Skeptical Theism

First published Sat Jan 25, 2014

Skeptical theism is a strategy for bringing human cognitive limitations to bear in reply to arguments from evil against the existence of God.

This entry will consider the four most prominent forms of skeptical theism. Though these strategies are presented in roughly historical order, each strategy is still embodied in ongoing conversations in the philosophical literature.

1. The Problem of Evil and Skeptical Theism's Skepticism

This section sketches the argument from evil and the skeptical theist's skepticism (or, sometimes, “agnosticism,” as in Alston (1996, 98) Howard-Snyder (2009, 18)).

1.1 The Problem of Evil

We will say that an evil, E, is “pointless” or “unjustified” if and only if there is no all-things-considered sufficient reason for God to allow it (not even a non-specific or indirect reason, such as that E occurred by chance as a result of a random process that God saw that it was best to allow). One standard kind of sufficient reason to allow an evil, E, would be a great enough good, G, such that it is permissible for God to allow (or risk allowing) E and G to occur. Further, E's occurring makes sufficiently probable the occurrence of G, and E and G is more valuable than ~E and ~G. Another standard kind of reason considered in the literature for allowing E is that allowing E (or something equally bad or worse) to occur is logically necessary for achieving some greater good G or the avoiding of some equally bad or worse evil. Such goods can be conceived to exist whether or not there is a God, so the existence of pointless evils is, as far as anything said thus far goes, consistent with atheism. These terms are intended to be understood so that a bad state of affairs can be pointless or unjustified for a God whether or not there is a God.

Since on the present notion of pointlessness, the existence of unjustified evil is not compatible with the existence of God–that is, no possible world contains both God and unjustified evil–we can set forth a very simple template for an idealized, generalized argument from evil that can take many forms when fleshed out to various degrees in various ways.

Theological Premise: Necessarily, if there is a God, there are no pointless evils.

Empirical Premise: There are pointless evils.

Conclusion: There is no God.

There are two main ways the empirical premise can be justified. First, it could be an inference from the obvious existence of inscrutable evils. Inscrutable evils are evils such that one can discern no sufficient reason for allowing them, even after careful examination. This is like a sampling argument: no observed goods have been good enough to justify certain evils, so probably no evil at all is. Second, it could be defended by reference to particular examples of evil, especially very terrible evils, where it just seems obvious the evils are unjustified. The version of the argument from evil which has received the most attention is that of William Rowe (1979, 1988, 1991, 1995, 1996, 2006; see also Trakakis 2007), who offered the sampling argument from evil. The four principal forms of skeptical theism below were formulated primarily in response to Rowe's arguments. Whether they can be extended to other arguments like that of Draper (1989/1996) or Tooley (Tooley and Plantinga 2008) or Dougherty (2008) will be briefly discussed in Section 6 of this article.

Rowe's main line of defense for the empirical premise is the existence of evils which seem pointless (inscrutable evils). Seeming pointless has at times been interpreted as a direct insight and at other times as resulting from an inference (Rowe 1979 and the early literature treats it both ways). A fair way to represent the inference is as a kind of simple induction of the sampling variety concerning some given terrible evil E.

Premise: All possible reasons examined for allowing E so far have turned out to be insufficient to justify God permitting them.

Conclusion: There is no justification for E.

The Empirical Premise is just an existential generalization of this conclusion. This is an example of a kind of inference that has come to be called the “Noseeum Inference” after the bugs in the Midwest which are so small one never seems to find them in one's tent, even when one knows they're there (Wykstra 1996). Here is why that name has been applied. Skeptical theists point out that absence of evidence is not always evidence of absence. Some entities are such that their presence is expected to be detected, others their presence is not expected to be detected. If there were a grizzly bear in one's camp, one expects to find it, so not seeing one is evidence one is not there. But it is otherwise with small bugs. One's not seeing them in one's camp is not good evidence that they are not there. Below, much attention will be focused on reasons to think that God's reasons should be detected.

In the above Premise, E can be filled in with a particular evil, a set of evils, or it could be used as a name to refer to some kind of organic sum of all evil (if there is such a thing) to make the point that what we can't see a reason for is the general pattern of evil we observe in the world: its magnitude, duration, and distribution. There is considerable room for flexibility and creativity when fleshing out the details of this argument along a particular strategic line. Thus, if skeptical theism is to be fully successful, it must be made applicable to each variety of the problem of evil.

1.2 Skeptical Theism's Skepticism

Skepticisms of all kinds come in varying degrees. The skepticism of most skeptical theists seems total or near total. That is, they tend to accept the No Weight Thesis.

No Weight Thesis
Considerations pertaining to evil do not disconfirm theism at all.

That is, observations of evil do not even attain the status of evidence (van Inwagen 1995, 94–5). Van Inwagen founds his skeptical theism on his “extreme modal and moral skepticism” (skepticism about our ability to discern the relevant truths about morality and possibility, not skepticism about whether there are such truths; 1995, 84) and goes on to assert (repeatedly) that we have “no reason” to accept what he takes to be the crucial premise of the evidential argument from evil. Indeed, he thinks that owing to the truth of his skeptical theses “the evidential argument from evil cannot get started” (1995, 85).

Alston is not quite as explicit, but seems to agree. He calls the position he defends “agnosticism” (1996, 98). He says that our cognitive resources are “radically insufficient to provide sufficient warrant to accepting [the main premise of the evidential argument],” so much so that “the inductive argument collapses” (98). He concludes that “the inductive argument from evil is in no better shape than its late lamented deductive cousin” (121). It is generally accepted that the deductive argument, sometimes called the “logical problem”, is a complete failure, and by calling it “late” Alston seems to agree.

Wykstra backs off his 1984 claims (1984: 74, 79, 80, 90–91) that evil provides no evidence for atheism. He now calls those claims “reckless” (1996, 148 n. 14). He now admits that the evidence from evil, bracketing evidence for God's existence, “tilts” in favor (rather significantly, 1996, 138) of atheism, but not enough to justify belief in atheism, even if one starts from agnosticism.

Bergmann seems clearly to advance No Weight. He also often says we have “no reason” to think the goods we are aware of are representative of the goods there are (2001: 288, 289 (three times)). Three times in his 2001 and throughout his 2008 he uses the phrase “in the dark” for our cognitive situation with respect to God-justifying reasons. And Bergmann and Rea (2005, esp. 248) seem to indicate that they accept that we cannot assign any probability what so ever to the relevant class of propositions about goods (a thesis also endorsed by van Inwagen 1995, 75).

Bergman's commitment to No Weight can further be seen in his endorsement of another thesis, the Non-starter Thesis.

Non-starter Thesis
Evil does not even provide a prima facie reason against theism that would need to be countered by skeptical considerations.

A prima facie reason here is, roughly, one that could be overturned upon further considerations. It is also sometimes called a “defeasible” reason because it can be defeated by further considerations. One might think that evil provided a prima facie reason for atheism that skeptical theism was designed to defeat. However, this is not how Bergmann thinks of the situation. Swinburne (1998, 13) explains skeptical theism this way, but Bergmann corrects him.

