Notes to Process Philosophy

1. Among the main theoretical alternatives for an ontological interpretation of the temporal existence of things, contemporary analytical ontology discusses so-called “four-dimensionalism,” “eternalism,” and the “stage theory,” which, interestingly, are all static varieties of Leibniz’ analysis.

2. On the first three topics see Fortescue 2001, Brown 2005, and Herstein 2005, respectively, on the fourth see note 17 below. Process philosophy in the letter or spirit of Whitehead has been the most visible strand of contemporary process philosophy, carried by a larger group of philosophers (see section 7. on institutionalization). Without wanting to diminish the significance of Whiteheadian process philosophy, either in itself nor for process philosophy, this entry is written with the aim to convey that process philosophy is a longstanding and highly diversified enterprise that should not be too closely associated with any particular school or movement.

3. After Whitehead’s Process and Reality, which surely offers a plethora of observations, arguments, and analyses in support of all three of these claims, proposals for process ontology or metaphysics are rarely presented together with an explicit reflection of the conditions of theory revision in philosophy.

4. The history of process philosophy contains various vague pointers to the link between cognitive habituation and language structure (see e.g., Whitehead 1929: 49). Nowadays the claim can be properly supported, however, by drawing on recent research cognitive linguistics and cognitive science, in particular, on recent studies of linguistic relativity; moreover, research in linguistic typology, especially on the semantics of noun-phrases across languages, can be used to motivate the switch to a process ontology on purely methodological grounds, see Seibt 2015b.

5. The following reconstruction and discussion of Strawson’s argument is based on Rescher 1962 and 1996, ch. 3.

6. A noteworthy forerunner of these efforts to clarify the logical features of processes vis-à-vis other categories can be found in Zemach 1970. Aristotle’s observation that sentences in the progressive govern different inferences depending on whether they denote activities (seeing) or developments (building a house), respectively, figures central in most ontological and linguistic classifications of occurrence types, from Mourelatos 1978 and Roberts 1979 to the various recent categorizations of Aktionsarten in linguistic aspectology. By contrast, Stout (1997, 2015) and Stewart (1997, 2013) disregard this inferential difference and take every sentence with progressive aspect to denote a “process”, contrasting these with “events”, which are denoted by sentences with perfective aspect. Galton and Mizoguchi (2009) explore in greater detail the logical differences between processes and events (atypically, Galton (2012, 2017) takes processes to be abstract patterns of states or upshots). In parallel, the Vendler/Kenny classification also launched and reinforced research on actions per se, i.e., on the logic of action discourse for different types of actions, see e.g. Stout 1996, Kühl 2008. Based on Kenny’s classification, Fink (1973) argues that only certain types of occurrences can be the subject of value judgments — an important result for the ontology of values. Seibt (2004, 2015b) suggests a classification of basic occurrence types in terms of inferential networks, i.e., independently of the features of a particular language, which is integrated into a more comprehensive approach for a general classification of processes based on five parameters that address various structural and compositional aspects. This framework is developed also with a view to the use of classificatory systems in computer science (knowledge representation) where domain–specific process ontologies are in demand (see e.g., Gruninger and Menzel 2003, Aameri 2016).

7. More recently the non-particularist conception has gained more supporters: T. Crowther (2012, 2017) defends the conception of processes as stuffs against recent particularist views: M. Soteriou (2013) argues that such a conception proves advantageous for the task of making sense of the unity of human experience (2013); and J. Hornsby (2012) has suggested that human activities are best understood as non-particular individuals.

8. See Steward 2012 and Stout 2017, which collects contributions from main protagonists of this recent process turn in the ontology of mind. See also below section 4, (iii).

9. See Rescher 1996 ch. 3, and Rubenstein 1997. To be sure, the idea that general or determinable entities are concrete has been around since Aristotle; the novel twist is to allow for determinable entities to be "subjectless" processes (C.D. Broad; see also Sellars (1981)).

10. For a refurbishment of Whitehead’s account of persistence see Simons 2008; Seibt (1997, 2008) deconstructs the dichotomy of endurance (persistent entities are identical in time but not extended in time) versus perdurance (persistent entities exist in time by having a temporal part that exists at that time) and argues that persistence is best understood as the literal "recurrence" of activities.

11. The idea that a process philosophy can put (rudimentary forms of) normativity into nature is argued in Bickhard 2004 and further developed in Campbell’s (2011) study on truth as a property of actions (see also below, section 4 (iii). — As pointed out above in section 1, in view of recent research on embodied cognition, emergence, and non-linear mechanistic explanations, it also can be argued that Wilfrid Sellars’ naturalism prefigures a process-based naturalization of normativity; importantly, Sellars distinguishes between different kinds or degrees of normativity.

