The moral issues posed by revolutions are both practically important and theoretically complex. There are also interesting conceptual questions as to how to distinguish revolution from resistance, rebellion, and secession, all of which also involve opposition to existing political authority. Unfortunately, the recent renaissance in just war theorizing focuses implicitly on interstate wars and thus has largely ignored the morality of revolution, at least as a topic worthy of systematic theorizing in its own right. Recent work on the morality of asymmetrical warfare, on terrorism, and on humanitarian military intervention provides valuable resources for constructing a theory of the morality of revolution, but until the appearance of Christopher Finlay’s book, Terrorism and the Right to Resist: A Theory of Just Revolutionary War (2015), nothing approaching a systematic account of the morality of revolution has been available. In other words, moral theorizing relevant to revolution has been rather fragmentary and adventitious, because it has mainly occurred in the pursuit of other topics rather than as part of an inquiry directed squarely at the phenomenon of revolution. Furthermore, although prominent figures in the history of Philosophy have held views on revolution, they have primarily concentrated on the issue of just cause (and in some cases on rightful authority to wage revolutionary war), without addressing a number of other moral problems that revolutions raise, such as the question of whether revolutionaries can rightly use forms of violence that the armed forces of states are morally prohibited from using and whether they may conscript fighters, punish defectors and traitors, and expropriate property needed for the struggle. There are hopeful signs, however, that moral theorists will soon give revolution the attention it deserves.
The plan of this entry is as follows. Section 1 discusses conceptual issues, distinguishing between different understandings of revolution and between violent and nonviolent revolution; it also distinguishes revolution from resistance, rebellion and secession. Because violent revolution poses the most serious and difficult moral issues, it will be the focus of the remainder of the entry. The morality of nonviolent resistance to political authority is itself sufficiently distinctive, significant and complex to warrant a separate entry.
Section 2 outlines in broad relief some of the major historical views on the morality of revolution and demonstrates how far short of a comprehensive account of just revolutionary war they fall. Section 3 lays out seven morally relevant differences between revolutionary wars and interstate wars that a theory of just revolutionary war should heed. Section 4 is structured by the traditional just war theory division between jus ad bellum (the just initiation of war) and jus in bello (the just conduct of war). With respect to the former, it is argued that it is necessary to distinguish different moral issues faced by different parties: the aspiring revolutionary leadership who take it upon themselves to initiate revolutionary war and ordinary individuals who are faced with the decision whether to join the revolutionary struggle or not. This section, drawing on the distinctive features of revolutionary wars set out in the preceding section, identifies the special moral issues faced by the aspiring revolutionary leadership, showing that the actions they must undertake to have a good prospect of succeeding in war against the most oppressive regimes are extremely morally problematic. It also shows that these particular moral problems are obscured by mainstream just war theory’s focus on war between states—in other words, between entities that already have recognized leadership for war, are already able to mobilize effective armed forces, and that have legitimate political institutions or at least have access to resources for constructing legitimacy. The aspiring revolutionary leadership, in contrast, must struggle to achieve acknowledgment of its leadership in the face of rival claimants to leadership, must mobilize forces for war in spite of the regime’s imposition of extreme costs for participation in revolution, must “punish” traitors and informants, and yet typically lacks opportunities for establishing its legitimacy with regard to the undertaking of any of these tasks. This section emphasizes the difficulty of satisfying the requirement of “rightful authority” for waging war in the case of revolutionary wars. Also included here are critical discussions of competing views on two issues central to just revolutionary war theory: whether revolutionary warriors may use tactics and strategies prohibited to combatants in interstate wars and whether revolutionary war to overthrow “lesser tyrannies”, regimes that violate civil and political rights but do not inflict killings, maimings, or enslavement on their peoples, is justifiable.
The Conclusion emphasizes some of the major results of the investigation and suggests two further topics that a comprehensive theory of just revolutionary war should address: the morality of intervention in revolution and how it is shaped by the morality of revolution; and the moral assessment of the international Law of Armed Conflict’s asymmetric treatment of the rights of combatants fighting on behalf of states and revolutionary fighters.
At present, no set of competing theories of the morality of revolution is currently available for critical comparison. Consequently, the emphasis will be more on laying out the problems such theories should address, rather than on setting out all of the alternatives for addressing them.
- 1. Conceptual Matters
- 2. Some Major Figures’ Views on the Morality of Revolution
- 3. Distinctive Features of Revolutionary Wars
- 4. Revolutionary Jus ad bellum, Revolutionary Jus in bello
- 5. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Conceptual Matters
Several terms are used to denote extra-constitutional rejection of an existing government’s authority, either tout court or in some particular domain: resistance, rebellion, secession, revolution. Resistance need not be total; it can instead involve disobeying some particular law or laws or efforts to thwart a government’s policies or the government’s attempt to perform particular actions; and resistance can take a number of forms, including acts of disobedience that are not only public but designed to achieve maximal publicity (as in the case of civil disobedience), as well as covert acts of noncompliance; and it may also be either peaceful or nonviolent and disruptive or not. Rebellion, usefully distinguished from resistance, involves a wholesale rejection of government’s authority. But such a rejection of governmental authority could be undertaken for quite different reasons, whether to do away with government altogether (the anarchist’s goal), to establish a new government with the same domain of territorial authority, to create a new territorial unit out of part of the territory of the existing government (secession), or to sever part of the territory of the government and join it to another existing state (irredentist secession). Revolution is commonly understood to have two components: rejection of the existing government’s authority and an attempt to replace it with another government, where both involve the use of extra-constitutional means. On this reading, revolution and rebellion share a negative aim, the wholesale rejection of a government’s authority, but revolution includes in addition a positive aim, to institute a new government in place of the one it has destroyed.
Some important empirical work relevant to the morality of revolutionary war is to be found in studies of civil war. The latter is sometimes defined as a large scale armed conflict between state forces and one or more nonstate parties. This definition may be too restrictive, however, since it would exclude a large-scale armed conflict between two or more nonstate parties under conditions in which the government had disintegrated entirely or still existed but was not capable of fielding forces. A broader understanding of civil war that would encompass that kind of case would be simply that of a large-scale intrastate armed conflict.
The preceding terms are not always sorted out in this way in actual political discourse. For example, the government of the United States labeled the secession of the Southern states from the Union as a rebellion, while many Confederates called their enterprise the Second American Revolution; and the American colonists who strove to secede from the British Empire tended to call themselves revolutionaries, not secessionists or rebels. (It may be that the Americans avoided the term “rebel” because they thought it had negative connotations). Similarly, the Algerian secession from France is often referred to as the Algerian Revolution and wars of colonial liberation are rarely called secessionist conflicts, though their goal is secession from a political order centered on a metropolitan state. In what follows, the term “revolution” will be reserved for extra-constitutional attempts to destroy an existing national government and replace it, to the full extent of its territorial authority, with a new government. On this way of sorting out the various terms, secessionists and revolutionaries are necessarily rebels, while rebels need be neither secessionists nor revolutionaries (they may be anarchists), and secessionists, as such are not revolutionaries.
Sometimes the term “revolution” is used in a stronger sense, as denoting not just an extra-constitutional attempt to replace one government with another, but also to effect a fundamental change in the type of government, as in a revolution to overthrow an autocracy and create in its stead a democracy. Thus some scholars on the Left have contended that the so-called American Revolution was not really a revolution, because it did not create or even aim at anything other than a new form of the bourgeois state—a state controlled by and in the interest of the class that controls the means of production (Zinn 1980, Jennings 2000). Many American historians have concluded otherwise, asserting that it was a revolution in the stronger sense because it replaced a monarchy with a republic (Nash 2005; Wood 1993). On this stronger understanding of revolution as involving a fundamental change in the type of government, secessionists would also be revolutionaries, if the new government they attempt to establish in part of the territory of the state would be of a fundamentally different type. Obviously, this stronger conception of revolution is no clearer and less contentious than attempts to distinguish fundamentally different types of government (hence the debate over whether the war for the independence of the American Colonies from Britain was “really” a revolution). For the remainder of the discussion I will use “revolution” in the weaker sense, with the understanding that it can also encompasses revolutions in the stronger sense. It is worth noting, however, that the morality of revolution in the stronger sense is, if anything, more complex than that of the weaker sense, because the former involves not only the extra-constitutional overthrow of the existing government but also the extra-constitutional establishment of a new type of government.