The main problem with Swinburne's objection to the skeptical theist's skepticism is that the skeptical theist thinks there is good reason not to grant his first point that it appears that there is no God-justifying reason for permitting [horrendous] evils…. According to (ST1)–(ST4), it doesn't appear that there is no God-justifying reason for permitting for (E1) and (E2) [two token instances of evil]. (2008, 387)

Bergmann goes on to say that the skeptical theist's response is:

that we aren't justified in thinking the probability judgment initially appears the way Swinburne says it appears. Clear thinking and reflection on [the skeptical theist's skeptical theses] reveal that there's no particular value or range (short of the range between 0 and 1) that the probability in question appears to be. (388)

This seems a perfectly clear commitment to Non-starter and so to No Weight. Thus we see that in general, the skeptical theist's skepticism is of a very high degree concerning its target: our ability to have knowledge of the kinds of possibilities – especially moral possibilities – required to get the argument from evil started.

2. The Epistemic Principles Approach

The earliest major approach in the contemporary literature to bringing cognitive limits to bear upon the argument from evil is the epistemic principles approach, inaugurated by Wykstra (1984, but see also Alston 1996/1991, 122, n11 in Howard-Snyder 1996b). He has continued to defend and expand this strategy to the present day (Russell and Wykstra 1988, Wykstra 1996, 2007, 2009, and Wykstra and Perrine 2012 and forthcoming). Howard-Snyder 2009 makes a similar but more detailed reply based on a similar but importantly different epistemic principle. Plantinga (1988) also touches on the topic. (Some of what follows follows Dougherty 2011c.)

2.1 Statement of the Epistemic Principles Approach

The argument from evil is meant to use evidence about evil in the world to support the proposition that there is no God. Thus, one natural line of reply to that argument is to show that some applicable general principle about evidential support is not satisfied in the case of evil and theism. Wykstra proposes just such a principle in his Condition Of ReasoNable Epistemic Access.

Wykstra and Perrine (2012) also offer a probabilistic version of CORNEA to address a counterexample in McBrayer (2009).

On the basis of cognized situation s, human H is entitled to claim ‘It appears that p’ only if it is reasonable for H to believe that, given her cognitive faculties and the use she has made of them, if p were not the case, s would likely be different than it is in some way discernible by her. (1984, 85)

See Rowe (1996, 270ff) for treatment of interpretive issues concerning CORNEA. Wykstra notes that:

in all versions, the key idea behind CORNEA is a proposed test for whether some alleged evidence E seriously ‘supports’… some hypothesis H… . [A]sk whether, if H were false, E is still pretty much what one should expect. If the answer is ‘Yes’, then E can't seriously support H. (2007, 88)

It becomes clear in Wykstra's dialogue with Russell (Russell and Wykstra 1988), that the key notion operating behind CORNEA is that the hypothesis that God exists predicts that reasons for suffering would not be transparent to the human observer but, rather, obscure. Therefore we may focus on the following principle.

If there is a God who has good reasons for allowing the suffering that occurs, we are unlikely to know what these reasons are in most cases.

If Obscurity is true, it provides good reason to doubt justification accrued via a common sense epistemic principle, the Principle of Credulity (Swinburne 1998 states the problem of evil in terms of this principle, Swinburne 2001 explicates and defends the principle).

Principle of Credulity (PC)
If it seems that p, then, apart from further considerations, probably, p.

or a weaker principle of Reasons Commonsensism:

Reasons Commonsensism (RC)
If it seems to S that p, then S thereby has some reason for p.

Given RC, the reason S has for p is a consideration which has some positive weight in favor of p which could potentially be outweighed by contrary reasons. PC or RC or some such principle can be used for direct support of the Empirical Premise (this is how Swinburne 1998 sets up the problem). Obscurity's truth would be the “further consideration” showing that the seeming-that-p could not be trusted.

Wykstra defends Obscurity, or things that support Obscurity, principally via the Parent Analogy.

Parent Analogy (PA)
Just as we expect a small child to be blind to the reasons an adult has for allowing her to suffer justified pain, so we should expect that we will be blind to the reasons God has for allowing our justified suffering.

Wykstra has repeatedly appealed to the parent analogy (1984, 88; Russell and Wykstra 1988, 135, 144, 146; 1996, 139ff) in defense of Obscurity (See Dougherty 2011 for a reply). At first, it seems to be a common sense response to the argument from evil quite consonant with what we would expect the average person to say. As we shall see, there is reason to think the appearance may be deceiving.

Howard-Snyder's principle (H-S) is importantly different.

We cannot see an x justifies believing there is no x only if we have no good reason to be in doubt about whether we would very likely see an x, if there were one.

Recall that Wykstra's principle requires that one have good reason for thinking x's would be apparent. Howard-Snyder's only requires that one not be in doubt, or perhaps, better, not have particular grounds for doubt, about their seeability. If some basic beliefs are prima facie justified, that is, justified until there is reason to doubt them, without explicit reasons, then skepticism will be more of a threat with Wykstra's epistemic principle than with Howard-Snyder's. Note that the truth of Obscurity will also work with Howard-Snyder's principle, so a defense of the parent analogy would also serve Howard-Snyder's case.

Howard-Snyder adds two arguments to the defense of Obscurity. First, he offers the Progress Argument (1996, 301). The gist of the argument is that there has been significant progress in knowledge and understanding of moral truths, including knowledge of what intrinsic goods there are, in the past, and there is no good reason to think this trend is at an end. But if so, it follows that we are now ignorant concerning certain intrinsic goods. And for all we know these might include the goods for the sake of which God permits evil. He combines this with the Argument from Complexity (1996, 301). This argument begins by recalling that the data from which the strongest arguments from evil start are the profusion or seeming excess of evil in the world which, indeed, seems to be integrated into the fabric of nature and society. But for that very reason (their complexity and intricacy), any complex good whole of which these evils are a part would have to be exceedingly complex. Thus, he infers that it would not be surprising if it were beyond our ability to fathom.

2.2 Objections to the Epistemic Principles Approach

Resisting the epistemic principles strategy involves arguing for one of two claims: either that the epistemic principle employed is false (or inapplicable) or that the condition it imposes is in fact met. Both of these kinds of objections have been leveled at the epistemic principles strategy.

2.2.1 CORNEA is false

Two kinds of arguments have been suggested to show that CORNEA is false. Some (Laraudogoitia 2000; Graham and Maitzen 2007) have argued that CORNEA violates a plausible closure principle. Closure principles are a family of principles stating that when a proposition has some form of positive epistemic status, knowledge, say, and bears some relevant relation to some other proposition, logically entailing it, say, then that second proposition has the same epistemic status as the first. A principle popular among friends of closure is the following: If one knows p and competently deduces q from p while retaining knowledge of p, and one comes to believe q on that basis, then one knows q. These authors argue that, if skeptical theism were true, then an intuitively plausible closure principle would be false. Others (Russell 1988; McBrayer 2009) have also argued that CORNEA is false on the grounds that it implies skepticism. The following two sections offer some detail for each of these claims. CORNEA Violates Closure

Laraudogoitia (2000) accuses CORNEA of backfiring by overlooking a fact about closure. The skeptical theist argues that CORNEA entails that the justified attitude concerning whether there are pointless evils is agnosticism. But the theist thinks it is reasonable to believe in God, and she knows that if God exists, then there is no gratuitous evil. And the following closure principle will hold for normal theists in normal circumstances.

