What is the relationship between a clay statue and the lump of clay from which it is formed? We might say that the lump constitutes the statue, but what is this relation of material constitution? Some insist that constitution is identity, on the grounds that distinct material objects cannot occupy the same place at the same time. Others argue that constitution is not identity, since the statue and the lump differ in important respects. Still others take cases like this to motivate revisionary views about the nature of persistence, parthood, modality, identity, or existence.
This article presents some of the most important puzzles of material constitution and evaluates some of the most popular responses.
- 1. The Puzzles
- 2. Coincident Objects
- 3. Temporal Parts
- 4. Eliminativism
- 5. Dominant Kinds
- 6. Relative Identity
- 7. Deflationism
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Puzzles of material constitution played an important role in the development of philosophy and continue to be a source of much debate today. Here, we introduce four of the most famous puzzles.
The Debtor’s Paradox. The ancient playwright Epicharmus tells the tale of a poor but resourceful debtor. When approached for payment, the man responds with a riddle. If you add a pebble to a collection of pebbles, you no longer have the same number. If you add a length to a cubit, you no longer have the same measure. In the same way, if you add a bit of matter to a portion of matter you no longer have the same entity. Since man is nothing more than a material object whose matter is constantly changing, we do not survive from one moment to the next. The debtor concludes that he is not the same person who incurred the debt, so he cannot be held responsible for payment. The exasperated creditor then strikes the debtor, who protests the abusive treatment. The creditor expresses sympathy, but points out that he cannot be held accountable for the assault. After all, material change has already taken place so, by the debtor’s own line of reasoning, the guilty party is no longer present. The scene is intended to be comedic, but the argument is no laughing matter. The man who incurred the debt was constituted by one portion of matter, M1. The man who is approached for payment is constituted by a distinct portion of matter, M2 (let us assume, for the sake of argument, that M2 consists of M1, together with some new matter). If constitution is identity, the debtor’s reasoning is sound: the man who is approached for payment is not the man who incurred the debt. More generally, this version of the argument would show that it is impossible for human persons to survive the addition of any new parts.
The Puzzle of Dion and Theon. The Stoic philosopher Chrysippus invites us to consider the case of Dion and Theon, where Dion is a normal human being and Theon is a large part of Dion consisting of everything but Dion’s right foot. Suppose now that the right foot is removed. Theon obviously survives the operation, for his parts remain completely unchanged. But in that case it seems as if Dion does not survive the operation, for otherwise we would have two people in the same place at the same time. Hence, Dion does not survive the loss of his foot. More generally, the argument would show that human persons cannot survive the loss of any constituent parts. (A modern variation on the ancient puzzle, due to Peter Geach 1962 by way of David Wiggins 1967, concerns Tibbles and Tib, where Tibbles is a cat and Tib a cat-part consisting of everything but Tibbles’s tail.)
The Ship of Theseus Puzzle. The ancient historian Plutarch recounts the story of the famous ship of Theseus, which was displayed in Athens for many centuries. Over time, the ship’s planks wore down and were gradually replaced. In the ancient world, the ship became “a standing example among the philosophers, for the logical question as to things that grow; one side holding that the ship remained the same, and the other contending it was not the same” (Clough 1859, p. 21). In the modern era, the case took on added interest, owing to a twist from Thomas Hobbes. Suppose that a custodian collects the original planks as they are removed from the ship and later puts them back together in the original arrangement. In this version of the story, we are left with two seafaring vessels, one on display in Athens and one in the possession of the custodian. But where is the famous Ship of Theseus? Some will say that the ship is with the museum, since ships can survive the complete replacement of parts, provided that the change is sufficiently gradual. Others will say that the ship is with the custodian, since ships can survive being disassembled and reassembled. Both answers seems right, but this leads to the surprising conclusion that, at the end of the story, the ship of Theseus is in two places at once. More generally, the argument suggests that it is possible for one material object to exist in two places at the same time. We get an equally implausible result by working backwards: There are clearly two ships at the end of the story. Each of those ships was also around at the beginning of the story, for the reasons just given. So, at the beginning of the story, there were actually two ships of Theseus occupying the same place at the same time, one of which would go on to the museum and one of which would enter into the care of the custodian.
The Puzzle of the Statue and the Clay. Various ancient philosophers, including Aristotle, pointed out that statues seem to differ in important respects from the portions of matter from which they are made. To illustrate: Suppose that, on Monday, a sculptor purchases an unformed lump of clay, which he names ‘Lump’. Suppose further that, on Tuesday, the artist sculpts the clay into the form of the biblical king David and names his statue ‘David’. It is tempting to say that, in this case, there is only one object in the sculptor’s hands—David just is Lump. But, on reflection, this identification is problematic, since Lump and David seem to differ in various respects. First, Lump and David differ in their temporal properties: Lump existed on Monday, while David did not. Second, they differ in their persistence conditions (i.e., the conditions under which they would and would not continue to exist): Lump could survive being squashed, David could not. Third, they differ in kind: Lump is a mere lump of clay, while David is a statue. More generally, we can say that Lump and David differ in their non-categorical properties, where these include all of the various ways that a thing was, will, would, could, or must be. (Fine 2003 argues that Lump and David also differ in their aesthetic properties, among other things.) But if Lump and David differ in even one respect, they are not the same thing, for Leibniz’s Law tells that, for any x and y, if x = y, then x and y have all the same properties. Thus, it seems as if the sculptor holds not one, but two, material objects in his hands: a statue and a lump of clay. More generally, it is possible for two material objects to exist in the same place at the same time.
The four puzzles differ in details, but present a common problem. (A fifth puzzle about material constitution—the problem of the many—raises significantly different issues and is dealt with in a separate entry. See the entry on the problem of the many.) We will focus on the case of the statue and the clay, and we will formulate the argument as follows:
- David did not exist on Monday (but does exist on Tuesday).
- Lump did exist on Monday (and also exists on Tuesday).
- If (1) and (2), then David is not identical to Lump.
- [So] David is not identical to Lump.
The premises are plausible, but the conclusion seems absurd, for it implies the possibility of spatially coincident objects. As David Wiggins notes, “It a truism frequently called in evidence and confidently relied upon in philosophy that two things cannot be in the same place at the same time.” (1968, p. 90) Since the conclusion contradicts the truism, we are left with a paradox: seemingly true premises have led to a seemingly false conclusion.