One more distinction is needed. Revolutions may be violent or nonviolent and may begin nonviolently and become violent. This distinction, though obviously important, is not so crisp as one might think, because what counts as violence may be disputed. For example, attempts to overthrow a government by disruptive techniques (for example conducting general strikes, disabling power grids, or blocking main transportation routes) are not violent in the way in which discharging firearms or detonating explosives is, but they may nonetheless cause lethal harms. The chief topic of this entry is violent revolution where “violence” is understood in the most robust way and as occurring on a large scale; in other words, the topic is revolutionary war as “war” is usually understood (Singer & Small 1994: 5).
It is well worth noting, however, that there is a position on revolution that obviates the need for a theory of just revolutionary war, namely, the view that large-scale revolutionary violence is never morally justified because the risks of such an endeavor are so great and because nonviolent revolution is more efficacious. Some empirical political scientists have argued that there is good evidence that nonviolent revolution is more likely to achieve its ends than revolutionary war (Chenoweth & Stephan 2011). Even if that is true as a generalization, the question remains as to whether there are exceptions—cases where nonviolence is not likely to achieve the aims of just revolution or would only achieve them with undue costs in terms of human well-being—and whether they can be identified ex ante. If there are any such cases, there is a need for a theory of just revolutionary war.
2. Some Major Figures’ Views on the Morality of Revolution
No attempt can be made here to conduct a survey of views on revolution across the history of Western Philosophy, much less one that encompasses other traditions. Instead, it must suffice to say that the typical attitude toward revolution of major figures in the Western tradition prior to the modern period was to condemn it or to acknowledge its moral permissibility only in very narrow circumstances (Morkevicius 2014). Augustine (City of God) and Aquinas (Summa theologiae), for example, both condemn rebellion and hence revolution, unambiguously urging obedience to the powers that be. Suárez (1609) held that only “lesser magistrates” had the authority to try to overthrow an existing government, with the implication that revolution by those who do not already occupy official roles was never justified. Hobbes (1651), whom some consider the first truly modern political philosopher in the Western tradition, explicitly denied that revolution could ever be justified, holding instead that a subject could only rightly resist government authority as a matter of self-defense and then only when the perpetration of lethal harm against her was imminent.
Views that reject revolution outright or hold it to be permissible in only the most extreme of circumstances typically have either or both of two rationales. The first is an overriding aversion to the perceived risk of violent anarchy posed by attempts to overthrow a government (the Undue Risk Argument). The second is the conviction that the requirement of rightful authority cannot, as a matter of logical necessity, be met in the case of revolutionary war (The Conceptual Argument).
Consider first the Undue Risk Argument for the conclusion that revolution is never or only rarely justified. Put most simply, the idea here is that virtually any government is better than none and that while it is true that revolutions (as opposed to mere rebellions) aim not merely to destroy existing government but to replace it with something better, they may succeed only in the first, destructive task, or not succeed in the second, constructive task until an unacceptable decrement in physical security has occurred. Such views have often been grounded in a rather pessimistic view of human nature. While some Medieval thinkers may have attributed the risk of extreme violence when government authority is rejected to man’s supposedly irrational and selfish nature, Hobbes (1651) in contrast can be interpreted as attributing it to human rationality, without any assumption that all or even most human beings are bloody-minded or subject to overweening desires for domination. On this interpretation of Hobbes, where there is no government—no power capable of enforcing rules conducive to physical security—it is rational for individuals to try to dominate others for purely defensive reasons, even if there is only a minority of individuals who seek domination for its own sake. It is not man’s sinful nature, but his rationality, combined with the game-theoretic structure of the condition of anarchy, that makes lack of government so lethally dangerous.
At least in the classical liberal tradition, according to which individuals have rights prior to the institution of government and in which governments are viewed as trustees, agents of the people, the attitude toward revolution is generally more permissive. There is a right to revolt when government violates those natural rights for the protection of which it was created. Locke (1689) apparently goes further: on one interpretation, he holds that the people at its own discretion may rightly revoke the trusteeship, that is, dissolve the government, even in the absence of the state’s violation of natural rights or failure to protect them. They could, for example, dissolve the government in order to form a new one that they simply thought was more efficient. Locke apparently attempts to dull the edge of this rather radical conclusion by assuming, quite gratuitously, that revolution will not occur unless the people as a whole have already suffered greatly at the hands of the government. He might also have thought that in cases where the present government was not violating natural rights, dissolving it was only permissible if done through a constitutionally sanctioned process, not through revolution.
Locke does not explicitly consider two possibilities that have frequently been realized in actual revolutionary circumstances: first, that governmental oppression may not be universal but instead may target only certain groups within society, for example, religious or ethnic or national minorities or those who criticize government; second, that even if there is general oppression there may not be a sufficient spontaneous mobilization of forces to overthrow the government. Consequently, Locke conveniently sidesteps two questions that a theory of the morality of revolution ought to address: (1) whether revolution to end special as opposed to general oppression is justifiable; and (2) what means may those already committed to revolution employ to mobilize enough others to participate in revolution to make success possible. The first question is significant because of the possibility that the harm to innocent people—including a general decrease in physical security—that revolution may entail, has somehow to be weighed against the benefit in terms of relief from injustice that the oppressed minority will get if the revolution ultimately succeeds. Even if the injustices done to the minority ought to be given greater weight in the balancing exercise, there may come a point at which revolution fails a proportionality test if the harms to others that will result from remedying minority rights-violations are great enough. The second question arises because even where oppression is general there may not be sufficiently widespread participation in revolution to achieve success, either because significant portions of the population, in the grip of an ideology that purports to justify the existing political order, do not see themselves as seriously oppressed, or because of the failure to solve collective action problems. If either of these two conditions obtain, mobilizing enough people to have a good chance of successful revolution may require coercion under conditions in which those who would wield it lack legitimacy and in which the institutional resources that could confer legitimacy are unavailable.
Locke took a more favorable stance toward revolution than Hobbes or his medieval predecessors, because he did not believe that the risks of physical insecurity attendant upon the destruction of an existing government were as high as those thinkers did. That more optimistic view as grounded, in turn, in his belief that the destruction of the political order need not entail the destruction of society—that is, of social practices and habits that effectively control the most serious forms of violence. It is a mistake, however, to conclude either that Hobbes was right and Locke was wrong or vice versa about the consequences for physical security of the destruction of government. A generalization either way would be unhelpful. A more reasonable view is that the risks of the destruction of government and hence of revolution vary, depending upon the circumstances. If that is so, and if the justifiability of revolution depends even in part on the severity of the risks of physical insecurity it involves, then it appears that the content of a theory of just revolutionary war must be shaped by empirical considerations. Yet it is fair to say that many philosophers who have had something to say about just revolutionary war, whether explicitly or by implication in their work on interstate wars, have not taken this point to heart. They have either not understood the importance of empirical assumptions about the risks of revolution or made the relevant empirical assumptions but without supplying sufficient evidence for their validity. Without a well-evidenced empirical account of the conditions under which attempts to overthrow the government are likely to cause violent anarchy, and an account of the conditions under which violent anarchy is likely to continue for some significant period of time, both pessimism and optimism about revolution, and the calculations of proportionality on which the justification for revolution is supposed to depend, will be more a matter of faith than reason.
The second or conceptual argument or denying that revolution is justifiable is attributed to Kant on what might be called the Rousseauian interpretation of his view, as articulated perhaps most clearly by Christine Korsgaard (2008) and Katrin Flikschuh (2008). (1) to be justified, an attempt to overthrow the existing political authority would have to be an expression of, or authorized by, the general will; otherwise it would be the imposition of a private will or private wills and hence contrary to right; (2) but only the existing supreme political authority can express or be the authorized agent of the general will; therefore (3) revolution can never be justified. This argument against revolution, unlike Hobbesian-style undue risk arguments, does not rely upon unsupported empirical assumptions about the uniformly dire consequences for physical insecurity of attempts to destroy existing governments. It is vulnerable, however, to a different objection, namely, that when government is sufficiently tyrannical and destructive, the lesser of evils may be for someone to act without possessing authority—in other words, that the use of coercion, if it is necessary to achieve the conditions for basic justice and involves the minimal amount of coercion needed to accomplish that, can be morally justified even if it is not wielded by an agent that possesses legitimacy (Buchanan 2013, 2016). Framed in Kantian terms, this is the view that in extreme cases the imposition of the basic order needed for the realization of rights can be justified even if it is the imposition of a private will, so long as the object of that will is the common good of justice properly conceived, so long as the coercion employed is the least needed to do the job, and so long as the agent undertaking to create order is likely to be capable of succeeding in doing so.