Closure Principle (CPL)
If it is reasonable for S to believe p, and S knows that p entails q, then S is committed to the reasonableness of q.

From this principle – together with the theist's theism and knowledge about the relevant entailment – it follows that the theist is justified in believing there is no gratuitous evil. But this contradicts the agnosticism dictated by CORNEA.

Graham and Maitzen (2007) note CORNEA's resemblance to some principles from elsewhere in epistemology. They seek to bring objections to those principles to bear on CORNEA. The principles are Nozick's “sensitivity” condition on knowledge and Dretske's similar account involving conclusive reasons. Nozick's sensitivity condition on knowledge is roughly that you know only if, were p false, you wouldn't believe p. Dretske's account is, approximately, you know p if you have a conclusive reason R for p, one such that were p not true you would not have R (and/or R would not be true, details vary). One of the main objections to those theories is that they violate almost any plausible closure principle on knowledge. The closure principle in question is, essentially, this one.

If S knows that p, and S knows that p entails q, then S is in a position to know q.

They argue that, like the principles of Nozick and Dretske, the application of this principle to some cases is incompatible with CORNEA. CORNEA Invites Skepticism

Russell (1988, 148; 1996) notes that CORNEA seems to open the door to something like Cartesian skepticism. Recall the condition CORNEA puts in place, the thing it says one needs a reason to believe: if p were not the case, s would likely be different than it is in some way discernible by her. Now consider the following possibility: you are a brain being kept alive in a vat of nutrients and stimulated in a way that causes your current experiences and memory impressions. Let p be I am not a brain in a vat, indexed to you, and consider whether you have reason to think things would look different for you if that were false, that is, if you were a brain in a vat. Ex hypothesi, they would not. So CORNEA seems to lead quickly to the skeptical conclusion that we do not know that we are not mere brains in vats. McBrayer (2009) expands at length on this, making the argument in more detail, also incorporating analogies to the epistemology of Nozick and Dretske.

2.2.2 The CORNEA Condition is Satisfied: The Reverse Parent Analogy

Some proponents of the argument from evil have provided some reason to think that in fact the condition that CORNEA imposes can be met. That is, they provide some reason to think that if there were a God, then likely things would be different. That is, they offer reasons to think that if there were a God, then we would see more of the reasons for why evils are allowed. In short, they offer reasons to think Obscurity false. Russell (1988, 147ff) and Rowe (2001, 298; 1996, 274–276; 2006, 89) both advance a parental analogy on behalf of the negation of Obscurity and Dougherty (2011b) has expanded upon these arguments. The problem is that whereas the Parent Analogy (PA) takes into account God's boundless knowledge, it fails to give due to his boundless power and love. Thus Russell, Rowe, and Dougherty defend a reverse parent analogy (PA+), which is an extension of the parent analogy.

Just as we would expect a loving parent with the power to do so to make a necessarily suffering child understand the reasons for her suffering, so we would expect a loving God who clearly has the power to do so to make us able to understand the reason for our suffering.

The reverse parent analogy seems to be stronger than PA because it appeals to a more robust picture of God's attributes, and it supports the negation of Obscurity. We can call that thesis Transparency.

The probability that we would see God's reasons for allowing evil, given that there is a God with such reasons, is high.

2.3 Replies to Objections to the Epistemic Principles Approach

This section considers brief replies to the above objections.

2.3.1 Reply to The Closure Problem

Wykstra (2007) replies to the closure problem by highlighting aspects of CORNEA that suggest a way to avoid the problem. Wykstra notes (2007, 91) that in his original formulation he made a distinction that is the crux of his response to Graham and Maitzen. The distinction in question is – or is relevantly related to – Rudolf Carnap's distinction between “incremental” confirmation and “absolute” confirmation or what Wykstra calls “dynamic” and “static” support. An item of evidence E gives dynamic support to a target proposition p when it gives p an additional increment or “boost” of probability. Obviously, this is consistent with p remaining very improbable on balance with respect to a set of total evidence. A total body of evidence E statically supports a target proposition p when p is more likely than not, given E.

Wykstra points out that he can accept closure. He can accept, for instance, the implication of closure that S's knowing that she sees a zebra and that being a zebra excludes being a disguised mule entails that S is in a position to know that she is not looking at a cleverly disguised mule while at the same time denying that the very same evidence E whereby S comes to be justified in believing there's a zebra can, by itself, justify – or even boost the probability of – the proposition that it's not a cleverly disguised mule.

Furthermore, Rowe is clear that he is setting aside the evidence for theism for the sake of argument and only claiming that the individual evidential contribution of evil was to lower the probability of theism (and thus tilt toward atheism for the agnostic). Since Rowe isn't considering all the evidence relevant to theism, he is only interested in what Wykstra calls dynamic support. If we were to consider all our evidence, we could, in principle, find that the balance of our total evidence supports theism, and infer from the truth of theism that there is no pointless evil. He calls this move from theism to the denial of pointless evil the “Moorean Shift” (1996 (orig. 1979), 6–8) after Moore's curt reply to the skeptic. The skeptical theist can consistently push CORNEA and the Moorean shift, because she only argues that CORNEA blocks the inductive inference to the conclusion that there is no justification for some evil (which is a case of alleged dynamic support), not that one's all-things-considered attitude toward pointless evil ought to be agnosticism (which would be a case of static support).

2.3.2 Reply to Skeptical Problems

Both Russell's and McBrayer's objections alleging skeptical implications of CORNEA depend on interpreting CORNEA as a counterfactual conditional, that is, a subjunctive conditional with a false antecedent. Though this is a natural interpretation, it has been resisted by Wykstra and Perrine (2011, forthcoming). According to standard principles of common sense defeasible reasoning, if it appears to one that p, then one thereby has some reason for p, though this reason can be outweighed in the end. Thus the defender of the epistemic principles approach could grant that the advocate of the argument from evil has defeasible reasons for atheism, but add that the rational force of these reasons is neutralized by Obscurity, which appears to be the core of CORNEA. This still leaves the debate over Obscurity in place, but it plausibly avoids the skeptical objections to which CORNEA has been subjected.

2.3.3 Reply to the Reverse Parent Analogy

Both proponents and opponents of the argument from evil have claimed the parent analogy. In response to the reverse parent analogy, however, note an important structural feature of the problem of evil. When a hypothesis H makes very probably that an event E will occur and E does not occur, E's not occurring clearly disconfirms H. And if H makes very probable that E will occur and E does occur, E's occurring clearly confirms H. If H doesn't make E's occurring very probable or improbable--that is, H and E are nearly probabilistically independent--then neither E's occurring nor E's not occurring makes a clear difference to the probability of H.

