Supplement to Philo of Alexandria

The Meanings of Philosophy in Philo of Alexandria

It is difficult to define Philo’s attitude towards philosophy. In fact, a rich variety of meanings of the word philosophia emerges from his treatises. While sophia is always man’s science or God’s science, in some cases, he uses philosophia with the same “technical” meaning that we give to this word, while in other cases the semantic problem is much more complex. As demonstrated by the illuminating studies of Malingrey (1961) and Nikiprowetzky (1977: 96–116), it is not fair to say that Philo had no precise idea of what philosophy could be. It is, however, true that Philo sometimes used philosophia in a sense that no Greek thinker would have used. To shed light on this complex question we must distinguish some different cases:

  • The “technical and traditional” meaning of Greek philosophy is used to accompany references to specifically named philosophers, the list of whom we’ll see in the following section.

  • The above remains the case when Philo makes allusions to classical definitions or traditional themes regarding the structure of philosophy. The most frequent is the tripartition of ethics, physics, and logic, the last of which comprises philosophy of knowledge, dialectic, and rhetoric; this division perhaps had its roots in the Old Academy, but was developed considerably by the Stoics. Not infrequently, Philo expresses himself in a manner similar to that of pagan Greek philosophers. To give just one example, inContempl. 3, the etymological method used for the interpretation of the names of gods (Hephaestus, Hera, and Poseidon) closely resembles that of Cornutus, the famous Stoic philosopher who lived in Rome at the time of Nero.

  • Philo defines himself as a thinker of his time by drawing intensely upon the topic of becoming like God to the greatest extent possible, the famous formula of Plato’s Theaetetus 176b. This was the motto of the Middle Platonic period, a transcendental substitute for the Stoic theme of oikeiôsis, i.e. the adaptation to nature. This latter theme was based on the idea that the alpha and omega of ethics were located in nature, without any reference to an extra-natural transcendence. Philo is one of the major protagonists of an intellectual and spiritual change that reintroduced the idea of transcendence into the philosophical tradition.

  • At the confluence of philosophy and theology, philosophy is defined as a vision of the world and its content (QG 2.41). Unfortunately, we have only the Armenian version of this definition, but it is also present, in a slightly different form, in other treatises. Though Philo was preceded by many philosophers in this definition, notably Plato and Aristotle, he nevertheless employs it in a distinct way. Philosophy is for him a systematic examination of the world, a complete set of interrogations, problèmata, but these questions are neither autonomous nor exclusively scientific. In contemplating the world and asking about it, Philo never loses sight of the idea that God created it as precisely narrated in Genesis.

  • Though fond of contemplation, Philo cannot imagine a philosophy without ethics. He often presents physics and logic as subordinate to the ethical striving towards virtue. Though the practice of enkrateia (moral strength), a Stoic concept meaning the effort to contain the passions, was one of Philo’s main ethical vocabulary, it was not self-sufficient for him. To be a real philosopher, as he believed Moses to be, it was necessary to have not only the traditional virtues of Greek philosophy, but also eusebeia, faith. From this point of view, Abraham’s spiritual itinerary is paradigmatic (Mut. 10). His point of departure was phusiologia, study of nature, turning next to ethics and the contemplation of the world, then achieving completion in the science of the Creator, the source of faith, “the most precious treasure”. In this text, the expression “science of the Creator” does not mean that Abraham had perfect knowledge of God. As we see in the De fuga, Abraham only has a science of God as Creator. Philo means merely that the patriarch firmly understood that the Chaldean doctrine of immanence, expressed through its astrology, was wrong.

  • There are two levels of philosophia in Philo’s thought. They clearly emerge in what he says about Moses. In Mut. 220, he affirms having studied philosophy in its traditional tripartite division. In Mos. 1.21–24, Moses is portrayed as training himself in Greek, Egyptian, and Chaldean sciences. Philosophy in this passage represents a complete set of human science. But in Opif. 8, the meaning is different since philosophy is no longer a complete science. It needs to be completed “by means of oracles”. Philosophy is incomplete without these “oracles”, that is to say, divine Revelation. Thus “Jewish philosophy” for Philo means either the sum of profane sciences, including Greek philosophy, completed by Revelation, or simply the Torah, perceived as the most exact truth about the world and life.

  • If the Torah is the highest philosophy, can it be said that every pious Jew is a philosopher? Philo is cautious in his expression. In Mos. 2.216, he says that on each seventh day, Jews philosophize according to their ancestors’ philosophy, devoting themselves to the study of natural truths and thus becoming more virtuous. But he does not believe that the Law only belongs to those who have been raised in the Jewish faith. The translation of the Septuagint provided everyone the possibility of crossing the frontiers of transcendent truth. Philo’s main answer to those who accused Jews of hating humanity was that the strongest evidence of their philanthrôpia (love of mankind) was given by their capacity to share their most precious gift, the Law of God. He says that when Jews philosophize in their synagogues, especially for Shabbat, some of them transform their lives into a kind of endless Shabbat. The Therapeuts, an ascetic community settled near Alexandria, whose lives are described in Contempl. 69, are said to be “people of trained practice in philosophy”.

Copyright © 2018 by
Carlos Lévy <>

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