The conceptual version of Kant’s denial that revolution can be justified is distinct from a different Kantian argument that is more akin to the Undue Risk Argument: (i) all human beings are indefeasibly obligated to contribute to getting out of and staying out of a condition in which universal right cannot be realized, (ii) universal right can only be realized where government exists and is recognized as authoritative, (iii) to revolt is both to try to destroy the existing government and to deny its authority, and therefore (iv) revolution can never be justified. This second interpretation of Kant’s view holds that to engage in revolution is not just to create an unacceptably high risk of general insecurity but also to violate a fundamental obligation to contribute to the conditions for the realization of universal right. In more contemporary terms, it is an argument against revolution based on a strong interpretation of the Natural Duty of Justice, the obligation to help bring about and sustain the conditions for justice.
The Natural Duty Argument is vulnerable to an obvious objection: If the existing government is so awful as to thwart even a decent approximation of the realization of universal right, and if revolution presents a better prospect for doing so, then the moral obligation to create the conditions for the realization of universal right speaks in favor of revolution, not against it (Finlay 2015: 19–52).
Whereas liberal political philosophers have tended to frame the justification or revolution in terms of remedying government’s violation of natural rights or its failure to acknowledge the people’s revocation of its trusteeship (for example by rejecting the results of an election), revolution in the Marxist tradition is understood quite differently. There is one strain of Marx interpretation according to which he rejects rights-talks altogether, either in favor of the discourse of conflicting interests or in favor of the vocabulary of self-realization or mankind’s overcoming of alienation from its “species being” (Buchanan 1982). On this interpretation, Marx held that the very concept of rights is an ideological construct that is fostered by and in turn reinforces the egoistic psychology of bourgeois society and will be discarded once the transition to developed communist society occurs. If the very concept of rights is thus both tainted and fated for obsolescence, then the question arises as to how else the justification for proletarian revolution might be framed (Finlay 2006). One answer that is consistent at least with the early writings of Marx is that proletarian revolution is needed to destroy the conditions of alienation and create the conditions for the full realization of man’s nature as a creative, communal being, the sort of being who will, through processes of scientifically informed collective decision-making, bring the natural and social world fully under deliberate human control for the good of all (Economic & Philosophical Manuscripts of 1844, in MER: 66–125).
Even if Marx thought that successful revolution could be correctly described as the overcoming of alienation or more positively as the realization of human “species being”, it is doubtful that he thought that proletarian revolution needed to be justified in this or any other way. There is, after all, a Marx who derides “moralistic” socialists and who seems to hold that successful proletarian revolution is a matter of the historically inevitable realization of the common interests of the proletariat, and that the revolution will be effectively motivated by those interests, not by a commitment to any moral principle (On the Division of Labor in Production in MER: 683–717). Such an interpretation fits well with Marx’s understanding of his theory of history as scientific and realistic. According to this account, the question of whether revolution is justified is idle; it will occur, because the revolution in the mode of production that marks the transition from capitalism to communism will produce a fundamental transformation of all social relationships that will carry human beings beyond the state and beyond politics (Critique of the Gotha Programme, Part IV, 1875 in MER: 525–541). Call this the Amoralist interpretation of Marx on revolution.
To the extent that the Amoralist interpretation includes an account of the motivation (as opposed to the justification) of proletarian revolution, it is simple and rationalistic: eventually the workers will realize that overthrow of the capitalist order is in their interests and will act accordingly. There are two apparently fatal problems with such a view. First, according to Marx’s own thinking, the proletariat will mobilize against the capitalist order only when the capitalism has reached such a pitch of alienation, exploitation, and immiseration that the workers have nothing to lose but their chains (Capital, Volume 1, 1894, in MER: 329–343; Manifesto of the Communist Party, 1848, in MER: 500). Marx believes that this is bound to occur because the capitalist system gives every capitalist an overriding incentive to keep squeezing as much labor out of his workers as possible, even if every capitalist reads Capital and can foresee that that the aggregate effect of such behavior will result in the overthrow of the system. But this means that Marx assumed that the capitalists as a class were afflicted by a collective action problem they could not solve—that even though it is in their collective interests to avoid the immiseration of the proletariat, each will find it rational to act in a way that will contribute to immiseration. On the contrary, it can be argued that the capitalists solved their collective action problem by the creation of the modern welfare state—a device that sufficiently alleviates the plight of the workers to thwart mobilization for revolution, but without destroying the dominance of the bourgeoisie. Second, while Marx gives us no good reason to think that the capitalists will succumb to an insoluble collective action problem, he fails to take seriously the collective action problem faced by the proletariat (Cohen 1978, Elster 1985). As with revolutions generally, each individual may reason that either enough others will mobilize to enable a successful revolution or they will not, that her own participation in revolution is likely to come at a significant cost, that she will reap the benefits of the revolution if it succeeds, and that therefore the rational course of action is to abstain from participation. The key point here is that the workers lack the resource for solving their collective action problem that the capitalists can use to solve theirs: control over the state and hence access to enforcement of rules that can change incentives for refraining from contributing to a public good. Marx not only fails to take the proletariat’s collective action problem seriously; his theory of alienation implies that it will be severe, because one of the effects of capitalism is to turn workers against each other in the competition for employment and produce among them the egoistic psychology typical of all people living under capitalism (Buchanan 1979). In brief, the Amoralist Marx’s attempt to side-step the question of whether or under what conditions revolution is morally justified fails, because his interest-based account of revolutionary motivation makes the revolution depend upon the immiseration of the proletariat, wrongly assumes that the capitalist class will not be able to act collectively to avoid immiseration, and wrongly assumes that if the proletariat come to see that their interests require the overthrow of the system they will in fact revolt.
A natural Marxian reply might be to abandon the claim that interest-based motivation is causally sufficient for successful proletarian revolution, holding instead that the proletariat can come to see that capitalism is incompatible with the dignity of human beings or with the full realization of their potential for harmonious, creative, collective control over the natural and social world and the abolition of all forms of exploitation and exploitation. On this view, the motivation for revolution is a kind of perfectionist ethics or, more modestly, a desire to end human degradation.
The idea would be that the proletarians only encounter an insoluble collective action problem if each worker (or enough of them) operates in the calculating mode, weighing the costs and benefits of participation, as they decide whether to revolt. One might think that it is a distinctive feature of some types of moral motivation that they can lead individuals to escape the calculating mode that produces collective action problems. Not all types of moral motivation would do the trick, of course. If the workers were overall utility-maximizers, each might still decide to refrain from revolution, reasoning that either enough others will participate to enable the revolution to succeed or they will not, regardless of whether she participates and that her participation would simply be an unnecessary subtraction from overall utility. Other kinds of moral motivation, including those that are expressions of commitment to deontological principles, might in contrast, preclude the individual from making the calculations that produce the proletariat’s collective action problem. Such principles can serve as “exclusionary reasons” and what they exclude from consideration is cost-benefit calculations.
Abandoning the Amoralist Marxian account of revolution would mean ignoring the numerous “scientific realist” passages in Marx’s writings and ignoring his scorn for moralistic socialists. But there would still remain two problems, one internal to the Marxist view and the other independent of it. The first problem is that it is hard to see, given Marx’s views on ideology, how the proletarian masses could, while subject to the consciousness distorting forces of capitalism, come to rally around a perfectionist ethic or form allegiance to any moral principle that would require the complete overthrow of capitalism. Marx apparently thought that the curtain of ideology would be torn aside by the immiseration of the proletariat—that when they reached the full depths of deprivation and degradation they would come to see that capitalism had to go. But Marx was wrong in his prediction that immiseration would occur: in most societies under capitalism, real wages have risen and the welfare state has alleviated the plight of the workers--just enough. The second problem is that recent empirical work on revolutions indicates that in many cases—perhaps most—what determines whether an individual will participate in the revolution or even support it in any way is whether the regime or the revolutionaries control the area in which the individual lives (Kalyvas 2006, Weinstein 2007). If that is so, then it appears that in many cases moral motivation is causally irrelevant; it is the interest in avoiding the costs imposed by those who wield coercive power over the individual, whether they be agents of the regime or those already committed to the revolution, that determines participation or nonparticipation in revolution. But if that is so, then the topic of the morality of revolution cannot be avoided, because it will always be appropriate to ask whether those who possess coercive power ought to use it and if so how they ought to use it.
As was suggested earlier, in many revolutionary contexts the people are caught in a destructive strategic interaction between the regime and those already committed to revolution, as the regime raises the costs of participation and the revolutionaries raise the cost of nonparticipation. Some of the most difficult moral issues concerning revolution pertain to the permissibility of coercive means for solving the revolutionary collective action problem in the context of this strategic interaction.