So, theism will be disconfirmed by our inability to discover reasons for the evils we observe only if theism predicts with significant strength that we should be able to detect the reasons. Thus Rowe (1991) says,

it would be sufficient to weaken the inference from P [no good state of affairs we know of is such that an omnipotent, omniscient being's obtaining it would morally satisfy that being's permitting some horrendous evil] to Q [no good state of affairs is such that an omnipotent, omniscient being's obtaining it would morally justify that being in permitting some horrendous evil] to show that if there were an omnipotent, wholly good being who created our world, then the goods in virtue of which he permits [some horrendous evil] would be as likely to be undetectable by us as to be detectable by us. (88, n15)

Further, in replying to the reverse parent analogy the theist can bring to bear on it reasons for divine hiddenness. As should be clear at this point, the problem of evil leads quite naturally to the problem of divine silence/hiddenness. Thus, if there were good reasons for God to veil himself in some way, to provide some “epistemic distance” between himself and the casual observer, then these reasons could plausibly be used to defend Obscurity. For let R be the reasons in question. The probability that we are unaware of the reasons for so much suffering, given theism, might be low, but the probability that we are unaware of the reasons for so much suffering, given theism and R, could still be high. Of course, if the probability of R, given theism, is high, then we might have found out upon reflection that the first value isn't low after all.

3. The General Cognitive Limitations Approach

Alston's approach (1996a/1991) examines particular details involved in the inference from inscrutable to pointless evil. He points to a cluster of limitations, some of which clearly generalize beyond the noseeum inference.

3.1 Statement of the Multiple Limitations Approach

Alston lists six disadvantages we face in discerning whether there are pointless evils from the fact of inscrutable evils (1996b, 120). This list will be referred to as The Inventory.

  1. Lack of relevant data.
  2. Complexity greater than we can handle.
  3. Difficulty of determining what is metaphysically possible or necessary.
  4. Ignorance of the full range of possibilities.
  5. Ignorance of the full range of values.
  6. Limits to our capacity to make well-considered value judgments.

These difficulties can be put to use in this argument.

  1. We are subject to the cognitive limitations as described in The Inventory.
  2. If 1, then we are in no position to judge whether there are pointless evils on the basis of inscrutable evils.
  3. Therefore, we are in no position to judge whether there are pointless evils on the basis of inscrutable evils.

There has been little doubt expressed that we are subject to the difficulties in The Inventory, at least to a considerable degree, so Premise 1 seems to be secure. The question, then, is whether our being subject to those limitations makes us completely unable to make the inference from inscrutable evils to pointless evils with justification. One way to think of the objection is that this inference falls under a kind such that we are unjustified when making inferences in those circumstances.

  1. We are subject to the cognitive limitations as described in The Inventory.
  2. When we are subject to the kind of limitations listed in 1, we are unjustified in making judgments to which having the relevant kind of data, determining what the relevant possibilities are, and knowing the full range of values are directly relevant.
  3. The inference from inscrutable to pointless evils is one to which having the relevant kind of data, determining what the relevant possibilities are, and knowing the full range of values are directly relevant.
  4. Therefore, when we are subject to the kinds of limitations adverted to in 1, we are in a position where making that inference would be making a kind of inference that is unjustified. From 2 and 3.
  5. Therefore, we are in a position where making the inference from inscrutable to pointless evil would be of a kind that is unjustified. From 1 and 4.

To be perfectly relevant, we would need to add to this argument the lemma that if one makes an unjustified inference, the conclusion of that inference has low epistemic probability. This may be questioned, but it is very plausible and discussion of it would take us too far afield.

3.2 An Objection to the Multiple Limitations Approach

The first thing to say in objection to the multiple limitations approach is that each item in The Inventory seems to raise a problem for theism itself. That is, each item is itself a bad state of affairs that may seem surprising given theism (this is an expansion upon Dougherty 2011b). One way to see this is to recall the reverse parent analogy from §2.2.2 above. It is bad that we lack data relevant to a very important matter. After all, many people seem to lose their faith (eternal salvation?) as a result of evil. It is bad that we lack the processing power to come to an extremely important decision (whether there is a God). (Quick objection: Isn't it a good, though, to have to work to discover important truths? Quick reply: Sometimes yes, sometimes no; plausibly not in the case of something this grave which applies to each person individually.) It is a bad thing that we don't know the outcome space of an important matter and can't tell, for particular proposals, whether they are on it.

So it might be considered a very odd strategy to try to answer an argument from evil by adverting to further bad states of affairs, which are not what we would expect from theism in the first place.

3.3 Replies to the Objection

One kind of reply to the objection given is to argue that the objector has taken the data of the argument from evil – typically horrendous evils – and replaced them with some relatively minor evils. Expected or not, these minor evils would not make much of a case against the existence of God. Now either Alston's argument works or it does not. That is, either it does or does not show that we are in no position to infer that there are pointless evils from the fact that there are gratuitous evils. If the argument is successful--which doesn't seem to be challenged by the objection--then the usual data of horrendous evil cannot serve as a good foundation of an argument from evil. Thus we would be left with the evils on The Inventory, which are not likely to dramatically reduce credence in theism for many. (For further thought: Let Inventory be the proposition that we are subject to the limitations mentioned on The Inventory. One might think the probability of Inventory, given theism, is very low, so that probability of theism is approximately equal to the probability of theism & ~Inventory. This would make relevant the probability of inscrutable but not pointless evils, given theism & ~Inventory, which might plausibly be thought very low.) This is plausibly the material for a rejoinder by the advocate of the argument from evil.

4. The Broad Modal/Moral Skepticism Approach

Peter van Inwagen has long defended a form of "modal skepticism," that is, skepticism concerning our knowledge of what states of affairs are possible (see his “Ontological Arguments,” 1977/1995). He applies it in a reply to the argument from evil (1991/1995, 1996, 2006). This is a vigorous application of items 3 and 4 from Alston's inventory. The idea here is that there is no reason to think that our modal intuitions about matters not related to ordinary life are reliable. It is plausible that the moral skepticism involved is just a sub-class of the modal skepticism involved, and even if it is not a subclass, all the issues are quite parallel. Thus for the sake of brevity the focus will be primarily on the “pure” modal skepticism here, though there will be a bit more to say about potential moral skepticism in Section 5.

4.1 Statement of the Broad Modal Skepticism Approach

Modal skepticism can be brought to bear on the argument from evil in the following way.

  1. Our modal intuitions not connected to ordinary life are unreliable.
  2. The inference from inscrutable evils to pointless evils is justified only if certain modal intuitions not related to ordinary life are reliable.
  3. Thus the judgment that there are pointless evils is unjustified.

What can be said on behalf of Premise 1? One idea (adverted to by van Inwagen frequently and by Howard-Snyder 2009, 27) is that our cognitive faculties evolved in a milieu which may underwrite their reliability in ordinary life but which does not extend outside that domain. So trusting our intuition in extramundane matters would be like trusting the reading of a barometer calibrated at sea level at 14,200 feet on the West Buttress of Denali. It would be like trusting vision underwater. It would simply be unwise to do so, and, it seems, the results, being beliefs, inferences, judgments, what have you, of trusting one's intuitions in those circumstances would have little by way of justification.

