Supplement to Moral Anti-Realism

Moral Objectivity and Moral Relativism

Relativism holds that moral claims contain an essential indexical element, such that the truth of any such claim requires relativization to some individual or group. According to such a view, it is possible that when John asserts “Stealing is wrong” he is saying something true, but that when Jenny asserts “Stealing is wrong” she is saying something false. An individualistic relativism sees the vital difference as lying in the persons making the utterance or in the persons about whom the judgment is made; a cultural relativism sees the difference as stemming from the culture that the speaker inhabits or from the culture of those about whom the judgment is made. (There are more complicated possibilities. Gilbert Harman, for example, would relativize the utterance to a context shared by both speaker and audience (Harman 1975; Harman and Thomson 1996).) In all cases, it may be that what determines the difference in the relevant contexts is something “mind-dependent”—in which case it would be anti-realist relativism—but it need not be; perhaps what determines the relevant difference is an entirely mind-independent affair, making for an objectivist (and potentially realist) relativism. (Consider: Tallness is a relative notion—John is a tall man but a short pro basketball player—but it is not the case that “thinking makes it so.”) Conversely, the non-objectivist need not be a relativist. Suppose the moral facts depend on the attitudes or opinions of a particular group or individual (e.g., “X is good” means “Caesar approves of X,” or “The Supreme Court rules in favor of X,” etc.), and thus moral truth is an entirely mind-dependent affair. Since, in this case, all speakers' moral utterances are made true or false by the same mental activity, then this is not strictly speaking a version of relativism, but is, rather, a relation-designating account of moral terms (see Stevenson 1963: 74 for this distinction). In a relation-designating account of moral goodness (say, Roderick Firth's ideal observer theory, to be discussed in section 5 of the main entry) it is not possible that when John asserts “Stealing is wrong” he is saying something true but that when Jenny asserts “Stealing is wrong” she is saying something false. The mind-dependence relation embodied in a non-objectivist theory may give rise to a relation-designating account of moral truth rather than a relativistic account.

In short, the non-objectivism vs. objectivism and the relativism vs. absolutism polarities are orthogonal to each other, and it is the former pair that is usually taken to matter when it comes to characterizing anti-realism. Moral relativism is sometimes thought of as a version of anti-realism, but (short of stipulating usage) there is no basis for this classification; it is better to say that some versions of relativism may be anti-realist and others may be realist.

Copyright © 2015 by
Richard Joyce <richard.joyce@vuw.ac.nz>

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