Generally speaking, there are five possible replies to the paradox. First, one could simply accept (4) and admit that David is not identical to Lump. We consider this response in sections 2 and 3, where we discuss the constitution view of David Wiggins (1968) and the temporal parts theory of David Lewis (1976). Second, one could deny (1) by either denying the existence of David or by insisting that David existed on Monday. We consider these responses in section 4, where we discuss the eliminativist views of Peter Unger (1979), Peter van Inwagen (1990), and Roderick Chisholm (1979). Third, one could deny (2) by either denying the existence of Lump (as the eliminativist does) or by denying that Lump survives being shaped into a statue. We consider this second option in section 5, where we discuss the dominant kinds view of Michael Burke (1992). Fourth, one could deny (3) by rejecting the standard formulation of Leibniz’s Law. We consider this response in section 6, where we discuss the relative identity theory of Peter Geach (1967). Fifth and finally, one could respond to the paradox by insisting that the underlying issues are in some sense verbal, so that there is no fact of the matter about which premise (if any) is false. We consider this response in section 7, where we discuss the deflationist views of Rudolf Carnap (1950) and others.
One final note: Our focus will be on puzzles about material objects, but similar problems arise for other kinds of entities, including events, properties, and groups. Suppose, for example, that Jackie attacks his enemy by kicking him. What is the relation between the attack and the kick? We might say that the kick constitutes an attack, but what is the relation of event constitution? (For an introduction to the parallel debate over events, see Davidson 1969, Goldman 1970, and Pheifer 1989. For the debate over property constitution, see Shoemaker 2003. For the debate over group constitution, see Uzquiano 2004a.)
The most popular reply to the paradox of material constitution is to embrace the conclusion: Lump and Statue exist at the same place at the same time, but differ in their non-categorical properties, so it is possible for there to be two material objects in the same place at the same time. This view is sometimes referred to as the constitution view since it holds that the statue is constituted by, but not identical to, the lump of clay from which it is formed. In a slogan: constitution is not identity. (Johnston 1992, Baker 1997) Constitution is distinguished from identity insofar as it is an asymmetric relation: Lump constitutes Statue, but not vice versa. Constitution is also taken to be a dependence relation: As David Wiggins puts it, the statue “consists in” and is “nothing over and above” the lump of clay (1968, p. 91; for more on the nature of constitution, see Wasserman 2004).
The constitution view is extremely popular, having been defended, in some form or other, by Baker (1997, 2000, 2002, 2007), Chappell (1990), Doepke (1982, 1996), Fine (2003), Forbes (1987), Johnston (1992), Koslicki (2004), Kripke (1971), Levey (1997), Lowe (1983, 1995), Oderberg (1996), Pollock (1974, pp. 157–174), Salmon (1981, pp. 224–9), Shoemaker (1999, 2003), Shorter (1977), Simons (1985, 1987, pp. 210–252), Thomson (1983, 1998), and Yablo (1987). Indeed, the view is so common that it has been labeled “the standard account” (Burke 1992). Why not join the crowd?
“Just try to walk through a wall,” quips the skeptic. “Two things can’t be in the same place at the same time!” We will call this the impenetrability objection, since it appeals to the common idea that impenetrability is the mark of the material.
The constitution theorist has a ready reply to the obvious objection: unlike you and the wall, David and Lump share the same matter and the same parts and it is in virtue of these facts that those two objects are able to occupy the same place at the same time (Wiggins 1968). In short: spatial coincidence (the sharing of place) is explained by material coincidence (the sharing parts). Material coincidence also helps to answer another common complaint: suppose that Lump weighs 10lbs; David will then weigh 10lbs. as well. So why don’t you get a reading of 20lbs. when you place both on the scale? “Why don’t the two together weigh twice as much?” (Lewis 1986, p. 252) Answer: because the two objects share the same weight as a result of sharing the same parts. (Zimmerman 1995, p. 89, fn. 57. As Zimmerman notes, we do not calculate the weight of something by summing the weights of all its parts—weigh the bricks and the molecules of a wall and you will get the wrong result, since you will have weighed some parts more than once. According to the constitution theorist, weighing David and Lump involves the same kind of double-counting.)
Material coincidence may explain how spatial coincidence is possible, but what about material coincidence itself? On the face of it, the claim that different things can be made up out of the same parts at the same time is no more plausible than the claim that different things can be located in the same place at the same time. We will call this the extensionality objection, since it appeals to the common idea that wholes are individuated by their parts in the same way that sets are individuated by their members. More formally, the principle is this:
Extensionality: ∀x∀y [x = y ↔ ∀z(Pzx ↔ Pzy)]
Note three things about this principle. First, ‘P’ stands for the generic parthood relation, which is to be distinguished from the relations of improper parthood (x is an improper part of y if and only if x =y) and proper parthood (x is a proper part of y if and only if x is a part of y and x ≠ y). Second, the extensionality principle is formulated in terms of a two-place parthood relation. Constitution theorists, however, typically employ a three-place relation that holds between parts, wholes, and times. So, for example, it is said that my baby teeth are a part of me at one time, but not at another (for more on the relation between the constitution view and temporally-relativized mereology, see Thomson 1983 and Thomson 1998). Having noted this point, I will now leave temporal qualifiers implicit. Third, and most importantly, note that extensionality is a theorem in standard systems of mereology, the logic of parts and wholes (see the entry on mereology). The problem, of course, is that the extensionality principle is inconsistent with the constitution view if we assume that coinciding objects occupy the same place at the same time by having all of the same parts at those times. If David and Lump share all of the same parts, for example, extensionality tells us that David is Lump.
One obvious response to this objection is to deny extensionality (Thompson 1983). But this move comes at a cost, since extensionality follows from the standard assumption that the parthood relation is both reflexive and antisymmetric:
Antisymmetry: ∀x∀y[(Pxy & Pyx) → x = y]
Reflexivity tells us that everything is part of itself, so if x and y share all of the same parts, then each must be a part of the other. Antisymmetry then implies that x is identical to y. (The extensionality objection is sometimes framed in terms of a different Extensionality principle according to which objects are identical if and only if they share all of the same proper parts. This principle does not follow from Reflexivity and Antisymmetry, but it is a theorem of standard systems of mereology—see the entry on mereology for more details.)
A second response is to say that coinciding objects share all of their material parts, but that they differ in some non-material aspect (Rea 1998, Paul 2002, McDaniel 2001). The most familiar version of this view traces back to Aristote and the idea that material objects are compounds of matter and form. If one accepts this view, then one could say that David and Lump differ in their parts since only David has the form Statue as a non-material part. (For a recent defense of an Aristotle-inspired view, see Koslicki 2008. For more details on Aristotle’s own views, see the entry on Aristotle’s metaphysics.)