Van Inwagen himself applies the modal skepticism a bit differently. It could be that he accepts a theory of knowledge relevantly similar to that of David Lewis on which one must rule out all relevant, or in van Inwagen's case “real,” possibilities, but there is another way to take it. He tells a story according to which the world has the amount and distribution of evils we think it has and God exists which, he says, is a “real, possibility,” that is, something that might be true for all we know. The idea of a real possibility is best illustrated by what a TV lawyer would call an “alternative theory of the crime” (van Inwagen, in discussion) which is plausible enough to cause doubt, in the sense of inability to assent, to the proposition that the accused is guilty.

His target is an argument like Draper's (1989/1996) neo-Humean argument from evil, which is an argument inspired by Hume, but significantly modernized. So the direct target is that the proposition S – which describes what suffering there likely is – is less probable on theism than on the “hypothesis of indifference.” The argument must go something like this, where the modal intuitions in question concern whether certain proposed possibilities are genuine possibilities (with ‘T’ for theism).

1. Our modal intuitions not connected to ordinary life are unreliable.

2′. A judgment about the value of the probability of there being the suffering that there likely is, given theism, is justified only if certain modal intuitions not related to ordinary life are reliable.

3′. Thus any judgment about the value of the probability of there being the suffering that there likely is, given theism, is unjustified.

An example of the kind of proposed possibility in question will be helpful. Here is a state of affairs that some claim to intuit to be possible which is relevant to an important version of the argument from evil: God's seeing to it both that every animal who is not observed does not suffer and that natural laws are not massively irregular. This is the kind of proposed possibility a proponent of the argument from evil might advance to show that the present state of affairs is unjustified. Van Inwagen's modal skeptic will not accept that this is a genuine possibility, since it is too removed from ordinary life. Obviously, since relatedness to ordinary life comes in degrees, there will be issues from vagueness affecting the application of this strategy. So it will often not be clear whether a proposition is to be doubted by the modal realist on the basis of distance from ordinary life. In fact, we may use the above proposed possibility concerning animal suffering and regularity as an example of the problem of delineating “ordinary life.” For clearly our folk physics–that is, our ordinary idea of how the physical world works–includes that the world is very regular and animal suffering and predation are a part of most people's lives, at least those who have ever owned a pet or visited a farm or are regular meat eaters.

4.2 Objections to the Broad Modal Skepticism Approach

A first obvious question for the advocate of this argument is whether Premise 1 itself is a matter of “ordinary life.” That is, is the matter of when intuitions are justified a matter of ordinary life? It is not at all clear that they are. And if they are not, then the argument might have a self-referential problem: If the first premise is true, then the first premise is unjustified. Another kind of self-referential problem for van Inwagen himself is that he advances a defense featuring a proposition just as far from ordinary life as the example above. Specifically, the proposition above – God's seeing to it both that every animal who is not observed does not suffer and that natural laws are not massively irregular – which van Inwagen would reject as genuinely possible seems no farther from ordinary life than the possibilities van Inwagen himself proposes as genuine (see van Inwagen 2006, 114).

Also, there are other problems concerning delineating the bounds of delineating the bounds of “ordinary life.” There is both a synchronic (at-a-moment) and diachronic (across time) problem here. The synchronic problem is delineating the bounds of ordinary life at any one time or short segment of time.

The diachronic problem here is that what counts as “everyday life” changes over time. It has been a long time since the emergence of Homo sapiens and our lives have changed significantly since then. So arguments of the form “This wasn't part of everyday life 115,000 years ago so we can't trust it” are dubious. Our eyes did not evolve in a milieu to which driving a car was relevant to survival, but we do pretty well at it, nevertheless.

Second, even when we know something isn't functioning in the environment for which it was designed (by God or evolution or both, but more of that next), we can still trust judgments based on them, if we know a little something about the manner in which they are likely to be mistaken. So let's return to 14,200 feet on the West Buttress of Denali with our barometer last calibrated at sea level. Since we know something about the relationship between altitude and barometric pressure, we can extrapolate or estimate the true value from the reported value to derive a range in which the true value is likely to be (if we have precise data we can generate confidence intervals which under good circumstances would be quite narrow). And we can certainly trust certain comparative judgments: even if we are almost completely ignorant of how to correct for the altitude change, if the reading falls fast consistently for an hour, we can safely infer that a low pressure front is moving in. So even a poorly calibrated instrument can be of use if we have appropriate understanding of its inner workings.

Therefore, even if we have reason to believe our modal intuitions will be off in certain domains, we might either have a reasonable theory about how they are likely to be off and thus have the ability to correct them, or at least be able to make certain comparative judgments. For example, if it seems blindingly obvious that the fundamental constants of the universe could have had different values than they do or that there could have been other fundamental particles, forces, fields, or what have you, we might think, after reflecting upon how far removed from ordinary life the proposed possibility is, our intuition is giving too strong a reading and dial it back to the more moderate conclusion that it is very likely that these are genuine possibilities. It would be far too skeptical merely to discard the intuition.

Similarly, if it seems blindingly obvious to us that there is no way that all the creation-worthy (or best or what have you) worlds involve approximately the amount, or proportion, or severity of evil we think there is, then, realizing that this is far removed from daily life we might dial it back to the more moderate conclusion that on balance there are creation-worthy worlds with a significantly lesser amount, or severity, or proportion, or what have you, of evil. This is a far cry from van Inwagen's own conclusion that we have “no reason” (van Inwagen 1996/1991, 163) to accept the relevant possibility claims.

Third, evolutionary theory does not seem to be a good reason to doubt that intuition will be unreliable outside of ordinary life. For there are two ways for evolution to occur: with theism and without theism. So let “extended intuition” name the thesis that our intuition is reliable in ways importantly extended beyond everyday life, assuming the latter notion gets coherently worked out. While the probability of extended intuition, given Evolution & ~Theism, might be low, the probability of extended intuition, given Evolution & Theism, is plausibly quite high and surely not too low. So the question of the reliability of our intuition in domains beyond everyday life but relevant to our religiously proposed final end, and, therefore perhaps an “everyday” matter anyway, is not independent of whether one already thinks there is a God.

Fourth, it has been alleged that the modal skepticism used by the skeptical theist leads to widespread skepticism about ordinary matters, perhaps even total skepticism (Russell 1996, Gale 1996, Hasker 2010b). The objection seems to be based on the thesis that the skeptical theist's appeal to uneliminated possibilities can be combined with any ordinary proposition to keep it from being known. To use a more traditional version, Russell's (1996) example (see also earlier Russell and Wykstra 1988 and later Russell 2004), consider the proposition that the world was created about six thousand years ago at nightfall of the evening preceding Sunday, October 23rd (yes, that's the actual attribution of Bishop Usher) with the appearance of much greater age. Young-earth creationists give reasons for thinking that God has reasons for this geologic deceptiveness. Since the theory includes misleading appearances, it is consistent with all observational data. Thus it can never be ruled out by empirical evidence. Accordingly, it seems not to be improbable on any of our evidence. This objection suggests that the skeptical theist's skepticism about that which is beyond ordinary life comes home to roost in skepticism about ordinary matters, such as the age of the Earth plausibly is (that is, plausibly the earth and the age of things are ordinary matters, even if not an ordinary topic of conversation). This suggests that nearly any ordinary belief is called into question by skeptical theism.

