Notes to Quantifiers and Quantification

1. It is not difficult to give examples of quantifier phrases of different syntactic categories. Certain adjectives such as “finite”, “uncountable” and adverbs such as “sometimes”, “often”, and “never” may likewise be used to make general statements. Even non-phrasal constructions such as “there is” or “there are” may express generality.

2. In what follows, we will sometimes omit a pair of parentheses in accordance to standard abbreviations in logic. We will, for example, let the expression \(B \rightarrow C\) abbreviate \((B \rightarrow C)\).

3. Notice that the validity of theorems like \(\exists x (Px \rightarrow Px)\) and \(\forall x Px \rightarrow \exists x Px\) is merely a byproduct of the stipulation that the domain of a model be non-empty.

4. Note the role of Completeness. Kreisel's argument will not be available for some of the extensions of quantificational logic for which no completeness result is available.

5. Note that we could in principle treat constants as zero-place function symbols.

6. Symmetry is given by the formula \(\forall x \forall y(x = y \rightarrow y =x)\), whereas Transitivity is given by the formula \(\forall x \forall y \forall z ((x = y \wedge y = z) \rightarrow x=z)\).

7. See Williamson (1999) for a discussion of the problem.

8. Notice that in an intuitionistic framework, we must take all the usual propositional connectives \(\wedge\), \(\vee\), \(\rightarrow\), and \(\neg\) to be part of the primitive vocabulary.

9. Since the cardinality of the power set of the set of natural numbers, \(\wp (\mathcal{N})\), is greater than \(\aleph_0\), i.e., \(2^{\aleph_0} > \aleph_0\), we know that \(2^{\aleph_0} \geq \aleph_1\). Unfortunately, the axioms of set theory do not settle the question of whether \(\aleph_1\) is in fact \(2^{\aleph_0}\).

10. Some axiomatizations of second-order logic add a version of the axiom of choice, which states, very roughly, that for any dyadic relation \(R\) whose domain includes all individuals, there is a sub-relation \(S\) of \(R\) that pairs each object in the domain with exactly one object.

11. This reflection principle, which is due to Bernays (1976) is a second-order generalization of the reflection principle of Montague (1966) and Levy (1960).

12. The reader may consult Rayo & Uzquiano (1999) and Rayo & Williamson (2003) for details.

13. We reason by reductio. Suppose that \(R\) is a set of all, and only, non-self-membered sets. Then \(R\) is a member of \(R\) if and only if \(R\) is not a member of \(R\). If \(R\) is a member of \(R\), then, since \(R\) contains only non-self-membered sets, \(R\) is not a member of \(R\). But on the other hand, if \(R\) is not a member of \(R\), then since \(R\) contains all non-self-membered sets, \(R\) is a member of \(R\). By propositional logic, a contradiction follows from the claim that \(R\) is a member of \(R\) if and only if \(R\) is not a member of \(R\).

14. Here is the argument:

  • \(\vdash A\) \(A\) is a theorem
  • \(\vdash \forall p \ A\) by \((\forall^p 3)\)
  • \(\vdash \forall p \ A \rightarrow A(B/p)\) \((\forall^p 1)\) since \(B\) is free for \(p\) in \(A\).
  • \(\vdash A(B/p)\) Modus Ponens 2, 3

15. In fact, (A) can be weakened further to:

  • (\(A^{-}\)) \(\forall p \Diamond \forall q (Qp \leftrightarrow p \leftrightarrow q)\),

which states that for each proposition \(p\) it is possible to query only propositions with the same truth value as \(p\).

16. See Williamson 2013, Chapter 5, section 2 for further discussion.

17. This point is made in Soames 2014, chapter 1 on Frege and chapter 11 on Russell.

18. Pure quantificational logic because, for Quine, the use of a name carries no commitment to the object allegedly named by it.

19. Matters are not much better if one requires the material conditional to be a logical truth.

20. There are some limits to the strategy of plural paraphrase, which are explored in Uzquiano (2004).

21. For examples, the reader may consult Dummett 1991; Fine 2006; Glanzberg 2004; Hellman 2006; Lavine 2006; and Parsons 2006.

22. Recall that the inference from \(\neg \forall x \ A\) to \(\exists x \ \neg A\) is not intuitionistically valid. Indeed, some opponents of unrestricted generality like Michael Dummett have in fact advocated the use of intuitionistic logic for putatively unrestrictedly general statements. Santos (2013) develops these issues further.

23. For a survey of some of these moves, the reader may consult some of the pieces in Rayo & Uzquiano (2006).

24. For suppose that a certain set-like object, \(D\), is the relevant domain. An attractive principle for domains of quantification is an analogue to a separation principle for set theory: if \(D\) is a domain of quantification and \(A(x)\) is a condition, which may perhaps be expressed by a predicate of the language, then the restriction of the domain to the objects that satisfy the condition constitutes another domain of quantification. In particular, if \(D\) is the domain associated to a truly unrestricted use of the quantifier, then there is a domain, \(R\), of all and only objects in \(D\), which are not members of themselves. The problem of course is that \(R\) cannot be a member of \(D\) on pain of contradiction. (If \(R\) is a member of \(D\), then either \(R\) is in \(R\) or \(R\) is not in \(R\). But if \(R\) is in \(R\), then \(R\) is a member of \(D\) that fails to satisfy the condition non-self-membered, whence \(R\) is not in \(R\). And if \(R\) is in \(R\), then \(R\) is a member of \(D\) that satisfies the condition non-self-membered, whence \(R\) is in \(R\).) But if \(R\) is not in \(D\), then \(D\) is not the domain associated to a truly unrestricted use of the quantifier.

25. Carnap's own response was to appeal to a different style of quantification, whether substitutional or quantification over individual concepts.

26. See for example T. Parsons (1980) and E. Zalta (1988) and Priest (2005).

27. It should be clear that perfectly parallel arguments should enable one to prove versions of CBF for other sentential operators such as “it is true according to fiction \(F\)” or “it ought to be the case”.

28. The sentence \(\forall x \exists y \ x = y\) is of course a theorem of the weaker quantificational logic, but once we necessitate, we only obtain the harmless \(\Box \forall x \exists y \ x = y\).

29. Compare Burgess (2009). Similar proposals are made in Prior 1957; Adams 1981; Menzel 1991; and Wiggins 1995.

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Gabriel Uzquiano <>

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