According to the constitution view, David and Lump share the same matter. As a result, those objects share many of the same properties. Both have the same weight, the same shape, and the same coloring. Generalizing, we can say that those two objects share all of the same categorical properties. Of course, David and Lump also differ with respect to their non-categorical properties (where these include temporal properties, persistence conditions, and kind properties). So we should ask: What could account for these differences? How can two things that are exactly alike in so many ways still differ in these other respects? We will call this the grounding objection since it appeals to the common idea that non-categorical properties are grounded in categorical properties. (For alternative statements of the objection, see Burke 1992, Heller 1990, pp. 30–2, Oderberg 1996, p. 158, Simons 1987, pp. 225–6, and Zimmerman 1995, pp. 87–8. Note: The grounding objection is sometimes framed in terms of supervenience, but this is a mistake for supervenience and grounding are importantly different relations. For more on this issue, see Zimmerman 1995, Olson 2001, and Bennett 2004. See the entry on metaphysical grounding and Section 5.5 of the entry on supervenience.)
One response to the grounding objection attempts to ground the non-categorical features of coinciding objects in relational facts about those objects. For example, Lynne Rudder Baker suggests that David is a statue, rather than a mere lump of clay, because it is essentially related to an artworld—it is the sort of thing that is admired, reviewed, and discussed. Lump does not receive this sort of attention and for this reason it differs in kind. (Baker 2000, pp. 35–46) The problem with this explanation is that it seems to get things exactly backwards, for it is natural to say that David is admired, reviewed, and discussed by those in the art community because it is a statue (rather than a mere lump of clay). A second, related, response attempts to ground the non-categorical features of coinciding objects in historical facts. For example, one might point out that Lump was created by a claymaker whose intent was to create some clay, while David was created by a sculptor whose intent was to create a statue. One can then claim that the relevant difference in kind membership is determined, at least in part, by these historical facts. Consider an analogy. A counterfeit dollar bill may be qualitatively identical to a genuine dollar bill, but those two objects would still differ in kind since only one would be an actual dollar bill. Presumably, this difference in kind is explained by historical facts about how those bills came into being. According to the constitution theorist, the same kind of explanation applies in the case of the statue and the clay. The general problem with this line of response is that it cannot be extended to every case of constitution. Consider, for example, Alan Gibbard’s (1975) famous example of Lumpl and Goliath. An artist sculpts a statue of the biblical giant Goliath in two pieces—bottom and top halves—and then brings the two pieces together. In so doing, he creates a new statue (which he names ‘Goliath’) and a new piece of clay (which he names ‘Lumpl’). After a brief tour of the local art galleries, the statue is then smashed to bits, simultaneously destroying both Goliath and Lumpl. The crucial feature of this case is that Lumpl and Goliath share all of their historical properties and appear to stand in the same relations to everything else around them. For example, both are created at the same time, by the same person, with a single set of intentions. Both are put on display in the same galleries and gazed upon by the same patrons. Both are destroyed at the same time, in exactly the same way. In short, Lumpl and Goliath seem to share all of their categorical properties—including their relational properties—while still differing with respect to their modal properties and kind properties. But, in that case, it seems as if there is nothing to ground these non-categorical differences. (For a potential reply to this and other worries, see Sutton 2012.)
At this point we have reviewed the three most common objections to the constitution view: the impenetrability objection, the extensionality objection, and the grounding objection. A fourth and final concern is what we might call the anthropic objection. (Sider 2001, pp. 156–8 refers to this as the “arbitrariness worry”. For a classic statement of the problem, see Sosa 1987. For a more recent statement, see section 2.5 of the entry on ordinary objects.) Thus far, we have focused on the question of whether two material objects—like David and Lump—could exist at the same place and time. But why stop at two? Consider the mereological sum of material simples that is made up out of all the simples that currently compose David and Lump. Those simples existed long before David or Lump came into existence, so the sum is distinct from the other two objects. So now it seems as if we have three objects in the same place at the same time: a lump, a statue, and a sum. But why stop at three? Consider the instatue that coincides with David whenever that statue is indoors and then goes out of existence whenever David is taken outside. (This example is inspired by Eli Hirsch’s 1982, p. 32 example of incars and outcars.) Now it looks as if we have four objects in the same place at the same time: a lump, a statue, a sum, and an instatue. But why stop at four? There is also the tablestatue (that exists when and only when the statue is on a table), the litstatue (that exists when and only when the statue is in the light), the dinnerstatue (that exists when only when the statue’s sculptor is eating dinner), and so on. Ernest Sosa (1987) refers to this multiplication of entities as “the explosion of reality”.
Defenders of the constitution view may run from the explosion and insist that there are only two (or three or four) objects in the same place at the same time. But what justifies this exclusionary attitude? Granted, we humans do not normally concern ourselves with instatues, litstatues, and the rest. Ordinary English does not even have sortal terms for discussing these entities. But these are facts about our interests and linguistic decisions. Why should we think that there is a correspondence between the sortal terms in our language and the kinds of objects in the world? One way to explain this correspondence would be to claim that reality is determined, in some sense, by our conceptual scheme. But the constitution view is typically offered as an alternative to anti-realist doctrines of this kind. Perhaps, then, the constitution theorist should accept Sosa’s explosion and say that our inattentiveness does not exclude instatues, litstatues and all the rest from the realm of being? Perhaps all of those objects exist at the same place at the same time, sharing the same parts and the same matter? Perhaps. But accepting this explosion brings us very close to endorsing a second view on material constitution. It is to this view that we now turn.
Consider the case of Interstate 5. I-5 runs through Washington, Oregon, and California, but the road is not wholly present in any of those states. Rather, I-5 exists in different states by having different road segments in each—there is the Washington segment of I-5, the Oregon segment of I-5, and the California segment of I-5. According to the temporal parts theorist (or four-dimensionalist), persistence through time is exactly like that (see Quine 1953a, Lewis 1976, and Sider 2001). Just as roads exist at different places by having distinct spatial parts at those places, material objects exist at different times by having distinct temporal parts at those times. In the case of David Lewis, for example, there is the 1970s segment, the 1980s segment, and the 1990s segment. More formally, we can say that x is a temporal part of y at (or during) t if and only if (i) x is a part of y at (or during) t, (ii) x overlaps everything that is a part of y at (or during) t, and (iii) x exists only at (or during) t. (Sider 2001, p. 60) Informally, we can say that a temporal part of something just consists of all and only that object’s parts at some time (or during some temporal interval). If you want to know what a temporal part looks like, just look in the mirror—what you see is your current temporal part. (Of course, you can also see yourself in the mirror by seeing your current temporal part, just as you can see a road by seeing one of its segments.)
