Notes to Paul Natorp

1. Cohen is often described as the founder of the “Marburg School”. Yet, as he himself says, he and his colleagues were “surprised by the proclamation of a ‘Marburg School’ in the journals” around 1900, a not always well-meant appellation (Cohen 1914: 466).

2. Cf. Willey 1978; Ollig 1982; Jegelka 1992. For similar reasons, Cassirer would turn to his analyses of myth and its intersection with politics; see Lipton 1978.

3. “Die [Naturwissenschaften sind] ja selbst Kulturfakta” Natorp 1913b: 199; cf. Cohen 1914: 467.

4. As a glance at Natorp’s bibliography shows, however, his (and therefore the Marburg School’s) interest in pedagogy goes back at least to his (1895).

5. This exchange is most strikingly exemplified by the debate at Davos between Heidegger and Cassirer in 1929, which some scholars have recently come to interpret as a referendum on the continued viability of Cohen’s philosophy. See esp. Friedman 2000; Kaegi and Rudolph 2000.

6. Of course, one of the complicating features of Cohen’s writing is that he expounded his own system in the form of an interpretation and “rational reconstruction” of Kant’s philosophy—a peculiar problem that also faces the reader of Natorp’s Platos Ideenlehre (=Natorp 1903b; 1921g; =PI). See Stolzenberg 1995: 21, ff. Cf. Poma 1997: Chs. 1; 3–6.

7. The question of the Marburg School’s real, as opposed to its rhetorical, relationship to Hegel and especially Fichte is a separate issue. Much of Cohen’s and Natorp’s talk of Ge-setz and Setzung clearly owes a debt to Fichte. Cf. Natorp 1921f: 167; Laks 1994: 27 et passim.

8. This had two causes, more cultural and political, than philosophical. As has been much documented, the cataclysm of the First World War led, especially in the defeated Germany, to a general loss of faith in pre-war institutions; this was no less true of the professors than of their students, many of whom repudiated Wilhelmine culture in all of its forms outright. In philosophy, the neo-Kantians, having gained the fatal respectability of mandarins, found themselves besieged by all manner of “radicals” promising new beginnings, by Nietzscheans, Lebensphilosophen, neo-Romantics, anti-modernists, futurists, anarchists, and Phenomenologists. It was unable to propagate itself institutionally into the next generation. The second reason for the occlusion of neo-Kantianism is that many of its key figures were Jews, driven from Germany by the Nazis; Cassirer alone managed to have an impact in the English-speaking world during his lifetime. In addition to Cohen and Cassirer, others include Emil Lask, Jonas Cohn, Siegfried Marck, Richard Hönigswald (Ollig 1982: 6; 42; 397–412). With the exception of Lask, who was killed in action in 1915, the others died in exile. Certain neo-Kantians (Heinrich Rickert and Bruno Bauch) embraced the Nazis. See Ollig 1982: 6, 11, and esp. Sluga 1993.

9. Esp. Holzhey 1986. The writings of Natorp’s Nachlass that appear in Holzhey 1986, vol. 2, are listed in the bibliography under Natorp 1986.

10. It is far beyond the scope of this article to trace in detail the ways in which Natorp departed from Cohen, for that would involve an exposition of the latter’s system; cf. Stolzenberg 1995; Holzhey 1986; Marx 1964.

11. Stolzenberg 1995: 8; cf. esp. 9–12. This unusually self-effacing attitude is in harmony with the personal assessments made by his colleagues and students: cf. Heidegger 1992; Cassirer 1925; Gadamer 1977; indeed, Natorp begins his “self-portrait” of 1921 with the words, “de nobis ipsis silemus” (taken from the Baconian epigraph to the first Critique) (Natorp 1921f). It is vaguely humorous, in this light, that Cohen, in an encomium delivered on the occasion of Natorp’s sixtieth birthday, also finds much to be silent about (Cohen 1914: 467–468).

12. Cf. Natorp 1918a: 5; 1921f: 151. While for the Marburg School the natural sciences were the paradigmatic sciences, recent research shows that in fact classical philology had the highest prestige in the eyes of the public: see Glenn Most’s (1994).

13. Even Cohen eventually gave up the original task of rationalizing aesthetics along with science and ethics.

14. For Cohen’s anti-psychologistic arguments, see, e.g., Stolzenberg 1995: 25, ff.

15. Clearly this dictum alludes to (and interprets) Plato’s Republic VII, 529a, ff.

16. Helmholtz, H., cited by König, in Diemer 1968: 90, ff., cited by Schnädelbach 1983b: 111.

17. For the use of “legislative” in this scientific sense, cf. Young 1992: 111.

18. Natorp’s formulation is slightly, if excusably, misleading here. The Greek verb, metienai (dictionary form: meteimi [ibo]) is not etymologically related to methodos. However, as Natorp correctly says, both terms signify the pursuit of something, and Natorp uses the verb to stress the movement, the action of thinking.

19. The other sense in which Natorp is an idealist is in his belief that all objectivity is the work of thinking, an issue taken up in detail in Section 4.

20. Why reason’s unfulfillable demands should not instead engender paralysis and despair is another question.

21. It might seem that talk of “our cognitive finitude” reintroduces a psychological, subjective element into the very essence of science, but this is not the case. The limitation in question need not be interpreted psychologically, but may be interpreted temporally: as the Marburgers stress, science happens in time, it is historical, and hence also limited temporally. The completion of conceptual determinations, they seem to hold, would take an infinite amount of time.