By way of summary and as a broad generalization, it is fair to say that at least since the time of Locke (1689), the dominant view on revolution in Western Political Philosophy, both in the Liberal and Marxist traditions, and perhaps in popular political culture as well, has been considerably more permissive than that of Hobbes (1651) and Kant (1797) and their medieval predecessors. For the remainder of this essay, I will focus on broadly liberal approaches to revolution on the assumption that, for the foreseeable future, the development of a genuine theory of just revolutionary war is most likely to develop by utilizing the resources of liberal political theory. This strategy is perhaps not as restrictive as it might appear, since contemporary liberal thought accommodates not just the idea of individual rights, but also that of the collective right of self-determination. That is an important qualification, because from the 1950s to the 1970s revolution for many people in non-Western societies meant liberation from colonial rule; and in some cases liberation was framed more in terms of collective self-determination than in terms of the vindication of individual rights. One important question a theory of just revolutionary war ought to answer is whether the realization of the right of collective self-determination is in itself a just cause for revolutionary war or whether it is only so when collective self-determination is the remedy for violations of basic individual rights. This issue is addressed in the next section.
3. Distinctive Features of Revolutionary Wars
A key question that will arise at a number of points in this investigation is whether mainstream just war theory, in spite of its implicit focus on interstate wars provides an adequate account of the morality of revolutionary wars. To answer this question, there are at least seven potentially morally significant differences to keep in mind.
First, satisfaction of the traditional jus ad bellum requirement of “rightful authority” to make war, as suggested above, is more difficult in the case of revolution, especially at the beginning of the conflict, when an often tiny minority undertakes armed struggle against the government and does so supposedly in the name of the people, but where the standard institutional forms or processes for legitimizing the use of violence are unavailable to the revolutionaries. In different terms, the problem is that revolutionaries claim to act on behalf of the people, but under conditions in which it is difficult to see how they could be authorized to do so. Later we will see that attempts to solve this problem by invoking notions of consent, approval, or representation are inadequate in many of the circumstances in which revolutions actually occur—and ironically, especially under those conditions in which the just cause for revolution is most compelling.
Even contemporary theorists acknowledge that the problem of rightful authority is especially difficult in the case of the waging of revolutionary war, the discussion is often at too abstract because it fails to distinguish between different domains of action in which legitimacy can be an issue. Even if, for example, it can be shown that a particular group of revolutionaries is the legitimate leadership in the sense that it can be taken to represent the people as a whole and rightly act on their behalf, it is a separate question as to whether it has the sort of legitimacy required for certain particular activities such as conscripting individuals to fight, using coercion to suppress rival claimants for leadership, or “punishing” traitors or informants.
Second, in interstate wars there is often only one claimant (on each side) to the role of initiating and directing the use of large-scale violence, namely, the state leadership. But in many revolutionary wars, at least at the outset and often far into the conflict, two or more parties engaging in revolutionary violence contend with one another (often violently) to be acknowledged, by the people and by other states and international organizations, as the sole legitimate revolutionary war-maker. So, one difficult moral issue concerns the means that rivals for leadership may use in competition with one another. Revolutions frequently are characterized by violent struggles for leadership, under conditions in which no contender for leadership can claim exclusive legitimacy if any legitimacy at all.
Third, as already noted, because those who attempt to launch revolutions do not possess standing armies or effective authority to raise them, they face a serious collective action problem that established states have already solved: they must mobilize a sufficient portion of the population to make war effectively, in spite of the fact that it will often be rational for any given individual to refrain from participating. Any ordinary individual may reason as follows: whether I participate or not has virtually zero probability of determining the outcome; but participation is a cost, perhaps an extreme cost, to me and perhaps to my family or other close associates as well. So, regardless of what others do, the rational thing for me to do, whether I consider my own utility narrowly construed or include the utility of those I care most about, is to refrain from participating. If enough individuals reason in this way, an insufficient number of people will be mobilized to make the revolution succeed. Collective action problems are not always insoluble, of course. Later we will consider several solutions to what may be called “the revolutionary mobilization collective action problem” (REMCAP for brevity)—each of which will be shown to raise serious moral issues. In other words, it is one thing to say the REMCAP can be solved, another to say it can be solved in a morally acceptable way. By way of preview, it is worth noting that the REMCAP has a crucial strategic dimension: while the aspiring revolutionary leadership will try to overcome the people’s incentives for refraining from participation, whether by providing them with benefits conditional on participation or by imposing costs on them for nonparticipation, the regime will attempt to counter the effort to achieve revolutionary mobilization by providing benefits conditional on nonparticipation or imposing costs on participation. The resulting dynamic takes the game-theoretic structure of an arms race in which both the revolutionary forces and the regime use violence and often terrorism against the people (Buchanan 2013). This spiral of strategic violence is not merely a theoretical possibility: some of the leading empirical work on revolutions indicates that it is typical of the revolutionary environment. One especially interesting empirical finding is that the best predictor of whether an individual will support the revolution or the regime is which force controls the space the individual occupies. (Kalyvas 2006: 131–132). Empirical studies document that the cycle of coercion and counter-coercion in revolutionary struggles is ubiquitous (Kalyvas 2006: 10, 12, 215, 228–229). A just war theory designed for the quite different environment of interstate wars is not likely to address the moral problems raised by this feature of revolutionary wars.
A fourth morally relevant difference between the typical interstate war and revolutionary war is this: in the former, a change in their own government is not usually a goal of the contending parties (though one or both may aim at imposing a new form of government on the other). The goal of revolutionary war-makers in contrast is to change the government and on the stronger understanding of “revolution” to make a fundamental change in the form or character of government. Yet because revolutionaries have repudiated or cannot avail themselves of existing political processes for determining political aims and have not yet developed new processes for performing that task (at least in the earlier stages of the struggle), there may be serious disagreement among revolutionaries as to what the goal of the revolution is, with no nonviolent, much less legitimate process for resolving it. Many may agree that the regime must fall, but there may be deep—and violent--disagreements as to what should follow. This, too, makes revolution a more morally fraught enterprise. Suppose, as was suggested earlier, that revolution differs from mere rebellion in that the latter is simply a rejection of governmental authority while the former involves that plus a commitment to forming a new political order. If that is so, and if revolutionaries lack the institutional resources to determine a common understanding of what the new political order is to be, then the task of evaluating the justness of a revolutionary struggle becomes more difficult. It may be a mistake to say “X is the aim of the revolutionary war-makers” because there may be no one aim and the plurality of aims may be mutually inconsistent, with some being just and others being unjust. It is true, of course that a state that wars with another state will often have more than one war aim and may also have inconsistent aims, but at least in the case of reasonably well-functioning states there is an authoritative, that is, legitimacy-conferring process for determining what the aims of the conflict are and which are to be given priority if they conflict.
Fifth, if one party to an interstate war loses, this will not usually involve a complete destruction of its political order or if it does the victor will often quickly impose some order as it gains control over the vanquished country’s territory. But revolutionary wars present a greater risk of literal anarchy, with all of the threats to human rights and well-being that this usually entails, because revolutionaries, even when they succeed in defeating the regime, may not yet have (and in some cases may never develop) the capacity to impose order. In that sense, the stakes are often higher in revolutionary wars and the traditional likelihood of success requirement of just war theory may be harder to satisfy. There are two other factors, both of which are present in many violent revolutions, that make the problem of creating a new political order that can provide an acceptable level of physical security especially difficult. First, revolutionary conflicts, like other intrastate wars, are often especially brutal, because the lines between combatants and noncombatants tend to be blurred, because of the spiral of coercion stemming from strategic interaction regarding revolutionary mobilization characterized above, and because individuals and groups often use the general context of violence to settle private conflicts that have little or no connection to the issues for which revolution is supposedly undertaken (Kalyvas 2006: 14). So building a secure peace may be hindered by persisting animosity, allegations of atrocities, and the quest for vengeance, while social capital in the form of trust may be in short supply. Second, in the contemporary context, it is often the case that in societies where the just cause for revolution is most compelling, namely, what could be called Resolute Severe Tyrannies, there are deep divisions along religious or ethno-national lines, in large part because the tyrants have fostered such divisions in order to prevent the people from achieving unified opposition to the regime. Where such divisions exist and there is no culture of tolerance and power-sharing, the destruction of the tyrannical regime may result in violent intergroup conflicts, with no indigenous force capable of imposing a peace settlement and building a condition of persisting physical security. Under these conditions, to undertake revolution is to unleash forces that may result either in violent anarchy or unwanted foreign intervention undertaken on the pretext of establishing order.