Fifth, the modal skeptic's thesis that our intuitions are not to be trusted outside of ordinary life (or the milieu for which they evolved) seems to be at odds with the effectiveness of mathematics in particle physics, cosmology, and the like. The mathematical beliefs of early Homo sapiens were surely quite primitive (it is irrelevant for present purposes how much unconscious processing was done by the brain). Interestingly, natural theology has been compared with theoretical physics (Earman 2000). If this comparison holds up, it seems to tell against the present modal skeptical argument.

Sixth, in reference to the significance of the existence of “real” possibilities some worries occur. The proper procedures in a courtroom do not obviously apply to the philosophy room. It might be prudent and socially utile to lock up, or otherwise seriously punish, those convicted of felonies only if a case can be made that they are guilty beyond a reasonable doubt. But when considering what it is rational to believe, one can clearly rationally disbelieve p when it is not beyond a reasonable doubt that ~p. An even safer claim is that one can still think it more likely than not that ~p. Thus, even if van Inwagen is correct that his defense against the argument from evil is successful on his terms – as successful as an alternative theory of the crime in acquitting the accused – one might still reasonably disbelieve theism or at least believe it to be improbable.

Furthermore, how strong does a contrary reason need to be to constitute a reasonable doubt? Parallel question: how probable does a story need to be to be a “real possibility”? To be a real possibility in an epistemic sense, a sense relevant to the reasonableness of the belief, would it have to be at least 5% probable? It wouldn't need to be 50% probable. Is it somewhere in the middle, say, 25–33%? And we mustn't confusedly bring in considerations of practical rationality here. We might say, speaking loosely, that there is a “real possibility” of a loaded gun going off accidentally even though this is extremely rare. But what about just aiming a standard six-shooter revolver down range with one bullet spun into the magazine? We would bet against the first pull of the trigger resulting in a fired bullet. But would this be a real possibility, in van Inwagen's sense? It's hard to say, but here is an argument that it is. It seems wrong to believe that the gun will not fire. That suggests that the threshold for reasonable belief is above 83%. So the thesis that there are real possibilities which include both God that exists and that there exists evil of the sort we find may only entail that there is about 10–15% likelihood that there is such a possibility. So a real possibility containing both God and evil such as we take to exist in this world might make it unreasonable to believe that there is no God, but it certainly doesn't rule out agnosticism concerning whether God exists or a weak atheism to the effect that it is very probable that there is no God.

4.3 Replies to Objections

With respect to delineating the bounds of “ordinary life,” the modal skeptic could perhaps rely on a physicalistic notion. That is, they could take the reference to focus upon activities appropriately related to reproduction, which entails survival through the point of intercourse, which entails a certain life-span. This may exacerbate the fifth objection and ones like it, but see below for a reply to that problem.

With respect to the suggestion that we can still get useful information from extramundane intuition, the modal skeptic can press one who advances this objection to work out in more detail how the extrapolation or adjustment works and then pick on the details.

With respect to the charge of general skepticism little has been said. van Inwagen (1996) claims that his defensive stories are not – unlike general skeptical hypotheses – improbable relative to what we know. Note that this is different from being improbable relative to our empirical evidence, which skeptical hypotheses are not. Certainly general skeptical hypotheses are not “real possibilities” in van Inwagen's sense, which he insists on calling “epistemic possibilities,”; they are not plausible alternatives that would cause ordinary folk to falter in judgment. More will be said about this as the problem recurs in Section 6.

With respect to the argument from the effectiveness of mathematics, it could be replied that all the math involved in physics is somehow “contained” in basic “everyday” math or at least that the computational abilities of individuals who perform advanced math are contained in the computational abilities of early homo sapiens. Obviously, these are contentious and in some cases empirical claims. So this line of reply would need to fill in lots of details to be very effective.

With respect to the point about real possibilities and probability, the modal skeptic might say that ruling out being certain that God does not exist is something worth doing. It might make Pascalian considerations relevant, for example.

5. The Focused Modal-Moral Skepticism Approach

The last section treated an “extreme” (van Inwagen 1996/1991, 163; 1995, 84; 2006, 123) modal and moral skepticism. But there are more focused modal and moral skepticisms, which purport to be more moderate and targeted. That is, there are approaches that do not attribute limits to modal and moral intuition as such. Rather, they take some limitations on our modal knowledge that it seems all should admit. Skeptical theists suggest that these limitations apply specifically in the case of the argument from evil.

5.1 Statement of the Focused Modal-Moral Skepticism Approach

In its now-standard form (found primarily in Bergmann 2001, 279 and 2008, 376), the core of skeptical theism consists in four skeptical theses.

(ST1) We have no good reason for thinking that the possible goods we know of are representative of the possible goods there are [representative, that is, relative to figuring (positively) in a (potentially) God-justifying reason for permitting the inscrutable evils we see around us].

(ST2) We have no good reason for thinking that the possible evils we know of are representative of the possible evils there are.

(ST3) We have no good reason for thinking that the entailment relations we know of between possible goods and the permission of possible evils are representative of the entailment relations there are between possible goods and the permission of possible evils.

(ST4) We have no good reason for thinking that the total moral value or disvalue we perceive in certain complex states of affairs accurately reflects the total moral value or disvalue they really have.

One way of defending the thesis that there is pointless evil (see Rowe 1979) is by reference to the fact that there are evils for which we cannot think of any good reason, even upon considerable reflection, i.e. inscrutable evils. Consider this example of the noseeum kind of inference we met in section 1.1.

Simple Noseeum Inference
I see no point to evil E, so probably there is no point.

This is just a first approximation, of course, and an adequate version would require much refinement. For example, one would need special confidence in oneself to wield the inference as is. Yet replacing “I” with “No one” (and adjusting the grammar) would be unjustified without further support as well, since it has far too broad a scope. But the point of the inference is clear enough. One version of the Noseeum Inference goes like this.

Expanded Noseeum Inference
In the sample population of possible goods surveyed, none has had the property being a reason to allow evil E. Therefore, probably, in the total population of possible goods, none has the property being a reason to allow evil E.

Note that (ST1)–(ST3) are all in the negative. That is, they state that we lack a reason for thinking the sample is representative. Therefore, to be applicable to the noseeum inference, the skeptical theist needs to add a lemma like this.

Representativeness Principle
We should treat a sample as unrepresentative until we have good reason to believe that it is representative.

With this lemma, it seems clear that if (ST1)–(ST3) are true, then the Expanded Noseeum Inference is unsound.