Consider now the case of U.S. Route 29, which runs from the western suburbs of Baltimore, Maryland, to Pensacola, Florida. As U.S. 29 passes through Charlotte it becomes Tyson St.—a street wholly located within the state of North Carolina. The two roadways in this case are not identical, but they are partly identical, for Tyson St. is identical to a proper spatial part of U.S. 29. According to the temporal parts theorist, the case of the statue and the clay is just like that. Lump exists for some period of time and then “turns into” David. If the sculptor is unsatisfied with her work and squashes the statue, then Lump—but not David—continues to exist, in which case David is nothing more than a proper temporal part of Lump.
There are, of course, various arguments for and against the doctrine of temporal parts. (For a summary, see the entry on temporal parts.) Here, we focus on the relevance of the doctrine to the puzzles of material constitution and, in particular, to the challenges facing the constitution view.
The impenetrability objection. The first problem for the constitution view was that it allowed for two material objects to exist in the same place at the same time. The temporal parts theorist avoids this objection for he will say that, whenever Lump and David exist, there is a single object that exactly occupies the relevant location—a temporal part that is shared by both David and Lump. Of course, the friend of temporal parts will admit that there is a sense in which two material objects can exist in the same place at the same time, since two persisting objects that share a common temporal will be partly present at the same location. But this is no more problematic than two roads being partly present at the same place by virtue of sharing a common road segment.
The extensionality objection. The second problem for the constitution view was that it allowed for two objects to be composed of all the same parts. The temporal parts theorist avoids this problem in the case of the statue and the lump, since he will say that those objects share some, but not all, of the same temporal parts. Of course, he will also admit that there is a sense in which two objects can have all of the same parts, since two objects that share a common temporal part will have all the same parts at that time. But this is no more problematic than two roads that share a common road segment and, thus, have all of the same parts at that place.
The grounding objection. The third challenge for the constitution theorist was to identify a ground for the non-categorical features of coinciding objects. The same challenge can be put to the friend of temporal parts. In the case of the statue and the lump of clay, for example, we have two objects that share all of the same categorical properties whenever they both exist—in virtue of what, then, do they differ with respect to their temporal properties, kind properties, and so on? The temporal parts theorist could follow the constitution theorist in claiming that the relevant objects differ in kind, for example, in virtue of their historical properties or he could simply insist that the difference in kind is grounded in the fact that the two objects have different temporal parts. (See Wasserman 2002 for more on temporal parts and the grounding problem.)
The anthropic objection. The last worry for the constitution view was that it postulated an unexplained correspondence between the sortal terms in our language and the kinds of objects in the world. The temporal parts theorist avoids this worry as well. On the standard four-dimensionalist picture, persisting objects are ultimately composed of instantaneous temporal parts and, for any collection of these parts, there is a further object that they compose. Thus, there is a material object corresponding to every filled region of spacetime. (Quine 1960, p. 171) For example, there is an object composed of all and only the temporal parts of David when that statue is indoors. This would be what we earlier called an “instatue”. There is also an object composed of all and only the temporal parts of David when that statue is in the light. This is what we earlier called a “litstatue”. In this way, the temporal parts theorist finds a place for all of the objects introduced earlier, and thereby avoids an implausible correlation between the sortal terms of our language and the kinds of objects in the world. (Of course, he avoids this objection by accepting Sosa’s explosion, which many take to be an even more objectionable result—see, for example, Markosian 1998, p. 228.)
The temporal parts theorist thus avoids all of the objections facing the constitution view, at least when we restrict our attention to the original puzzle of Lump and David. Unfortunately, matters are not so simple in Gibbard’s case of Lumpl and Goliath. Those objects exist at all of the same times and thus share all of the same temporal parts. The four-dimensionalist who accepts extensionality will thus be forced to conclude that Lumpl is identical to Goliath. But, in that case, he faces the following kind of argument:
- Goliath is essentially statue-shaped.
- Lumpl is not essentially statue-shaped.
- If (1) and (2), then Goliath is not identical to Lumpl.
- [So] Goliath is not identical to Lumpl.
(1) appears true, since Goliath could not survive being rolled up into a ball, for example. But Lumpl could survive that change in shape, so (2) appears true as well. Finally, (3) appears to follow from Leibniz’s Law. Goliath has the property of being essentially statue-shaped and Lumpl does not, so Goliath is not identical to Lumpl.
The most popular reply to this objection is due to David Lewis (1971, 1986), who defends a counterpart theory of de re modal ascriptions (like (1) and (2) above). According to this view, ordinary individuals like Goliath and Lumpl are worldbound—they exist in only one possible world—but have counterparts at many other possible worlds. These counterparts serve as the truth-makers for de re modal ascriptions. Roughly, we say that something is essentially F just in case all of its counterparts are F and we say that something is contingently F just in case one or more of its counterparts are not-F. The counterpart relation is a relation of similarity, rather than identity, and, as with all similarity talk, claims about counterparts will be vague and sensitive to context. The most important point in this connection is that names and other referring expressions are often associated with kinds that determine the appropriate counterpart relation for assessing de re modal claims involving those terms. In Gibbard’s case, for example, we introduced the name ‘Goliath’ for the statue and the name ‘Lumpl’ for the piece of clay. Thus, claims that include the name ‘Goliath’ invoke a statue-counterpart relation, whereas claims that include the name ‘Lumpl’ invoke a piece-of-clay-counterpart relation. (1), for example, attributes to Goliath the property of being such that all of its statue-counterparts are statue-shaped. And (2) denies Lumpl the property of being such that all of its piece-of-clay-counterparts are statue-shaped. Since the predicates in the two premises express different properties, Leibniz’s Law has no application. (For a criticism of this response, see Fara and Williamson 2005.)
The simplest way of avoiding the puzzles of material constitution is to deny the existence of some of the objects that give rise to those problems. For example, if one claims that there are no such things as statues and lumps of clay, then there is no threat of having a statue and a lump of clay in the same place at the same time. In this section, we briefly introduce three versions of this eliminativist view.