Sixth, at least under modern conditions, revolutionary wars have the potential to persist longer than interstate wars as they have traditionally been conducted, and hence are likely to involve more human and material destruction other things being equal, because of interventions that serve not to end them but rather to prolong them. It is a feature of contemporary revolutionary wars that they are seldom left to the primary parties. Instead, rival states or groups of rival states often support different sides. In interstate wars, the conflict typically ends when it is clear that there is an indefinitely persisting stalemate and hence both sides are compelled to seek a negotiated peace or when one side overwhelms the other (Wittman 1979; Jones, Bremer & Singer 1996; Wagner 2000). But when revolutions become proxy wars between rival powers, one state is likely to intervene to resupply or otherwise support its proxy to break a stalemate or prevent the other side from achieving victor. That is why most empirical theorists of intrastate war predict that there is no end in sight to the conflict in Syria (Jenkins 2014). This problem is exacerbated by the fact that one or both of the sponsors of the conflicting sides may not have as its top strategic aim a victory for its side. Instead, the dominant goal may actually be to prolong the conflict. To the extent that revolutionaries or regimes who oppose them ought to take the traditional jus ad bellum requirement of likelihood of success into account and also ought to heed the requirement of proportionality, their task is complicated by strategic dynamic that occurs when revolutions are not simple two party affairs, but proxy contests between other parties as well. Intervention makes calculations of both likelihood of success and proportionality more problematic. And if there is a presumption against war unless likelihood of success and proportionality are relatively certain, then it follows that the justification for revolutionary war is even more problematic, other things being equal, than for interstate war.
Seventh, and finally, entrenched tyrannical regimes, the most morally compelling targets for revolution, typically use their control over education and the media to instill propaganda designed to prevent the people from recognizing just how rotten the regime is, how poorly the economy is performing, how inferior the quality of life is compared with that in better governed countries, and how widespread dissatisfaction with the regime actually is. Hence, effective revolutionary action may require the dissipation of false consciousness on the part of the people. The aspiring revolutionary leadership thus may be faced with the task of trying to dismantle the false consciousness of those they hope to enlist in the revolutionary struggle. In actual cases, aspiring leaders have often used violence and sometimes terrorism in an effort to overcome the epistemic obstacles to widespread participation in revolution. For example, they have attacked “soft targets”—policemen or government officials—to demonstrate to the people that “we have the power to hurt them”. Another tactic often used by revolutionaries to overcome epistemic obstacles is to provoke the regime to undertake brutal responses to relatively peaceful demonstrations, in order to reveal to all just how ruthless the regime is. Such actions, which are condemned by mainstream jus in bello thinking, are said to be necessary to instill the sense of agency that false consciousness has undermined. The need to overcome false consciousness or more generally to overcome serious epistemic obstacles to revolution, combined with the revolutionary leadership’s lack of effective peaceful resources for doing so, poses difficult moral choices that are not as frequently encountered by the leaders of states in interstate wars.
For all of these reasons, revolutionary wars tend to present additional moral problems, over and above the daunting issues involved in interstate wars, or, as in the case of likelihood of success and proportionality, to involve more serious instances of difficulties common to both kinds of war. A theory of just revolutionary war ought to take these differences seriously and not begin with the assumption that the commendable work that has recently been done in just war theory—which as has been noted is mainly geared to interstate war—can be adapted without significant modification or augmentation to the revolutionary case. The assumption that mainstream just war theory provides all or even most of what is needed for a theory of just revolutionary wars seems plausible only if one traffics in unhelpful abstractions and fails to look at the differences revealed by the empirical literature on revolutions and the special moral issues they raise. A major conclusion of this entry is that a plausible moral theory of revolution must be informed by the best empirical studies of what actually goes on in revolutionary struggles.
4. Revolutionary Jus ad bellum, Revolutionary Jus in bello
“The morality of making revolutionary war” is too broad a topic. It is necessary to factor out the distinctive moral problems faced by those who initiate revolutionary war and aspire to recruit and lead others in the struggle and those who join the revolution once it is underway and do so without any pretensions to being leaders. These two classes of agents both face some common moral issues, but they also each must resolve moral issues peculiar to their situation.
It was noted in the preceding section that the question “Does agent X have rightful authority to wage revolutionary war?” needs to be abandoned in favor of more fine-grained questions: Does agent X have the rightful authority to start a revolutionary war, to attempt to function as a leader in the struggle, to exercise various functions ordinarily reserved for governments such as punishing defectors and informants, conscripting soldiers, expropriating resources needed for war, and suppressing rival claimants to leadership? An affirmative answer to the first question does not guarantee affirmative answers to the rest.
We may begin with the first question: when do agents have the rightful authority to try to initiate a revolutionary war? This is an appropriate question to ask if one attempts to apply mainstream jus ad bellum theory to the case of revolutionary war, since rightful authority is generally assumed to be a requirement in jus ad bellum. An initially plausible answer is that the agent must stand in a certain relationship to the people on whose behalf the revolutionary war is to be waged. Different theorists have tried to spell out this relationship in different ways, asserting that the initiator of revolutionary war (i) must have the consent of those on whose behalf she claims to act, (ii) must have their approval, (iii) must represent them, or (iv) must take responsibility for their common good (and have the capacity to pursue it effectively). Each of these proposals will be considered in turn. The distinction between consent and approval is to be understood as follows: consent must be provided ex ante, prior to the action to which consent is given; approval is ex post, a retrospective endorsement of an action that has already occurred.
There are two problems with the view that consent of the oppressed is either necessary or sufficient for rightful authority to initiate revolutionary war. First, in virtually every real world situation, consent will not be unanimous; so two questions immediately present themselves and a plausible answer to either is far from obvious: (1) if consent is necessary for rightful authority, how can anyone have rightful authority over those who do not consent; and (2) if the consent of some is sufficient for rightful authority over all, how many must consent (a bare majority, a supermajority, etc.)? If the point of consent is that without it those who initiate revolutionary war are arbitrarily putting those who do not consent at risk, then the fact that some have consented cannot make the imposition of risks on those who did not consent any less arbitrary. Second, in the very circumstances when the just cause for revolution is most compelling, namely, where the regime exercises thorough-going domination and refuses to reform, it will be difficult if not impossible to obtain valid consent, either because the regime will not allow any plausible process of gaining consent or because people will be afraid to affirm their consent out of fear of retaliation by the regime, or because the regime’s oppression will have distorted their consciousness and preferences to such an extent that they are incapable of giving valid consent. John Simmons (1979) has argued that even where the best democratic political processes are available, genuine consent cannot be obtained; if that is so, then it is hardly likely that consent can be gotten in the much less favorable circumstances in which the aspiring revolutionary leadership might seek it.
Because of these difficulties with consent as a criterion for rightful authority, one might think that approval is the appropriate notion. However, the same problems that afflicted consent render approval dubious. If approval is not unanimous, it is hard to see how the approval of some can confer rightful authority over all or justify the imposition of risks on all. But if unanimity is not required, it is unclear how much approval should be required.
The problems with approval and consent might lead one to opt instead for a notion of hypothetical consent or hypothetical approval: an agent has rightful authority to initiate (and attempt to lead) a revolutionary war only if (or if and only if) her doing so would be consented to or approved by a rational person and who rightly values freedom from oppression, under those circumstances. This move presents two difficulties. First, it assumes something very problematic, namely, that hypothetical consent is as morally potent as actual consent (and, even more dubiously) that hypothetical approval can substitute for actual consent. Second, it appears that if a determination can be made of what a rational agent who rightly values freedom from oppression would consent to or approve of, then the whole exercise becomes otiose, because the same result can be achieved by calculating whether the initiation of the war satisfies the conventional criteria of likelihood of success, just cause, and proportionality. In other words, to the extent that the notion of what a rational agent who rightly values freedom from oppression would consent to or approve of can be ascertained, it appears that such an agent would make that determination by employing the least controversial jus ad bellum requirements. Further, different actual people will be affected differently by the revolution if it occurs and will weigh the risks and benefits differently, and should do so to the extent that they are rational. If the notion of a rational agent abstracts from these differences, it is hard to see how what she would approve of or consent to could be relevant to whether revolutionaries should subject actual people to the risks of revolution. If the notion of a rational agent is particularized to the situations of all actual individuals who would be affected by a revolution, some would approve or consent and some would not, so there will be no one answer to the question “Does this have rightful authority?” because there will be no one answer to the question “Would a rational individual who rightly values freedom from oppression consent to this agent initiating and leading a revolutionary war?”