Yet this may be a weakness, for notice a crucial difference between the first of Bergmann's skeptical theses and Howard-Snyder's agnostic thesis.

ST1: We have no good reason for thinking that the possible goods we know of are representative of the possible goods there are. (Bergman 2001, 279, emphasis added).

AT1: We should be in doubt about whether the goods we know of constitute a representative sample of all the goods there are. (Howard-Snyder 2009, 18, emphasis added).

Whereas Bergmann focuses on lacking a positive reason for representativeness, Howard-Snyder focuses on the presence of doubt concerning representativeness. Here, Howard-Snyder's approach is more consonant with Wykstra's, since Wykstra's defense of Obscurity would establish AT1 (whereas it provides only weak support for ST1). An advantage of AT1 is that it, unlike ST1, does not require the Representativeness Principle in order to be effective. For it is plausible that the lemma relies on something like the following principle.

To be justified in believing P on the basis of E one must not only be (1) justified in believing E, but also (2) justified in believing that E makes probable P. (See the entry on foundationalist theories of epistemic justification.)

Fumerton (Fumerton 1995, 36, 55ff.) makes a powerful case that once this principle is accepted, it is very hard to avoid skepticism. Thus, if Bergmann is committed to this principle, he seems to have taken on a major commitment that Howard-Snyder has not.

5.2 Objections to the Modal-Moral Skepticism Approach

One reason for thinking (ST1)–(ST3) false is that in addition to concerns about knowledge skepticism treated above, skeptical theism has been accused of various kinds of moral skepticism (Russell 1996; Almeida and Oppy 2003, 2004; Graham and Maitzen 2007, 2009). The main threat comes from the open possibility – given (ST1)–(ST4) – that we can never know which action will have the best outcome. Indeed, we can't even sensibly assign probabilities to which acts will have the best outcome. So, to illustrate the point, suppose you are witnessing an attempted killing that you could easily prevent by intervening. According to the approach under consideration, you cannot sensibly assign any probability to the proposition that the one being killed is a dangerous terrorist who is the target of an emergency assassination. So it seems that you can't possibly conclude that preventing the killing is the best thing to do. And if not, then how could you rightly do it?

5.3 Replies to Objections

With respect to the charge of moral skepticism, one can argue that sound moral judgment need only take into consideration what one knows over the practically available period of time. Then one need only be aware of a prima facie duty to prevent what ones current evidence indicates to be bad states of affairs to have all one needs to act rightly, whether or not the action has the best outcome. In short, right action is based on known goods and bads, not a set that contains unknown goods and bads. Being unknown, they simply can't and so needn't be taken into consideration, bracketing issues of foreseeability. So in the assassinated terrorist case, there is one known bad outcome immanent – the death – so there is one reason to intervene, and there is no known (or probable or foreseeable) bad, or if there are, such as slightly wounding the assailant, they are clearly outweighed, so the right thing to do is to intervene. So the consequentialist portion of one's moral theory can be made adequately subjective to avoid the problem. (Bergmann and Rea 2005 pursue a defense along these lines.) An alternative reply is to adopt a proximate consequentialism that only assesses the direct causal consequences of an act or otherwise more narrowly circumscribes the delineation of consequences (see Sinott-Armstrong 2011 for an account of direct causal consequentialism, see Collins, Hall, Paul 2004 on denying the transitivity of causation).

One concern with this response is that it is plausible that known goods and bads are a sound basis for action only if one has reason to think that the sample goods and bads are representative of all connected goods and bads with respect to the property of justifying the action, that is, that one has reason to think that knowing the wider story would not reverse one's judgment, or at least lack reason for thinking the wider story would lead in another direction. It is even more plausible that known goods and bads are a sound basis for action only if it is not the case that agnosticism is not the justified attitude toward the proposition that the sample reasons are representative of the total (objective) reasons, and, more plausible yet, if the individual has thought of this. Furthermore, some (Hasker 2010b) think it is bad enough that skeptical theism admits that we can never have good reason to believe an act is all-things-considered the best, for we do sometimes have good reason to think that some action is on-the-whole best in the sense of having the best outcome.

Also, skeptical theists can claim to have another route to knowing an act is best, such as divine revelation, though it is not clear that the problems don't recur, since one would need reason to think God didn't have sufficient reason for deception in the purported revelation.

6. The Scope of Skeptical Theism

Skeptical theism has historically been aimed only at the noseeum inference. But not all versions of the problem of evil rely on the noseeum inference.

6.1 Skeptical Theism and Explanatory Arguments

Skeptical theism appears to have nothing to say about a Humean argument from evil. A broadly Humean argument (Draper 1989/1996, 2008, and 2009) will invoke explanatory considerations such as explanatory power and simplicity. So consider this explanatory argument for naturalism.

  1. The distribution of suffering in the world is more to be expected on naturalism than theism.
  2. Naturalism is at least approximately as simple a theory as theism.
  3. If 1 & 2, then naturalism is a better explanation of evil than theism.
  4. If 3, then the evidence of evil confirms naturalism over theism.

There is no noseeum inference in this argument. Do any of the skeptical theist strategies work against this argument? Bergmann (2009, 383ff) thinks so. For he thinks that premise 1 depends on assigning a value to the probability of this (kind of) distribution of suffering, given theism. But that's just what he thinks we can't do, given his skeptical theses.

Skeptical theism attempts to block Premise 1 of the above argument by blocking an assignment of probability to observed evil on theism. However, consider this reformulation. Given: The universe seems indifferent to the suffering of sentient beings.

1′. It is known that the hypothesis of indifference predicts the data of an apparently indifferent universe.

2. It is unknown whether the hypothesis of theism predicts the data.

3. The hypotheses have approximately equal prior probabilities [that is, equal chance of being true before considering observational evidence].

4. Therefore, the data confirm the hypothesis of indifference and not the hypothesis of theism.

Here is how the argument works. Imagine a pair of scales in which we are weighing evidence concerning theism and atheism. Once side of the scales is labeled “Theism” and the other side is labeled “Hypothesis of Indifference.” Premise 3 says the scales are at first even. Premise 2 says that there is nothing to put on the sale marked “Theism.” Premise 1 says that there is something to put in the scale marked “Hypothesis of Indifference.” The conclusion says that after we have weighed the evidence, the scales tip to the side labeled “Hypothesis of Indifference.”

Not only does this argument not make a noseeum inference, it doesn't assign any probability at all to observed evils given theism. So this version seems to be fundamentally immune to considerations pertaining to skeptical theism, except insofar as they can be brought to bear on premise 3.

6.2 Skeptical Theism and the Common Sense Problem of Evil

A similar issue to the above stems from the Common Sense Problem of Evil. The problem is this (Cf. Dougherty 2008). A reasonable person can have a network of background beliefs about what to expect from an infinitely resourceful being such that the addition of facts about evil can cause them to have a basic (non-inferred) belief that God does not exist. Though the justification depends on support relations that might be called “inferential” in the sense that were we to consciously rehearse them in steps we would call it an inference, there are no inferences made, thus no noseeum inference. Thus, the fact that the world strikes them as nothing like what theism would predict – when, say, an evil strikes them as unjustifiable – no standard form of skeptical theism can apply, since all extant skeptical theisms are aimed at noseeum inferences. The common sense problem of evil arises when people see the world as unjustifiably bad (cf. Gellman 1992).

