012, Zahle & Collin 2014a.

A.4 The Construction of Social Categories

The views discussed in section A.3 largely address the parts or constituents of social entities. Nineteenth century social criticism also reopened the question of the sources of social categories, suggesting radically new approaches. Critics began to scrutinize commonplace categories—often ones that we employ in our daily practices—revealing that they have darker (or at least richer) underpinnings than we realize. Their approaches raise questions about the motivations for using these categories, as well as their nature and metaphysical sources.

A.4.1 Marxism and reification

In a section of Capital titled “The Fetishism of Commodities and the Secret Thereof”, Karl Marx argues that certain social categories that might appear natural are in fact the products of social and economic relations among people. A commodity, such as gold or coal or corn, has some natural properties, as well as some properties that are obviously attached to them by people. A commodity’s value is, according to Marx, a product of the labor it takes to produce it. The social character of individual labor, though, is hidden (Marx 1867). It might seem that a bushel of corn, as a component of our economic system, is a product of a farmer working the land. But Marx argues that commodities can only be understood in terms of social structures as a whole.

Marx also argues that the sources of these structures are neither intellectual nor psychological. Instead, the ideological features of a society are determined by the material relations among people in that society, including technologies, systems of production, and relations of power.

Marx himself is largely interested in describing these structures and the interactions among them. The discussion of commodities is a rare instance of an ontological claim by Marx. Subsequent philosophers, however, put claims of the constructedness of social entities at the center of social critique. Lukács 1923 argues that capitalism extensively “reifies” social entities—that is, it turns phenomena that arise from an oppressive economic system into features of the world that we regard as natural. Members of the Frankfurt School, especially Theodor Adorno and Max Horkheimer, build on Lukács to argue not just that the social world becomes “second nature” to us, but that the reification itself is part of the maintenance of the reified system. That is, our current social order is maintained, at least in part, by the causal effects of our treating social entities and categories as if they were natural (Adorno & Horkheimer 1947, Adorno 1966).

Uncovering social categories becomes a centerpiece of subsequent social criticism. If oppressive structures are to be dismantled, the social nature of the everyday world first needs to be revealed. The work of the Frankfurt School in particular influenced contemporary feminist and race theory (see section 5.4).

A.4.2 Historical construction and genealogies of social categories

Nietzsche employs a historical or “genealogical” method in On the Genealogy of Morals (1887) to critique the basic categories of Christian morality. Challenging the idea that this morality is basic to human nature, he argues that prevailing moral categories were tools intentionally wielded in a struggle for power. Ideals of humility and self-denial, for instance, were introduced by leaders of a resentful population to undermine the aristocratic values of Greco-Roman society. In Nietzsche’s account, the sources of such categories are largely cognitive and intentional, as opposed to arising from material relations, as they do in Marx’s account.

Social critics widely deploy genealogical methods to call into question social categories that are commonly taken to be natural or innocuous. Freud, for instance, argues that human interest in justice originates in childhood envy, and that monotheism originates in a purported conflict between Moses and the Israelites (Freud 1921, 1939). Michel Foucault writes genealogies of contemporary categories of punishment, sexuality, and the development of the self, among others. Foucault 1977a describes the contingency and the political influences that lie behind how we think about criminality and imprisonment.

A fundamental worry about genealogy is whether it actually says anything about the nature of social categories: Can genealogy reveal the true or hidden character of morality, justice, religion, punishment, or sexuality? Or does it merely give us a story of origins? After all, every category, natural and unnatural alike, has a history of how it developed. Why should it should matter if the history is deplorable? (For challenges and defenses, see Foucault 1977b, Geuss 1981, Salmon 1984, Schacht 1994, Gutting 2005, Epstein 2010, Koopman 2013).

Copyright © 2018 by
Brian Epstein <brian.epstein@tufts.edu>

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