Consider now the claim that those who initiate revolutionary wars (and assume leadership of them) have rightful authority to do so if or if and only if they represent the people (or at least those members of the people who are oppressed).
If “represents” means what it does in the context of ordinary democratic politics, namely, A represents B if and only if A is authorized to act on B’s behalf through some appropriate public political process (such as an election), then this is a non-starter, since an oppressive regime is unlikely to allow any such process. This standard, institutionally-based understanding of representation would work as a criterion of rightful authority to initiate revolutionary war only if one of two conditions were satisfied. First, those who initiate revolutionary war were duly chosen as representatives prior to the advent of an oppressive regime (as when an authoritarian coup usurps an elected government). Second, the constitutional order included pre-authorization for revolution under certain specified conditions. It is worth noting that the French Declaration of the Rights of Man and the Citizen explicitly included a right (and indeed a duty) to resist tyranny and that the Inner Service Act of the Turkish Armed Forces (articles 35 and 85) goes farther, designating an agent of revolution by pre-authorizing the military to depose the government if it violates the constitutional requirement of secular government. Just as an advance directive for medical care enables a competent patient to pre-authorize agent to act on her behalf in the event of her losing the capacity to act, so a constitutional provision of this sort would enable a people under conditions of political freedom to pre-authorize some agent to initiate revolution on its behalf should the abuse of government authority undermine its ability to perform an act of authorization. Neither of these two conditions will be satisfied if the country in question never had a political system that produced bona fide representatives of the people or never had a constitution that pre-authorized revolution. Interestingly, current discussions of rightful authority for waging revolutionary war do not consider the possibility of pre-authorization for initiating and leading revolutions, thus following the unfortunate but widespread practice of discussing the morality of war as if institutions did not exist or were relevant only as instruments for applying a system of moral principles that can be fully worked out by eliciting intuitions from cases of individual actions considered apart from any institutional background (Buchanan 2006, 2015).
In the absence of any institutional provisions for pre-authorization, a proponent of the notion of representativeness might offer a different understanding of it. An agent represents the people, in a fashion that morally empowers her to initiate and lead revolutionary war, if she is committed to and acts appropriately to realize their shared interest or common good (Biggar 2013). It is worth noting just how distant this view is from any widely accepted notion of rightful authority to make war in other contexts or for that matter of rightful authority in any context, whether private or public. The fact that Jones is committed to Smith’s good and able to promote it effectively does nothing whatsoever to establish that Jones has rightful authority over Jones, much less that he has rightful authority to undertake actions supposedly on Jones’s behalf that pose a danger to Jones or others. Further, this notion is incapable of establishing exclusive rightful authority, since there may be more than one party, each contending for the role of leadership, all of which are committed to and capable of promoting the common good. That is a significant problem, since one of the traditional rationales for the rightful authority in just war theories is that there must be some one authority on each side of an armed conflict, both to ensure discipline among the armed forces so as to limit destruction, to achieve adherence to jus in bello principles, and so that it will be clear who should be party to negotiations to end the conflict and ensure a just peace.
If for these reasons one despairs of spelling out rightful authority in terms of actual or hypothetical consent or approval, representativeness, or commitment to the common good, an alternative approach may appear attractive: jettison the assumption that initiating and attempting to lead a revolutionary war always requires rightful authority. Argue instead that where the conditions on the ground make rightful authority unobtainable, it can still sometimes be morally justifiable for an agent to initiate a revolutionary war and attempt to lead it (Fabre 2012). Such a position was sketched earlier, in casting a critical eye on Kant’s rejection of revolution; it can be further developed by employing an analogy with the justification of coercion in a state of violent anarchy—something akin to the state of nature as Hobbes understood it.
Suppose that there is a group of agents who have the capacity to create basic order, lifting all out of the state of radical physical insecurity, but who can accomplish this only by imposing a coercively backed set of rules under conditions in which there are no institutional resources for conferring rightful authority to perform these tasks. Suppose in addition that there are no informal means for conferring rightful authority, that for reasons adduced earlier, either consent or approval cannot be ascertained due to severe oppression or that they would fall significantly short of unanimity. Suppose also that these agents are committed to providing physical security for all by the least coercive and fair means that are likely to be effective under the circumstances. Finally, suppose that they are committed to helping to build institutions that would make the legitimate or rightfully authorized continued use of coercion possible and that they are publicly committed to relinquishing power should those processes confer legitimacy on some other agents. Surely under these conditions, such agents would be morally justified in wielding coercive power, even if they lacked rightful authority. If that is so, then instead of saying that coercive power may only be permissibly wielded by rightful authorities, one ought to say instead that rightful authority is required where the conditions for conferring authority exists, but that where they do not, it may be morally justifiable to wield coercive power nonetheless, at least if this is done in such a way as to promote the emergence of conditions under which legitimate use of coercion can exist.
In extreme cases, tyrannies are sufficiently like a state of violent anarchy that it appears that the same conclusion holds there as well. If a group of agents can end such a tyranny and establish a minimally just order in which all can enjoy physical security and if it is committed to doing so by the least coercive means and in observation of basic principles of fairness and is also committed to helping to establish the conditions under which the exercise of coercive power can become legitimate or rightfully authorized, then it appears that it would be morally justified in initiating and leading a revolutionary war to create such conditions.
Whether or not this sort of argument for abandoning the unqualified commitment to a principle of rightful authority in the case of revolutionary wars is ultimately persuasive, it appears to have sufficient initial plausibility to call into question the assumption that if rightful authority is a requirement for just interstate wars, then it is also so for revolutionary wars in all cases. So, one central issue for a comprehensive theory of just revolutionary war is whether the requirement of rightful authorization for initiating and leading armed revolutionary struggles is unconditionally valid. If the answer is that it is, then it appears that initiating a revolutionary war will rarely if ever be justified.
It does not follow, however, that joining the fight, once it has started, is unjustified whenever the initiation of the conflict was unjustified (Buchanan 2013). Whether various individuals are morally justified in joining the war effort depends upon whether they have morally acceptable reasons for doing so, not upon the morality or immorality of the actions others took to initiate the conflict. If that is the case, then the earlier suggestion that “the morality of revolutionary war” must be disaggregated into the morality of various parties is vindicated. The justification for initiating revolution will be different from the justification for joining a revolution. This point is not limited to revolutionary wars, but it may be more significant in the revolutionary case, if generally speaking the initiation of revolutionary wars is harder to justify than some interstate wars, especially wars of self-defense or defense of others against aggression.
There are several reasons, as already noted, why revolutionary wars may be especially hard to justify. The most obvious, as noted in Section 3, are that there are many ways in which the aim of establishing a more just political order may be frustrated and hence it may be hard to satisfy the requirement of a reasonable likelihood of success. Another problem is the difficulty of determining that a proportionality requirement is satisfied. Indeed, some of the most daunting moral issues of revolutionary war arise when one attempts to apply the standard just war requirement of proportionality as a necessary condition for justified initiation of revolutionary war.
One issue is whether violent revolutions against “lesser tyrannies” can ever be proportional. “Greater tyrannies” engage in large-scale violations of the right of physical security, killings and maimings, or they literally enslave their peoples. “Lesser tyrannies” refrain from those actions, but violate other important rights, including the right to democratic government and various other civil and political rights, such as the right to freedoms of religion, expression, and assembly. Some theorists have argued that it would be unjustified to make war against any party, whether another country’s armed forces or one’s own government, that “merely” engaged in “lesser tyranny”, because lethal force is only proportional when it is used to combat the wrongful use of lethal force (or to avoid being reduced to a slave). David Rodin (2003), for example, contends that it would be wrong for the people of one country to use lethal force to resist and invasion by another country whose leaders were only intent on imposing a “lesser tyranny”. In other words, he denies that the right of self-defense could ever justify violence against an invader that “merely” wished to destroy a nation’s sovereignty. He even goes so far as to say that if an individual invaded one’s home and one had reason to believe that if one resisted the invasion the invader would use lethal force, thus triggering one’s own right to use lethal force in defense of oneself and one’s family, one should hide from the invader in order to avoid this escalation. Jeff McMahan (1994) argues, in contrast, that there is no duty to avoid such an escalation, and that even if it would be disproportionate to initiate lethal force against an invader intent only on “lesser tyranny”, it would not be disproportionate to respond with lethal force to an invader who made a “conditional threat” of lethal force, that is, who asserted that she would use lethal force in response to any form of resistance, including nonviolent resistance (Frowe and Lazar 2017). McMahan also asserts that one need not wait for the realization of the “conditional threat” of the invader to be imminent before using lethal force to counter it if that is the only way to be assured of one’s safety (McMahan 1994). Finlay (2015) agrees with McMahan’s conclusion and explicitly applies it to the case of revolutionary wars, holding that it is justifiable to make revolutionary war against a regime that is merely a “lesser tyranny” if that regime responds with lethal force to nonviolent resistance. The case that McMahan and Finlay develop against Rodin’s austere view can be strengthened by noting that under the existing international order, a norm that allows war-making to prevent the loss of sovereignty, at least in the case of reasonably democratic and rights-respecting countries, makes good sense because the state is the primary locus for the establishment of basic justice and the protection of human rights.