Consider the thesis of Reasons Commonsensism (RC).

RC: If it seems to S that p, then S thereby has some reason for p.

Now consider the following values for p:

P1: That evil is unjustified.

P2: That evil is unjustifiable

P3: God would never allow that.

P4: That is absolutely impermissible to allow.

P5: The universe is indifferent to our suffering.

P6: There is no God.

There are possible, and probably actual, individuals who jointly satisfy the following criteria at a given time:

C1: At least some value of p (listed above) satisfies RC for S (and so S thereby has a reason to believe p).

C2: S‘s background evidence contains nothing that supports ~p more strongly than the reason they get for p from C1 holding.

C3: S‘s background evidence contains nothing that supports the thesis that the appearance that p is misleading strongly enough to reduce the support S has for p in virtue of C1 holding to the point that it is more reasonable for them to believe ~p rather than p.

C4: The relevant subset of S's cognitive faculties are functioning properly in the relevant respects.

Such individuals have immediate, non-inferential justification for believing that atheism is true. Thus, skeptical theism as standardly devised – a mechanism of attack on a noseeum inference – does not apply. The Non-starter thesis – that evil does not even provide a prima facie reason against theism that would need to be countered by skeptical considerations – is false when applied to the Common Sense Problem of Evil. Perhaps skeptical theists could adapt their strategy to offering a defeater for the reason one acquires when one satisfies C1–C4, but this does change the debate significantly (see Matheson 2011, forthcoming and Dougherty 2011b, forthcoming).

Bergmann (2012) offers an error theory to explain away the overwhelming impression of unjustifiability: that we can't grasp evils much worse than ones which give rise to this impression. But this seems irrelevant, for the spectrum of truly horrendous evils is broad enough that the impression of unjustifiability can be generated from the lower end of the spectrum, leaving instances at the higher end as proof that we can conceive of worse evils than those minimally sufficient for generating the common sense problem of evil.

7. New Frontiers in Skeptical Theism

This entry has thus far considered the present scope and limits of skeptical theism. Now, briefly, possible future extensions of skeptical theism will be considered.

7.1 Degrees of Skepticism

Between Bergmannian skeptical theism and van Inwagenian skeptical theism, there are many degrees. One way in which skeptical theism can be expanded is as follows. In the van Inwagen case, the way skepticism plays into the defense is this. He says, “Here's a story containing both God and the pattern of evil we observe, and, because we know so little, we don't know it's not true.” But this claim seems weak. Suppose that the probability threshold for knowledge is approximately .95. That puts these stories – the most that is said for which is that it is not the case that we know they are false – at between just greater than zero and perhaps 5%. There is room for this strategy to be expanded to the broad category between this and the truly credible, i.e. between 5% and whatever probability is sufficient for belief, which some say is greater than 50% (Swinburne, 2001) and others think as high as that for knowledge (Williamson 2000). For example, one might have a story one takes very seriously, one might even be somewhat tempted to believe it, which one advocates as what we might call a “serious” possibility to implicate its greater weight over “real” possibilities. van Inwagen is explicit that “real” possibilities do not have to be plausible (1996, 160–1). There might be many such stories which due to some kind of cognitive limitation, we can't support with great strength, not quite enough to believe, but which are very plausible (start at 50/50 and go in either direction – stories that are 30% likely, say, or 60% likely). These kinds of stories place significant limits on how much probability evil drains from theism. These stories would be more like the “just so” stories scientists tell to cover anomalies. They range from the merely not-known-not-to-be-false to the not-quite-believable-but-quite-credible. Our ignorance often puts possibilities in the neighborhood of 50%, and such stories can have significant effects on the final probability of theism. For if p entails ~q, and p is 50% likely, q has serious problems stemming from our evidence for p, even though we are far from knowing whether p is true or false.

7.2 Skepticisms Involved in the Problem of Animal Pain

Rowe's original argument (1979) focused on the death of a fawn in a forest fire. The case of animal suffering illustrates ways in which skeptical theism can be applied beyond the ways it has been thus far. Until surprisingly recently, the suffering of non-human animals was not a major factor in the problem of evil. But with the rise of concern for animal welfare, that problem has emerged as a major part of the problem of evil.

7.2.1 Skepticism about Animal Pain

Many skeptical theists attempt to rebut the argument from evil by urging skepticism about our ability to discern God's reasons for action. But the skeptical theist might seek to block the argument from evil by directing skepticism at other targets. For example, Michael Murray, who is explicitly skeptical of human cognitive ability to address animal suffering (2008, 199), is skeptical of our ability to know whether animals experience morally significant pain. He considers arguments originating from Descartes and others that some kind of higher-order thought is required for experience to be morally significant. He is explicit that he is not defending these views as probable (2008, 58) but, rather, only as such that a person can have a reasonable perspective that does not entail their rejection (2008, 72). This clearly has the marks of a skeptical theist strategy, but, quite unlike Wykstra's strategy, the skepticism at play is not motivated by God's greatness or, as in the cases of van Inwagen and Bergmann, a kind of general moral-modal skepticism, but, rather, a very different kind of human cognitive limitation: our inability to penetrate the mind of the animal.

7.2.2 Skepticism about the Finality of Death for Animals

Another natural extension of skeptical theist reasoning that is illustrated in the case of animals is skepticism about whether we know their post-mortem fate. So suppose one is a reasonable agnostic, suspending judgment about whether or not there is a God, but having somewhat better reason to doubt than to believe that there is a God. If the skeptical theist can make a good argument that it is highly likely (given theism) that animals' suffering will be defeated in an afterlife – where, following Marilyn McCord Adams (2000), an evil, like suffering, “is defeated within the context of the individual's life if the individual's life is a good whole to which [the evil] bears the relevant organic being relevantly integrated into [the individual's] relation to a great enough good” (28,29) – then the agnostic's own skepticism about whether there is a God or not commits them to skepticism about whether or not animals' suffering is defeated in the afterlife. And without knowing whether or not animals' suffering is defeated in the afterlife, the case against God from animal suffering is severely blunted.


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This entry was much improved in certain places as a result of detailed comments by Daniel Howard-Snyder, who has my thanks for them. I did not follow all his suggestions, which may be the explanation for certain errors and infelicities which no doubt remain. Michael Bergmann also commented on large portions of a draft. Matt Getz, Naomi Luce, Allison Thornton, John Giannini, Chris Tweedt, and Nick Colgrove also made helpful comments and provided editorial support without which it would not be. Writing this entry was funded in part by a generous grant from the Institute for Studies of Religion, Baylor University, and also with the support of the Center for Philosophy of Religion as Skeptical Theism Fellow (funded by the John Templeton Foundation). The saving grace of an electronic resource is that errors can be fixed as they are noted. The author will be thankful for the discovery of any errors.

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