Eliminativism is often associated with Peter Unger (1979), who (previously) defended the thesis of mereological nihilism. Nihilism is the view that there are there are no composite objects (i.e., objects with proper parts); there are only mereological simples (i.e., objects with no proper parts). The nihilist thus denies the existence of statues, ships, humans, and all other macroscopic material objects. On this view, there are only atoms in the void. Since the nihilist denies the existence of statues in general, he will deny the existence of the particular statue, David. Hence, he will reject the very first premise of the original argument for coincident objects. He will also reject the second premise of that argument, since he will deny the existence of the relevant lump. (Terminological note: Unger called himself a ‘nihilist’, but his use of the term differed slightly from current usage—see van Inwagen 1990, p. 73.)
The nihilist makes two main claims, one negative and one positive. Both claims can be challenged. Let us begin with the negative thesis that there are no composite objects and no statues in particular. The most common reaction to this claim is an incredulous stare. For many, the existence of composite objects is a Moorean fact, more certain than any premise that could be used to argue against it. The nihilist may reply by pointing out that there is a sense in which statues do exist. In our original case, for example, the nihilist will say that, strictly speaking, there is no statue, but there are some simples arranged statuewise. Those simples jointly occupy a statue-shaped region of space, jointly resemble the biblical king David, and jointly sit on some simples arranged tablewise. So, loosely speaking, we can say that there is a statue of David on the table. Similarly for all talk of statues, ships, and other composite objects—wherever commonsense says that there is a composite object belonging to the kind K, the nihilist will say that there are some simples arranged K-wise and so, loosely speaking, a K. (For more details on this paraphrasing strategy, see van Inwagen 1990, chapter 10. For worries, see O’Leary-Hawthorne and Michael 1996, Uzquiano 2004b, and McGrath 2005.) This brings us to the nihilist’s positive thesis that there are material simples. This claim can also be challenged (see Sider 1993, Zimmerman 1996, and Schaffer 2003). It was once thought that chemical atoms were fundamental particles, until the discovery of protons and neutrons. And it was thought that protons and neutrons were mereological simples, until the discovery of quarks. One might think it is possible for this process goes on without limit, in which case our world would be gunky (i.e., it would have no simples as proper parts). The problem is that this possibility is inconsistent with nihilism, which seems to imply that a material world must contain material simples.
A second version of eliminativism is associated with Peter van Inwagen (1990), who defends the following thesis about composition: There is some y such that the xs compose y if and only if the activity of the xs constitute a life. According to this thesis, the only composite objects are living organisms. Beyond that, there are only material simples. So, for example, van Inwagen recognizes the existence of apple trees, but not apples. Van Inwagen’s view is closely related to nihilism, but has one notable advantage—it allows for the existence of human persons. For example, in the case of Dion and Theon, van Inwagen will say that Dion exists at the beginning of the story, since the activity of the relevant simples constitutes a life (the life of Dion). But van Inwagen will deny that Theon exists, for the activity of the relevant simples only constitutes a part of Dion’s life at that time. (Of course, the activity of those same simples constitutes a life after Dion’s right foot is removed, at which point the simples come to compose Dion.) More generally, van Inwagen denies the existence of what he calls “arbitrary undetached parts”:
The Doctrine of Arbitrary Undetached Parts (DAUP): For every material object m, time t, and regions r1 and r2, if m occupies r1 at t and r2 is a sub-region of r1, then there is a part of m that occupies r2 at t. (cf. van Inwagen 1981, p. 123)
Let m = Dion, t = a pre-operation time, r1 = the region occupied by Dion at t, and r2 = the region corresponding to all of Dion except for his right foot at t. If DAUP were correct, Theon would exist, for it would just be the proper part of Dion that occupies r2 at t. Van Inwagen denies the existence of Theon, so he denies DAUP as well. (For more on DAUP and its role in puzzles of material constitution, see van Inwagen 1981, Olson 1996, and Parsons 2004.)
Van Inwagen’s version of eliminativism is subject to the same objections raised against nihilism, but it also faces problems of its own. Here is one worry. There are borderline cases where it is vague whether or not the activity of some simples constitutes a life (consider, for example, the question of when, exactly, a person comes into existence or passes away). But, if it is vague whether the activity of some simples constitutes a life then, according to van Inwagen, it is vague how many objects exist. But it cannot be vague how many objects exist, since cardinality claims can be made in a part of language where nothing is vague. Suppose, for example, that there are exactly one-million simples and suppose it is vague whether or not the activity of those simples constitutes a life. Now consider the numerical sentence that asserts the existence of (at least) one-million and one objects. (A numerical sentence is a first-order sentence asserting the existence of some objects. For example, the numerical sentence that there exist at least two objects is: ∃x∃y(x ≠ y).) If van Inwagen is correct, it is indeterminate whether or not the relevant numerical sentence is true, in which case one of the constituent expressions—‘∃’, ‘x’, ‘y’, ‘~’, ‘=’—must be vague. Yet many philosophers have claimed that the terms of first-order logic do not admit of borderline cases. (For a more detailed presentation of this argument, see Lewis 1986, pp. 212–213, Sider 2001, pp. 120–132, and section 2.2 of the entry on ordinary objects. For potential replies, see Hirsch 2002b, Liebesman and Eklund 2007, and van Inwagen 1990, Chapter 13.)
A third version of eliminativism is often associated with Roderick Chisholm (1973), who defends the doctrine of mereological essentialism: For any x and y, if x is a part of y then, necessarily, y exists only if x is a part of y. This doctrine is an “eliminativist” view insofar as it denies the existence of mereologically ductile objects. For example, in the Ship of Theseus case it is natural to think that there is a ship which survives the replacement of at least some of its parts. The essentialist’s response to the paradox is to deny this apparent truism. In the same way, the Debtor’s Paradox and the Puzzle of Deon and Theon only arise on the assumption that human persons can gain and lose parts. The essentialist solves these puzzles by rejecting this assumption. The Puzzle of the Statue and the Clay remains problematic, however, for that example involved a change in shape, rather than a change in parts. In order to respond to this puzzle, the essentialist must endorse an additional principle: For any xs and for any y, if the xs compose y then, necessarily, the xs exist only if they compose y. This thesis says that the whole is essential to the parts, so that whenever you have the same parts, you have the same whole. We will refer to the combination of this principle and the doctrine of mereological essentialism as the thesis of mereological constancy. The defender of this thesis will say that, in our earlier case, Lump exists on both Monday and Tuesday, for the same clay parts are there on both days. The same is true of David. The parts that compose David on Tuesday are present on Monday, in which case the first premise of the earlier argument is false—David did exist on Monday. In that case, the defender of mereological constancy is free to identify David and Lump and thereby avoid commitment to coincident objects.