That said, Rodin, McMahan, and Finlay share two questionable assumptions. First, that the use of lethal force can be proportional only if it is used against lethal force (or perhaps against enslavement as well); and second, that the proportionality assessment should only encompass harms to those directly affected. Against the first assumption, Mattias Iser (2017) has argued that respect for civil and political rights not only serves to protect important interests but also has the expressive function of publicly recognizing equal basic moral status. Given the fundamental moral importance of such recognition, the violation of these rights, at least when it is a feature of the basic structure of society, can justify violent revolution (Iser 2017: 208–214). Put differently, those who have held that proportionality prohibits revolutionary war against “lesser tyranny” have failed to see that the interest in being recognized as having equal basic moral status, not just the interest in physical security or the avoidance of slavery, is of such moral importance as to justify the use of lethal force as a last resort.
The second problematic assumption shared by Rodin, McMahan, and Finlay in their discussions of proportionality is that only harms to the parties directly affected count. But revolutionary war against “lesser tyranny” might well be proportional if, instead, the harm to innocent people the revolution will cause were weighed, not just against the harm the tyranny is doing to the current generation of the people, but against that when combined with the harm to future generations if the tyranny is not overthrown. And, of course, revolutionaries often try to justify the violence that will result from their conduct by saying that it will be compensated for by the benefits gained or the harm averted for many people to come.
There is yet another way in which the class of harms to be considered in proportionality assessments might be expanded: the effects of revolutionary war against “lesser tyranny” on valid norm compliance might also be included. Suppose the valid norm is that governments are not to be tyrannical, that they are not only to refrain from killings, maiming, and enslavement, but are also to respect civil and political rights, including especially the right to democratic government, primarily because rights to physical security are best realized in democracies. Suppose also that because of weak international institutions, the best prospect for enforcing a norm of good government is the threat of revolution against governments that violate the norm. Under these conditions, it would be problematic to restrict proportionality assessments to immediate, direct harms, ignoring the effects on the enforcement of important norms of justice. Most but not all contemporary discussions of proportionality ignore the possibility of justifying violence for the sake of norm enforcement, because they elaborate on intuitions stimulated by one-off consideration of cases viewed in isolation, rather than taking into account the effect of particular actions on patterns of behavior persisting over time (Fabre 2012, Rodin 2011). And because they largely ignore institutions, they do not consider the requirements of effective international norm enforcement under conditions in which international institutions for enforcement are weak.
Those who exclude from assessments of proportionality effects on future generations and on norm enforcement might reply as follows. Even if in principle it makes sense to consider such wider effects, in practice any attempt to do so would require calculations so difficult and prone to error that, as an action-guiding principle, the proportionality requirement ought to construe harms more narrowly. As it stands, this reply is unconvincing, because it assumes, without argument, that the risks of error or abuse attendant on a wider construal of harms relevant to proportionality clearly outweigh the apparent impropriety of ignoring what appear to be whole classes of morally relevant harms.
There is one more way in which institutional capacity can affect proportionality. If international or regional institutions provided for effective intervention in support of just revolutions, then the risks of failed or corrupted revolutions and of violent anarchy that lead some theorists to deny that revolution can be justified would be mitigated, with the result that engaging in revolution could satisfy the proportionality requirement. Once again, it is clear that the validity of a theory of just revolutionary war depends upon the validity of empirical assumptions about institutional capacity. Unfortunately, many theorists of the morality of armed conflict either ignore issues of institutional capacity or assume that the current paucity of institutional resources cannot be remedied.
Thus far the moral complexities of revolutionary jus ad bellum have been the focus of the discussion, emphasizing in particular the difficulty of satisfying the requirements of rightful authority and proportionality. The jus in bello component of a theory of just revolutionary war is also morally complex. A key issue that a theory of the morality of revolutionary war ought to address is whether widely accepted jus in bello norms apply without exception to war-making by revolutionaries or whether, instead, revolutionaries are morally permitted to undertake acts of war that the military personnel of states are usually prohibited from performing. This is not a merely theoretical issue: revolutionary warriors have often engaged in various morally problematic forms of “irregular” warfare. They have assassinated civilian leaders and other civilians such as government bureaucrats and judges, attacked regime forces while wearing civilian attire (not wearing uniforms or insignia as required by the laws of war and not carrying weapons openly), and engaged in terrorism, deliberately killing individuals who had no discernible connection with the regime by detonating bombs in public places.  Furthermore, in order to mobilize people to join the revolution or to deter them from aiding the regime in suppressing it, they have engaged in acts of terrorism against the oppressed.
Contemporary theorists who have addressed the morality of irregular warfare have generally argued that terrorism, whether its goal is to persuade the regime to capitulate or to coerce the oppressed into joining the revolution or not supporting the regime, is morally impermissible. Most of the controversy concerns whether any or all of the other forms of irregular warfare are permissible and if so under what conditions. This author (Buchanan 2013) has argued that even if terrorism perpetrated against members of the oppressed population is unjustified, some forms of coercion may be permissible, as when revolutionary fighters are conscripted through the threat of penalties such as expropriation of property or even perhaps confinement or lesser restrictions on liberty. The most plausible justification for such methods of coerced mobilization would characterize the goals of the revolution as public goods of extraordinary moral importance and present coercion as a solution to the collective action problem. Whether coercive mobilization would be justified would depend on at least two factors: whether the forms of coercion employed were necessary, whether they were the least restrictive among the effective alternatives and whether the burdens of coercion were distributed fairly (Finlay 2015: 87–124).
Those who argue that it is permissible for revolutionaries to target civilians tend to argue that only those civilians who contribute in some significant way to the oppressive activities of the regime lie beyond the protection of the jus in bello norm of discrimination. The basic idea here, as Finlay puts it, is to justify such acts as the targeting of individuals who are morally liable to be killed because they are not morally innocent, that is, they are active and significant contributors to the regime’s violent injustices (Finlay 2015: 55–86, 217–218). But what counts as significant contribution is both unclear and disputed. For example, a farmer who supplies food for a tyranny’s secret police or repairs the vehicles that they use to hunt down dissidents clearly makes a contribution to their depredations, but it is unclear whether that sort of contribution makes her liable to lethal attack (Fabre 2009, Frowe 2014).
A second set of issues in revolutionary jus in bello concerns the permissibility of revolutionary warriors engaging in “partisan war”--not wearing uniforms or insignia or carrying arms openly or doing so but then changing into civilian attire immediately after an attack so as to melt back into the population. Those who argue that such actions are permissible typically appeal to fairness. The idea is that, at least in the early stages of their struggle, revolutionaries are at a great disadvantage vis à vis government forces, that this disadvantage is something for which they are not responsible, and that the revolutionaries should not be expected to let it render unsuccessful their struggle against a seriously unjust regime. Revolutionaries typically have inferior arms and logistical capacities, they have no safe rear areas behind which they can regroup and resupply because there are no battle lines as in conventional wars, and when they face a ruthless tyranny it is unlikely that their opponents will observe jus bello norms. Finlay asserts that if these forms of “partisan war” are undertaken to defend innocent people against the regime’s wrongful harm to them, then they should be seen as justifiable efforts to achieve the protection of morally innocent individuals that is the rationale for the discrimination norm (Finlay 2015: 55–86, 217–218).
The argument against the permissibility of “partisan warfare” is that the requirement of uniforms and insignia facilitates better compliance with the discrimination norm, making it easier for regime forces to refrain from killing noncombatants. That argument is of limited force if the regime is likely to violate the discrimination norm anyway. A tyranny that routinely violates basic human rights in peacetime is unlikely to become scrupulous in use of force in a revolutionary conflict (Meisels 2008).