12. For a process view of God as sketched in (v) see Rescher 1996, ch. 9. In connection with this issue it might be useful to restate the caveat from section 2, drawing attention to the fact that this entry does not detail the contributions of process thought to process theism. While many American process philosophers, especially Whiteheadians, have been inclined to address general theological questions within the exposition of a process metaphysics, it should be noted that in the current international research landscape that this article is trying to do justice to, theism is not an integral element of a process philosophy. Many researchers currently working on process-philosophical themes do not consider the nature of God an inevitable or even legitimate subject for their research. This need not be taken as an indication of the increasing atheism among process philosophers, but merely as an effect of the increasing specialization of academic research. Guided by the philosophy of Charles Hartshorne and, more recently, stimulated and promoted by the work of J. L. Cobb and D.R. Griffin, the area of “process theology” by now has become a diversified field of inquiry of its own, combining philosophy of religion and theology (often Christian theology but more recently also the theology of religions).

13. It is not quite clear whether Salmon’s analysis of causation (as well as Dowe’s (1992) modification, the "conserved quantity view") is indeed committed to processes in the relevant sense that distinguishes them from sequences of states; for a process view of causation where this commitment is explicit see Ingthorsson 2002.

14. In Whiteheadian process metaphysics such mutual dynamic dependencies are introduced by way of informal definitional characterizations—they are included in the description of how prehensions, subjective aim and subjective form of an actual entity relate to each other. In a non-Whiteheadian process ontology one might need to resort to non-standard mereologies to state such dependencies more precisely, see below section 5.

15. For the use of (non-Whiteheadian) process ontology for an interpretation of certain concepts of chemistry see Needham 1999, 2003 and Guttinger 2017; Stein 2004 has offered a Whiteheadian process metaphysics for chemistry.

16. See Dupré and Nicholson 2017, introduction, as well earlier arguments in Dupré (2012, ch. 10 and 11, partly co-authored with Maureen O’Malley). Surveying results from the biology of microbes and metagenomics, Dupré argues that phenomena of horizontal or lateral gene transfer as well as fundamental symbiotic dependencies between microbes and their embedding multicellular communities present a severe challenge to the traditional notion of the monogenomic biological individual (organism) as the focal unit of inheritance and selection. “Life is in fact a hierarchy of processes (e.g., metabolic, developmental, ecological, evolutionary) and...any abstraction of an ontology of fixed entities must do some violence to this dynamic reality” (p. 188f), which displays more the form of a net than single lineages within a ‘tree of life.’

17. Hättich (2004) has adapted the Whiteheadian framework for an interpretation of axiomatic quantum field theory. For more general expositions of a Whiteheadian approach to the interpretation of quantum physics see, e.g., Eppersen 2004 and Stapp 2007. The collected volume by Eastman, Epperson, and Griffin (2016) offers new perspectives on cross-fertilizations between (quantum) physics and speculative philosophy, with focus on the role, and the metaphysical interpretation of, of potentiality. Some contributors set out a framework of “relational realism” that includes a modal realism; e.g., operating with category theory instead of set theory, Michael Epperson (2016) and Elias Zafiris (2016) explore new approaches to the decoherence interpretation of measurement, treating the difference between actuality and potentiality as a feature of reality. Other contributors promote “process physics” outright as an “information-theoretic modeling of reality”) (Klinger 2016, Cahill 2016). Since the tension between relativity theory and quantum physics notoriously has forced physics currently into a mode of theory formation that is in the vicinity of speculative thought, it is here where philosophical explorations may have particular heuristic value for science. Moreover, given that here an space of inquiry has opened up that can benefit from fresh ideas, the philosophical research community may do well to pay attention to proposals from outside established communities (see for example C. Carlson’s (2004, 2009) suggestion to ground space-time and energy in causal networks of basic chunks of becoming (“time”) or attempts to refurbish dialectics in connection with information-theoretic modelling (Brenner 2008, 2010).

18. See Bickhard 2000 and Campbell/Bickhard 2011, as well as Wimsatt 1997, where emergence and reducibility are defined in terms of types of interactions with a physical system.

19. See especially the work of Mark Bickhard, a longstanding protagonist of the “interactivist” outlook on cognition as cross-disciplinary intersection for research in cognitive science, psychology, and philosophy; Bickard’s many papers center on embodied cognition but in effect lay out a comprehensive naturalist process metaphysics. – Note, however, that the proponents of process-based or interaction-based approaches to cognition, information, and representation do not always agree on the description of the decisive process architectures. On Bickhard’s view low-grade forms of cognition can be attributed to systems with certain process architectures independently of the causal evolutionary history of these systems; in contrast, Terrence Deacon (2010) has argued that the evolutionary embedding of a certain dynamics is definitionally constitutive for the occurrence of information.

20. See Zemach 1970; Roberts 1979; Seibt 1990, 1995, 1997; Stout 2015; Galton 2006. Stout (2015) even speaks of “occurrent continuants.”

21. This explanatory challenge looms large if processes are taken to be particular entities, which standardly are defined as existing in exactly one location at any time at which they exist. But also the “recurrence account” of persistence in General Process Theory, where processes are non-particular individuals, still struggles with the problem.

22. The editors’ introduction to Duprè and Nicholson 2017 offers an instructive overview over main figures in the “organicist” school in philosophy of biology during the first decades of the twentieth century and its relationship to Whitehead.

23. For an extensive and in-depth treatment of questions of complexity see Rescher’s 1998; for the axiological question addressed here see in particular his 2012.

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