Viewed from one perspective, the doctrine of mereological constancy can seem somewhat intuitive. When one rearranges the dining room furniture, one does not bring new furniture into existence—one simply brings existing furniture into a new arrangement. In the same way, rearranging the material contents of the universe does not bring new material objects into existence—it simply puts existing objects into new arrangements. Thus, when the artist sculpts the lump of clay she gives that object a new form, but does not create a new object. Viewed from another perspective, however, mereological constancy seems completely absurd, for it implies that if we annihilate a single subatomic particle from David, the entire statue will be destroyed. (More frightening still, if we annihilate a single particle from your body, you will no longer exist.) The mereological essentialist may reply that, if we were to annihilate a particle from David, there would still be a statue left in its place—call it David*. David* would not be identical to David, but it would be very similar to David. For example, it would have roughly the same mass, the same shape, and the same location. In one sense, then, we could say that the earlier statue is the same as the latter statue. So we could say that, loosely speaking, David survives. (In Chisholm’s terminology, David* is a “statue-successor” of David, and what we would normally think of as the statue is nothing more than a “logical construction” out of these and other successive objects—it is what Chisholm calls an ens successivum.) Here is a second worry for the defender of mereological constancy. Imagine that the artist who sculpted David becomes dissatisfied with her work and squashes the statue. All of David’s clay parts would survive the squashing, so the thesis of mereological constancy tells us that David, the statue, survives. But this seems absurd—statues cannot survive being squashed. We get an equally absurd result in the opposite direction. David’s parts existed prior to the sculpting, so David itself existed prior to the sculpting. But how can a statue exist before it is sculpted? The defender of mereological constancy may reply by pointing out that that the thing which is (currently) a statue may have existed prior to the sculpting, but it was not (then) a statue. In this sense, at least, we can say that the statue did not exist prior to sculpting. Similarly, the thing which is (currently) a statue may survive being squashed, but it will not (then) be a statue. So, loosely speaking, the statue will not survive the squashing. (For more details on this paraphrasing strategy, see Chisholm 1976, chapter 3.)
In the previous section, we examined various ways of resisting the first premise of our original argument: David did not exist on Monday. Let us now turn our attention to the second premise of that argument: Lump did exist on Monday. Eliminativists like Unger and van Inwagen will reject this premise, since they deny the existence of lumps like Lump. But there are other theories that lead to the rejection of this premise as well. One such theory is the dominant kind view, which is defended by Michael Burke (1994, 1997a, 1997b).
Burke begins with the assumption that there is a single object present on Tuesday. For the moment, let us simply refer to this object as Rex. Burke assumes that Rex is both a lump of clay and a statue. This is a perfectly natural assumption, but it is also problematic. As we have seen, kinds like lump of clay and statue are associated with different modal properties and different persistence conditions in particular. To return to an earlier example, the kind lump of clay is associated with the persistence condition of being able to survive squashing, while the kind statue is associated with the persistence condition of being unable to survive squashing. Now consider the following principle: For any object o and kind K, if o is a K, then o has the persistence conditions associated with K (Burke 1994, p. 598). If this principle is correct, we have a problem. Rex is both a lump of clay and a statue, so the principle tells us that it is able to survive squashing and that it is not. Burke concludes that the proposed principle is false: It is possible for an object to be a K without having the persistence conditions associated with that kind. In particular, Burke claims that Rex is a statue and a lump of clay, but it only has the persistence conditions associated with one of those kinds. Which one? Burke answers that, in general, an object has the persistence conditions associated with its dominant kind. What is a dominant kind? Burke answers that, in general, an object’s dominant kind is the kind that “entails possession of the widest range of properties” (1994, p. 607; for an alternative account of dominance, see Rea 2000). For example, if something is a lump of clay, then it must have certain physical properties. If something is a statue, on the other hand, it must have both physical properties and aesthetic properties. In this sense, statue entails a wider range of properties than lump of clay. Hence, statue dominates lump of clay. Rex therefore has the persistence conditions associated with the kind statue. Rex, in other words, is just David. What about Lump? In the original story, the name ‘Lump’ is introduced for the lump of clay that exists on Monday. At that point there was no statue, so Lump’s dominant kind is simply lump of clay. Let us now introduce the name ‘Lump*’ for the lump of clay that exists on Tuesday. The lump of clay that exists on Tuesday is also a statue (Lump* is David, i.e., Rex), so Lump*’s dominant kind is statue. Hence, Lump ≠ Lump*. On Burke’s view, the process of sculpting a lump of clay into a statue destroys one object (a mere lump of clay) and replaces it with another (a statue). The resulting statue is also a lump of clay, but it is numerically distinct from the lump of clay with which we began. Burke concludes that Lump exists on Monday, but does not exist on Tuesday. Hence, the second premise of the original argument is false.
The dominant kinds view has several advantages over the eliminativist views discussed in the previous section. Most notably, the dominant kinds view recognizes the existence of ordinary objects like statues and lumps of clay and allows for these objects to gain and lose parts. However, some of the objections raised in previous sections apply to Burke’s view as well. For example, the anthropic objection from section 2 can also be raised against the dominant kinds view (Sider 2001, p. 165). In addition, the view faces problems of its own.
First, there is the objection from commonsense. According to Burke, sculptors can destroy lumps of clay by doing nothing more than reshaping them in accordance with certain artistic intentions. In fact, given certain theories of what constitutes an artwork, the sculptor doesn’t even have to do that much. Suppose that an artist takes a liking to a particular rock in his yard. He gives it the title Rocky and invites art critics to admire his new work. If this is all it takes to create a work of art, then this is all it takes to destroy a rock. After all, the rock at the beginning of the story has piece of rock as its dominant kind, while the rock that exists at the end of the story has piece of art as its dominant kind. Hence, the latter rock is numerically distinct from the former—the original rock is no more. Yet this seems absurd. We are not gods. We cannot create and destroy material objects with the power of thought alone. Burke replies to this objection by distinguishing various readings of ‘the rock’. (1994, 596–7) ‘The rock’ can be understood as a singular description that denotes the rock (a single object). ‘The rock’ can also be understood as a plural description that denotes all of the little pieces of rock. Finally, ‘the rock’ can be understood as a mass description that denotes the relevant rocky stuff. On the first reading, the rock from the beginning of the story is not the same as the rock at the end of the story. But, on the second and third readings, the rock from the beginning of the story is the same as the rock at the end of the story. The artist may destroy the relevant object, but he does not destroy the little pieces of rock that compose that object or the rocky stuff that constitutes that object. Hence, there is a good sense in which “the rock” survives. Burke claims that this is enough to satisfy the demands of commonsense. (For more on mass descriptions and the distinction between stuff and things, see the entry on the metaphysics of mass expressions.)