The topic of revolution presents a fertile and challenging field for moral theory and applied or practical ethics—and one in which the greater part of systematic thinking remains to be done. Violent revolutions typically present the most serious and difficult moral issues. Until recently, the excellent work done by contemporary just war theories has not given the peculiar moral problems of revolutionary war the attention they deserve, but there is reason to believe that this deficiency will be remedied. Because the success of a revolution may depend upon whether there is intervention in support of it, a comprehensive theory of the morality of revolution should cohere with a theory of the morality of intervention (Buchanan 2016). Another topic that a comprehensive theory of just revolutionary war should address is the moral assessment of the international Law of Armed Conflict’s asymmetry with regard to the rights of combatants acting on behalf of states and revolutionary warriors. The Law of Armed Conflict assigns the latter the same legal duties as the former, but grants them a much leaner set of legal rights.
- St. Augustine, City of God (De civitate Dei), Henry Bettenson (trans.), John O’Meara (introduction), London: Penguin, 1972.
- Aquinas, Thomas, Summa theologiae (Section IIaIIae 42: On Sedition), in Aquinas: Political Writings (Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought), R.W. Dyson (ed.), New York: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
- Biggar, Nigel, 2013, “Christian Just War Reasoning and Two Cases of Rebellion: Ireland 1916–1921 and Syria 2011–Present”, Ethics & International Affairs, 27(4): 393–400. doi:10.1017/S089267941300035X
- Buchanan, Allen, 1979, “Revolutionary Motivation and Rationality”, Philosophy & Public Affairs, 9(1): 59–82.
- –––, 1982, Marx and Justice: The Radical Critique of Liberalism, London: Methuen.
- –––, 2006, “Institutionalizing the Just War”, Philosophy & Public Affairs 34(1): 2–38. doi:10.1111/j.1088-4963.2006.00051.x
- –––, 2013, “The Ethics of Revolution and Its Implications for the Ethics of Intervention”, Philosophy & Public Affairs, 41(4): 291–323. doi:10.1111/papa.12021
- –––, 2015, “A Richer Jus ad Bellum”, in Lazar and Frowe 2015: .
- –––, 2016, “Self-Determination, Revolution, and Intervention”, Ethics, 126(2): 447–473. doi:10.1086/683639
- Chenoweth, Erica and Maria J. Stephan, 2011, Why Civil Resistance Works: The Strategic Logic of Nonviolent Conflict, New York: Columbia University Press.
- Cohen, G.A., 1978, Karl Marx’s Theory of History: A Defence, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Davis, Ryan W., 2004, “Is Revolution Morally Revolting?”, The Journal of Value Inquiry, 38(4): 561–568. doi:10.1007/s10790-005-7254-y
- Dobos, Ned, 2011, Insurrection and Intervention: The Two Faces of Sovereignty, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139049214
- Engels, Friedrich,  1892, Socialism: Utopian and Scientific, Edward Aveling (trans.). [Engels  1892 available online]
- Elster, Jon, 1985, Making Sense of Marx, Cambridge University Press.
- Fabre, Cécile, 2009, “Guns, Food, and Liability to Attack in War”, Ethics, 120(1): 36–63. doi:10.1086/649218
- –––, 2012, Cosmopolitan War, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Finlay, Christopher J., 2006, “Violence and Revolutionary Subjectivity: Marx to Žižek”, European Journal of Political Theory, 5(4): 373–397. doi:10.1177/1474885106067277
- –––, 2015, Terrorism and the Right to Resist: A Theory of Just Revolutionary War, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Flikschuh, Katrin, 2008, “Reason, Right, and Revolution: Kant and Locke”, Philosophy & Public Affairs 36(4): 375–404. doi:10.1111/j.1088-4963.2008.00146.x
- Frowe, Helen, 2014, Defensive Killing, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Frowe, Helen and Seth Lazar (eds.), 2017, The Oxford Handbook of Ethics of War, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:0.1093/oxfordhb/9780199943418.001.0001
- Gross, Michael, 2010, Moral Dilemmas of Modern War: Torture, Assassination, and Blackmail in an Age of Asymmetric Conflict, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Hill, Thomas E., 2002, “Questions About Kant’s Opposition to Revolution”, The Journal of Value Inquiry, 36(2–3): 293–298. doi:10.1023/A:1016156620402
- Hobbes, Thomas,  1994, Leviathan, Edwin Curley (ed.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.
- Iser, Mattias, 2017, “Beyond the Paradigm of Self-Defense? On Revolutionary Violence”, in The Ethics of War: Essays, Saba Bazargan and Samuel C. Rickless (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199376148.003.0010
- Jenkins, Brian Michael, 2014, “The Dynamics of Syria’s Civil War”, Santa Monica, CA: RAND Corporation, PE-115-RC. URL = <http://www.rand.org/pubs/perspectives/PE115.html>
- Jennings, Francis, 2000, The Creation of America: Through Revolution to Empire, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Johnson, James Turner, 2013, “Ad Fontes: The Question of Rebellion and Moral Tradition on the Use of Force”, Ethics & International Affairs, 27(4): 371–378. doi:10.1017/S0892679413000336
- Jones, Daniel M., Stuart A.Bremer, and J. David Singer, 1996, “Militarized Interstate Disputes, 1816–1992: Rationale, Coding Rules, and Empirical Patterns”, Conflict Management and Peace Science, 15(2): 163–213.
- Kalyvas, Stathis N., 2006, The Logic of Violence in Civil War, Cambridge University Press.
- Kant, Immanuel, 1797, Metaphysics of Morals (Die Metaphysik der Sitten) in Practical Philosophy, Mary Gregor (trans.), Cambridge University Press, 1996.
- Kelsay, John, 2013, “Muslim Discourse on Rebellion”, Ethics & International Affairs, 27(4): 379–391. doi:10.1017/S0892679413000348
- Korsgaard, Christine, 2008, “Taking the Law into our own Hands: Kant on the Right to Revolution”, in Reclaiming the History of Ethics: Essays for John Rawls, Andrews Reath, Barbara Herman, and Christine M. Korsgaard (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511527258.012
- Lee, Steven P., 2012, Ethics and War: An Introduction, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Locke, John, 1689, Second Treatise of Government: An Essay Concerning the True Original, Extent and End of Civil Government, Richard H. Cox (ed.), Arlington Heights, IL: H. Davidson, 1982.
- Marx, Karl and Friedrich Engels, 1978 [MER], The Marx-Engels Reader, Robert Tucker (ed.), New York: W.V. Norton. 2nd edition.
- McMahan, Jeff, 1994, “Innocence, Self-Defense and Killing in War”, Journal of Political Philosophy, 2(3): 193–22. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9760.1994.tb00021.x
- –––, 2014, “What Rights May Be Defended by Means of War?” in The Morality of Defensive War, Cécile Fabre and Seth Lazar (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199682836.001.0001
- Meisels, Tamar, 2008, The Trouble with Terror: Liberty, Security, and the Response to Terrorism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Morkevicius, Valerie, 2013, “Why We Need a Just Rebellion Theory”, Ethics & International Affairs, 27(4): 401–411. doi:10.1017/S0892679413000440
- Nash, Gary B., 2005, The Unknown American Revolution: The Unruly Birth of Democracy and The Struggle to Create America, New York: Viking.
- Rodin, David, 2003, War and Self-Defense, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2011, “Justifying Harm”, Ethics, 122(1): 74–110. doi:10.1086/662295
- Simmons, A. John, 1979, Moral Principles and Political Obligations, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Singer, J. David and Melvin Small, 1994, “Correlates of War Project: International and Civil War Data, 1916-1992,” Inter-University Consortium For Political And Social Research (ICPSR), Institute For Social Research, University Of Michigan, available online.
- Smith, Matthew Noah, 2008, “Rethinking Sovereignty, Rethinking Revolution”, Philosophy & Public Affairs 36(4): 405–440. doi:10.1111/j.1088-4963.2008.00147.x
- Suárez, Francisco,  2006, “Justice, Charity, and War” (Opus de triplici virtute theologica fide, spe & charitate), in The Ethics of War: Classical and Contemporary Readings, Gregory M. Reichberg, Henrik Syse, and Endre Begby (eds.), Oxford: Blackwell, chapter 29.
- Wagner, R. Harrison, 2000, “Bargaining and War”, American Journal of Political Science, 44(3): 469–484. doi:10.2307/2669259
- Weinstein, Jeremy M., 2007, Inside Rebellion: The Politics of Insurgent Violence, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Wittman, Donald, 1979, “How a War Ends: A Rational Model Approach”, Journal of Conflict Resolution, 23(4): 743–763. doi:10.1177/002200277902300408
- Wood, Gordon S., 1993, The Radicalism of the American Revolution, New York: Vintage.
- Zinn, Howard, 1980, A People’s History of the United States, New York: Harper & Row.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.