Supplement to Philo of Alexandria

About the De aeternitate and the De providentia

It is probable that discussions about the authenticity of the De aeternitate (Runia 1981) will last as long as Philonian studies themselves, but it is perhaps a somewhat artificial debate since even if the treatise is authentic, it contains a great deal of scholastic information that Philo found in oral or written doxographic sources. In any case, it is a precious testimony of the circulation of philosophical ideas at the time. The last sentence of the treatise (Aet. 150) strongly suggests that we only have the first book of the treatise, which, like the De providentia, must have been an anthology. It is perhaps necessary to recall here that, according Cicero, in these kinds of rhetorical and philosophical exercises, the speaker places his preferred thesis in second position. Three main claims are distinguished in the treatise: a) the world is generated and corruptible, defended by Democritus, Epicurus and Stoics; b) the world is uncreated and incorruptible, defended by Aristoteles and Ocellus; and c) the world is created and incorruptible, defended by Plato, Hesiod, and Moses. As it has been emphasised by Runia (2008: 36), the doxography is organized following a sequence of ascending acceptability: the Epicureans, the Stoics, Aristotle, Plato, and before Plato, Moses. It was not a hierarchy strictly limited to the field of physics. Cicero adopted the sequence in his treatise on ethics, De finibus: Epicurus, Stoa, Ancient Academy/Aristotle, and finally Plato in the Tusculans, strongly linked to the De finibus by Cicero himself. The main difference is the presence of Moses in a scholastic text. He is presented (Aet. 19) as the “legislator of Jews”, a perfectly useless detail if the treatise was addressed only to a Jewish readership. At the same time, the quotations from Genesis, which are apparently intended to prove that the Torah says the world is incorruptible, are not convincing. From a philosophical point of view, it is interesting to see how Philo deals with the rivalry between Plato and Aristotle. From Aet. 20, he says that he is will analyse claim b), namely that of Aristotle. At the same time, he almost exclusively focuses on the incorruptibility of the world, which allows him to create a kind of alliance between the two philosophers. In fact, the purpose of the demonstration, perhaps inspired by Antiochus, seems to have been the demonstration of a consensus between Platonism, Aristotelianism, and Stoicism, at least in this first part of the treatise. It is only a partial consensus in two ways: firstly, it concerns only one aspect of eternity, the incorruptibility of the world; and secondly, it does not include the whole Stoic school, but only some Stoics, namely Boethos and his disciples.

From the De providentia (Hadas-Lebel 1973), we only have some fragments in Greek, thanks to Eusebius. Other parts of this book are known through an Armenian translation from the nineteenth century by Aucher, a monk from an Armenian convent in Venice. There are only two Biblical allusions in the first book of the treatise, a fact invoked by all those who contest its authenticity. It has been remarked that many Greek philosophers are evoked in the second book with positive comments: Plato, Parmenides, Empedocles, Zeno, and Cleanthes. An education steeped in the Greeks is obvious from many details. Indeed, it is undeniable that many elements of the treatise could have been found in a pagan author. There are also many similarities with the contradictory discussion about justice in Cicero’s De re publica 3, a free transposition of the two speeches given in 155 CE in Rome by Carneades, scholarch of the New Academy (Ferrary 1977). Three elements are particularly interesting. First, the presence of Alexander, Philo’s nephew, who apostatized. At the end of the dialogue, he says that he was convinced by Philo’s arguments and repents for his mistakes. Unless there had been a strong ironical intention, this would have been more difficult if the De providentia were written at the end of Philo’s life, when Tiberius had become a Roman general. Second, Providence itself appears to be a theological dogma still more essential than Creation in the second book (2.47–49), since it is said that even if the world were uncreated, Providence would still be necessary. Last, in 2.42, Philo highlights the difference between human beings and God and makes fallibility an essential characteristic of mankind, one of his favourite themes. It is difficult not to agree with Hadas-Lebel (1973: 46) when she says that no definite argument was brought forward by those who defend the authenticity of the De providentia nor those who contest it.

Copyright © 2018 by
Carlos Lévy <carlos.levy@wanadoo.fr>

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