A second problem concerns Burke’s account of dominance. Burke claims that one kind dominates another when it entails a wider range of properties. This seems to get the current case correct, for there is a natural sense in which statue entails a wider range of properties than lump of clay. But other cases are less clear. Take, for example, the case of a performance artist who poses his own body to form a statue. The relevant object is both a human person and a statue. The kind statue entails having certain physical and aesthetic properties, but does not entail having any mental properties. The kind human person entails having certain physical and mental properties, but one could argue that it does not entail having any aesthetic properties. In that case, neither kind dominates the other, so Burke’s account fails to tell us what the object is or what persistence conditions it possesses. (For more on these kinds of cases, see Rea 2000.)
A third problem for the dominant kinds view is that it cannot be extended to cover all cases of constitution. Take, for example, the Ship of Theseus Puzzle. In that case, we seem to have two objects in the same place at the same time, where both of the objects are ships. Since there is a single kind at issue, the question of dominance does not arise and Burke’s account provides no help.
In the previous two sections, we discussed various ways of challenging the first two premises of the argument for coincident entities. Let us now turn our attention to the third and final premise: If David did not exist on Monday and Lump did exist on Monday, then David is not identical to Lump. The premise follows from Leibniz’s Law: for any x and y, if x is identical to y, then x and y share all of the same properties. The denial of Leibniz’s Law therefore provides one way of resisting the final premise of the argument.
The denial of Leibniz’s Law is sometimes associated with Peter Geach (1962, 1967), who defends a view called the relative identity theory. Geach’s central thesis is that there is no relation of absolute identity—there are only relations of relative identity. In particular, identity is always relative to a kind. Thus, we can say that David is the same statue as Lump and we can say that David is the same lump of clay as Lump, but it makes no sense to say that David is the same as Lump simpliciter. The consequent of the third premise is therefore nonsense—saying ‘David is not identical to Lump’ is like saying ‘David is not to the left of’. More generally, Geach rejects the standard formulation of Leibniz’s Law as incomplete, since it includes a non-relativized identity predicate. In this way, the relative identity theorist is able to block the third step of the argument for coincident objects.
Geach makes many interesting claims about the behavior of relative identity relations. For example, he claims that it is possible for a to be the same K as b, but not the same K*, where ‘K’ and ‘K*’ are sortal terms denoting distinct kinds. Take the Debtor’s Paradox. In that case, we have an earlier portion of matter, M1, and a later portion of matter M2. According to Geach, M1 is not the same portion of matter as M2, but it is the same person. In this way, he is able to allow for the persistence of persons through changes in parts. (For further details on Geach’s view, see the entry on relative identity.)
The relative identity theorist may deny the standard formulation of Leibniz’s Law, but there is significant pressure to accept some version of that principle since it seems to capture a central fact about identity. An obvious suggestion is to offer a relativized version of Leibniz’s Law: For any x and y, if x is the same K as y, then x and y share all of the same properties (where ‘K’ is a sortal denoting a kind). If Geach’s relative identity relations do not conform to this law, one might worry that they are not identity relations at all. And here we have a potential problem. Take the case of David and Lump. As we have seen, some philosophers want to say that David is both a statue and a lump of clay (it is not a mere lump of clay, since it is also a statue, but it is still a lump of clay). Lump is obviously a lump of clay. Since there is only one lump of clay on Tuesday, David must be the same lump of clay as Lump. But then, by the relativized version of Leibniz’s Law, David and Lump must share all of the same properties. This, once again, seems false. Lump existed on Monday, but David did not, so there is a property that Lump has and David lacks: having existed on Monday. In response, the relative identity theorist might appeal to another component of Geach’s view. Geach suggests that proper names are always associated with kinds. For example, ‘David’ is associated with the kind statue and ‘Lump’ is associated with the kind lump of clay. Taking a cue from the counterpart theorist (section 3), the relative identity theorist may go on to claim that this association creates opaque contexts when we ascribe modal properties. Take, for example, the following pair of statements:
- Lump existed on Monday.
- David existed on Monday.
The relative identity theorist could say that (1) is true if and only if there was a lump of clay on Monday which is the same lump of clay as Lump. (2), on the other hand, is true just in case there was statue on Monday which is the same statue as David. Given these truth conditions, (1) is true and (2) is false, for there was a lump of clay on Monday (the same lump of clay as Lump), but no statue. More importantly, on this analysis the predicates in (1) and (2) express different properties, in which case the relativized version of Leibniz’s Law has no application. So, one cannot move from (1) and the negation of (2) to the conclusion that Lump and David are distinct lumps of clay.
A second worry for Geach is that it seems as if the relative identity theory cannot solve all of the puzzles with which we began. Take, once again, the Ship of Theseus Puzzle. In that case, we have the original ship of Theseus (A), the museum’s ship (B), and the custodian’s ship (C). The problem is that B seems to be the same ship as A, which seems to be the same ship as C. If the same ship as relation is transitive, we get the absurd conclusion that B is the same ship as C. The relative identity theorist might deny transitivity, of course, but this would give us another reason to suspect that relativized identity relations are not identity relations, for transitivity seems to be a central feature of identity. (For more on this worry, see Gupta 1980.)
A third and final worry for Geach concerns his denial of absolute identity. As many commentators have pointed out, this denial has drastic implications for logic, semantics, and set theory. To take just one example, consider the set theorist’s axiom of extensionality: For any sets A and B, if A and B have the same members, then A is the same set as B. Let A be David’s unit set and let B be Lump’s unit set. Is A the same set as B? The relativist must reject this question as ill-formed. It makes no sense to ask whether x and y are the same members, since this requires a notion of absolute identity (intuitively, ‘member’ does not denote a genuine kind, so ‘same member as’ does not express a relative identity relation). As a result, the relative identity theorist must deny extensionality, which throws set theory into jeopardy. (For a detailed discussion of this and other concerns, see Hawthorne 2004.)