22. Again, this double sense of “hypothesis” has a Platonic parallel (Republic VI, 510b, ff.), taken up below.

23. Natorp and Cassirer were greatly concerned to show that Einstein’s theories of relativity did not undermine the postulate of scientific continuity so much as confirm it. Cf. Natorp 1910: 392, ff.; Cassirer 1921; 1953: 347–456; Sternberg 1925.

24. Cassirer 1925: 278; Natorp 1887: 257–258. For Natorp’s view of what we nowadays call “(mathematical) logic”, and which he called (in the standard parlance of the day) “Logistik”, see Natorp 1912c: 196; esp. 1910c, 2–11; 37.

25. Cassirer’s Substance and Function (Cassirer 1953) is the most easily accessible text in English of this key Marburg notion; cf. Natorp 1981.

26. This last sense is typical of Cassirer, and will not be discussed further here.

27. Natorp’s talk of synthesis, functions, and categories sounds in many ways like Kant. Kant intimately connects these notions: in the section of the Analytic of Concepts entitled “Concerning the logical use of the understanding in general”, Kant clearly takes “function” to signify the spontaneous activity of the understanding as opposed to the passive receptivity of the intuition’s affectivity; and he defines “function” as “the unity of an act [Handlung] of ordering diverse representations under a common representation” (KrV, A68/B93).

28. In this, Natorp anticipates Carnap’s later distinction between formal, intuitive, and physical space; cf. Carnap 1922; Friedman 2000: 64, et passim.

29. Phillips and Kolb (Natorp 1981) translate this term as “phenomenon of final appeal”.

30. Natorp 1887: 276–277. Because for Natorp no object is ever given in sensibility, but is constructed by thinking, it follows that subject and object are not separate, independent entities that may enter into a special relation called cognition; rather, they are essentially correlative concepts (Natorp 1912c: 208, ff.) This holds for both orders of objectivity. The correlate to doxic phenomenality is subjectivity in the standard sense: the sensible representations are bound to an “I”. The correlate to scientific or true cognitive objectivity is what one might call the scientific or transcendental subject. This subject is not an “I”, but is anonymous, to be identified with the method itself. The common element in both orders of subjectivity is that, because the objectivities are in constant though regulated flux and evolution, the subject, as the correlate, must also continuously change. Hence Natorp’s philosophy introduces a radical fluidity into the notions of subject and object (cf. Natorp 1912c: 208). At the same time, because the objectivities are in constant flux, their hypothetical groundworks are as well: Kant’s categorial “system” becomes fluid, but not chaotic, for it is strictly bound by correlation to the concrete sciences (Natorp 1912c: 209. Cf. esp. Cassirer 1925: 291, ff.).

31. Natorp’s (1887) is the locus classicus of Marburg anti-psychologism; the secondary literature, which traditionally begins with Frege and Husserl, has overlooked this text.

32. For more detailed discussion, see Kim 2007; Dahlstrom 2015; and Kim forthcoming.

33. For more general considerations on nineteenth-century German approaches to history, see Schnädelbach 1983b: 120, ff.

34. “The connection [of philosophy] with history in the first place signifies the connection with science” (Cohen 1902: 443). Cf. Lembeck 1994: 2, 4.

35. Kant expresses a similar thought: “Meanwhile human efforts revolve in a constant circle and always return to a point where they already once were; hence certain materials that now lie in the dust could perhaps be transformed into a wonderful structure” (“Kants Antwort an Garve”, quoted in Heidegger 1962: 43). Cf. Schlegel’s notion of philosophy’s circular-progressive Gang (Schlegel 1958: xliv).

36. Cohen writes:

Nothing is as misleading for the characterization of a historical fact [Tatsache] as pointing to its uniqueness and unrepeatability [Einmaligkeit], which it of course has to have as a brute fact. But from this facticity [Tatsächlichkeit] and isolation, its historical appreciation [Würdigung] demands that it be placed in an order with all cognate testimonia [Zeugnissen] [sc. of the “idealism” or of “mathematical science”] of all times (Cohen 1916: 310).

This quotation should be read as a reproach of the Southwest neo-Kantians.

37. “In its objective historical ground, idealism emerged as scientific idealism, in the grounding of science [i.e. in the transcendental sense]” (Cohen 1916: 309).

38. Unfortunately an excellent example of what Edel calls Cohen’s “hermetic diction” (Edel 1994: 329).

39. “In the idealism of scientific method, antiquity manifests itself as the vital fundamental force of the history of science” (Cohen 1916: 309).

40. Yet more pregnantly put: “Philosophy is Platonism” (Cohen 1912: 245).

41. If this approach sounds tendentious, Natorp does not deny it, but he promises verification through other, interpretation-free methods, presumably stylometry.

42. Hence Natorp makes much of Plato’s apparent identification of the forms with so-called hypotheseis at Phaedo 100, ff., and his other mentions of hypothesis in connection with the forms in the Republic. Cf. esp. PI, Chapters 5, 6; Natorp 1914c, 1911e; Laks 1994; Lembeck 1994; Kim 2010.]

43. According to Stolzenberg, 1912d is the lecture form of 1912e (Stolzenberg 1995: 11).

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