Imagine a debate between two friends over whether or not boats are ships. One party points to a rowboat and says, “That boat is a ship. After all, a ship is a vessel that floats on water and the rowboat is obviously a vessel that floats on water.” The second party demurs: “A ship is a sufficiently large vessel that floats on water and the rowboat is not sufficiently large. So the boat is not a ship.” Clearly, there is something defective about this debate. Note three things in this connection. First, there are two “candidate meanings” for the predicate ‘ship’, namely a vessel that floats on water and a sufficiently large vessel that floats on water. Second, neither of these candidate meanings is more “natural” than the other—unlike ‘water’ or ‘electron’, the predicate ‘ship’ does not correspond to a natural kind in the world. Third, the two parties to the debate agree on all of the “non-ship” facts—in particular, both parties agree that the rowboat is a vessel, that it floats on water, and that it is relatively small in size. Given these points, it is tempting to say that the two parties agree on all of the facts and that their dispute is merely verbal. Note that this conclusion is consistent with the view that one of the parties is actually mistaken. Suppose, for example, that the doctrine of semantic externalism is correct, so that the meaning of our shared terms is determined by the overall pattern of use within our linguistic community (see the entry on externalism about mental content). That pattern of use may determine that one of the candidate meanings—presumably the second—is the actual meaning of ‘ship’ in English. In that case, the first party in the debate is simply mistaken: the rowboat is not a ship. Still, there is a clear sense in which the debate is verbal, for there is a possible language (“English*”) that (a) employs a different, equally natural meaning for the predicate ‘ship’, (b) is adequate for describing all of the facts, and (c) is such that the first party’s statements come out true, relative to that language. Thus, we might say that the real dispute between the two parties is over whether or not English is English*. And that is clearly a verbal dispute.
Some philosophers have suggested that the debate over material constitution is defective in exactly the same way. There is no genuine dispute between Lewis and Unger, for example, over whether or not statues exist. Both parties agree on all of the relevant facts—in particular, both parties agree that there are simples arranged statuewise. And both parties agree that there are two possible languages (“Lewis-English” and “Unger-English”) where the sentence “Statues exist” comes out true in one and false in the other. So the real disagreement between Lewis and Unger is over whether English is Lewis-English or whether it is Unger-English. In other words, the debate is merely verbal. This kind of deflationist view is often associated with Rudolf Carnap (1950), Hilary Putnam (1987, 1994, 2004) and, more recently, Eli Hirsch (2002a, 2002b, 2005). The issues raised by deflationism are extremely complicated; here, we will limit ourselves to a few initial observations. (For a longer introduction to these issues, see Chalmers, Manley, and Wasserman 2009. For an extended defense of deflationism, see Thomasson 2015.)
In the imagined dispute, we know exactly what the disputed term is (‘ship’) and exactly what the relevant candidate meanings are (a vessel that floats on water and a sufficiently large vessel that floats on water). In the actual dispute between Lewis and Unger, matters are not so clear. One might suspect that the disputed term in this case is the predicate ‘statue’, but it turns out to be fairly difficult to specify the relevant candidate meanings. For example, we might say that, in Lewis-English, ‘statue’ simply means a collection of simples arranged statuewise. Whether or not that is a plausible interpretation of what Lewis means depends in part on the meaning of ‘collection’ (for discussion, see Sider 2009, pp. 388–90). In any case, it is even more difficult to specify an appropriate candidate meaning for ‘statue’ in Unger-English. More importantly, even if we are able to specify the relevant candidate meanings, we will not have succeeded in showing that the general dispute between Lewis and Unger is verbal, for the dispute can be brought out without using the predicate ‘statue’ (or any non-logical predicate, for that matter). Consider, for example, a world that contains one-million simples arranged statuewise and nothing else. And consider the numerical sentence (see section 4) which asserts the existence of (at least) one-million and one things. Lewis and Unger will disagree over the truth of that sentence. But that sentence contains only logical vocabulary. Hence, if the two parties are really talking past each other, then they must assign different meanings to one or more of the logical constants.
The most plausible suggestion is that Lewis and Unger assign (or, at least, intend to assign) different meanings to the existential quantifier, ‘∃’ (as well as quantificational phrases like ‘there are’, ‘there is’, and ‘some’). And, indeed, this is where deflationists have focused their attention. Putnam, for example, writes that “[T]he logical primitives themselves, and in particular the notions of object and existence, have a multitude of different uses rather than one absolute ‘meaning’.” (1987, p. 71) This thesis—the thesis that there are many meanings for the existential quantifier that are equally natural and equally adequate for describing all the facts—is often referred to as“the doctrine of quantifier variance” (Hirsch 2002b, Sider 2009). What exactly are the candidate meanings in question? Once again, matters are not so clear. Lewis could, of course, simply interpret Unger to be using a restricted quantifier that ranges only over simples. On that interpretation, Unger speaks truthfully when he asserts “Statues do not exist”, since there are no statues among the simples. The problem with this interpretation is that it seems manifestly implausible, given that Unger will insist that his quantifiers are to be understood as unrestricted. Even more worrying is the question of how Unger is supposed to interpret Lewis. He cannot, for example, say that Lewis is using a less restrictive quantifier, for that would be to say that there are things (that Lewis’s quantifier ranges over) that do not exist (by Unger’s own lights). Unger could, perhaps, take a more holistic approach and interpret Lewis’s assertion of “Statues exist” to mean there are some simples arranged statuewise. More generally, Unger could interpret Lewis by replacing singular quantifiers over composites with plural quantifiers over simples, and by replacing each predicate of composites with an irreducibly plural predicate of simples. Once again, we should expect protest—Lewis will reject the proposed translation and insist that he is using singular quantification when he asserts “Statues exist”.
These initial observations bring out one disanalogy between the ontological dispute and paradigm verbal disputes. In the earlier argument over whether or not boats are ships, the proposed translations are friendly, since the first party will admit that he uses ‘ship’ to mean a vessel that floats on water and the second will grant that he uses ‘ship’ to mean a sufficiently large vessel that floats on water. Given this disambiguation, the dispute will evaporate. The deflationist’s proposals are instead hostile, for neither Lewis nor Unger will accept the deflationist interpretation offered by his opponent. (For further discussion on this point, see Sider 2009, section 5.) This does not mean that the ontologists’ debate is non-verbal, but it does mean that the issues involved here are more complicated than those in paradigm verbal disputes.
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