Ramon Llull (1232–1316) is an amazing figure in the field of philosophy during the Middle Ages. He is currently recognized as the author of Ars Magna, a combining logical system to discover the truth, conceived as an instrument to be used in interfaith dialogue to convert infidels. In the Ars Llull’s theological, metaphysical, and logical conceptions are amply illustrated, and they were developed throughout his more than 200 written works in Catalan, Arabic, and Latin. He is known for being among the first authors to use his vernacular language, Catalan, to communicate his thought.
- 1. Life and his philosophical and religious project
- 2. A universal model to understand reality
- 3. Metaphysics
- 4. Theory of Knowledge
- 5. The Ars
- 5.1 The structure of the Ars
- 5.2 The Figures of the Quaternary Phase and their functioning
- 5.3 The Application of the Ars
- 5.4 Two Variations of the Quaternary Ars
- 5.5 The Ternary Ars
- 5.6 The Alphabet and the Figures of the Ternary Ars
- 5.7 Practicing the Ars
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Life and his philosophical and religious project
Ramon Llull (also called Raymond Lully or Raymond Lull; in Latin, Raimundus or Raymundus Lullus or Lullius) lead an exceptional and extraordinarily fruitful life, unusually long for a medieval man, filled with adventures and guided by his philosophical, religious, and political convictions, which invariably permeated his work. He was born in Majorca in 1232, possibly in 1233. His parents, Ramon Amat Llull and Isabel d’Erill, were members of a bourgeois middle-class family in Barcelona. In 1229 they encouraged and financed, alongside other Catalan merchants, the efforts of King James I of Aragon to conquer the island of Majorca, at that time under Muslim dominion, in exchange for land and privileges. Following the triumph over the Moors, they received lands and moved to the island. Ramon, their only son, was born there only a few years later.
Very little is known about his early life. The main source regarding Llull’s life, the anonymous De vita coaetanea, is a text written in 1311 by a friend of his in Paris. Apparently based on his memories, it states that Llull was a seneschal and major of the palace of King James II during his youth. However, contemporary studies by Dominguez Reboiras and Gayá (2008) have established that the “Llulls of Majorca never held nor were they awarded the social status of nobles” (2008: 21). Ramon Llull must have actually spent the early years of his life as a young bourgeois, having a basic education to meet his needs and dedicating himself to family business. In 1257 he married Blanca Picany, who belonged to another Catalan family settled in Majorca, with whom he had two children, Domènec and Magdalena.
1.1 Conversion and formation
The process through which Ramon Llull was converted to Christianity is narrated in De vita coaetanea I-4: Llull was writing “a song to a lady whom he loved with a foolish love” (and was not his wife) when he saw an apparition of Christ on the Cross. This vision would not be enough for him to fully understand and embrace the calling. Thus, it would be repeated another four times while he continued to attempt to write the aforementioned love song. Finally, the voice of
his conscience told him that they (the apparitions) could only mean that he should abandon the world at once and from then on dedicate himself totally to the service of our Lord Jesus Christ. (De Vita I–4. Translation Anthony Bonner)
The call to faith was accompanied by a decision to dedicate his life to the service of God. That moment is recalled in De vita coaetanea, stating how Llull reflected on the way in which he could serve God and conceived an action plan that outlined three main objectives: in converting unbelievers to Christ, in writing books against the errors of the infidels, and in funding monasteries in which the different languages necessary for this mission could be taught.
The project that Ramon Llull resolved to undertake entailed a greater difficulty that he himself acknowledged: he had none of the knowledge necessary for such an undertaking. Consequently, a fundamental part of his project would be his education in two cultures and languages he did not thoroughly know: Latin and Arabic.
The apparitions and the reflection on his mission are nothing but the beginning of the process of conversion. For three months, according to De vita coaetanea, Llull did not undertake any of his projects.
On Saint Francis’ feast day, observed on October 4, he listened to the bishop as he described the conversion of Saint Francis of Assisi. Impressed by the example set by the saint, Llull decided to sell most of his material possessions, just keeping the bare minimum for the support of his wife and children, and set out on a pilgrimage.
If they ever occurred, the episodes of the apparitions must have taken place between 1263 and 1265, but no testimonies have been found to support this claim. On the other hand, there are documents that show that Llull kept his family life at least another decade, which coincides with the period spent on his formation. However, this process separated him from his family. His wife Blanca would request the legal administration of the family properties due to Llull’s increasingly eremitic life. She was granted her request on May 13, 1276 (Dominguez Reboiras and Gayá 2008: 43)
Little is known about the time following Ramon Llull’s conversion, in which he began a period of intense study and meditation. According to De vita coaetanea, after his pilgrimage, he had decided to travel to Paris to study. Nevertheless, his intentions were not supported either by friends or by relatives and he stayed in Majorca.
The object and means of his studies have been a topic of discussion. For Johnston (1996) it is possible that he studied Latin with private tutors, and he might have attended lectures in the colleges of the mendicant orders established on the island. According to De vita coaetanea, he learned Arabic from a Muslim slave. In any case, Llull does not seem to have received any formal education.
This process of instruction would end with a retreat to dedicate himself to contemplation and study on Puig de Randa (a mountain in Majorca). During this spiritual experience he conceived the method and work, now known as the Ars (Art), with which he would fight “the errors of the infidels” (De Vita I-5). His retirement to Puig de Randa would end with a visit to the Cistercian Abbey La Real, where he would write a first version of the Ars, known as Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem. This learning period would end with a new meditative stay on the mountain for four months until he received a new divine message through a strange priest who blessed him.
1.2 Montpellier and first trip to Paris
Between 1274 and 1275 Ramon Llull was summoned by Prince James II of Majorca to Montpellier. During this first trip to Montpellier, Llull would suggest that James II found a monastery in Miramar, Majorca, whose main objective would be to teach languages, particularly Arabic, to missionaries. The project was approved and the Crown granted the necessary funds to support the monastery, where 13 Franciscan brothers would reside. The foundation of the monastery was confirmed by Pope John XXI in a papal bull from October 17, 1276.
Llull would reach Paris at the end of 1287 and would stay there until the summer of 1289. In spite of the limited information about his visit to Paris, it is known that he frequently visited the Collège de Sorbonne. He established influential friendships with two prominent members of the Sorbonne: Peter of Limoges and Thomas Le Myésier, who would become his most important disciple.
Some references made in De vita point out that his stay in Paris would encourage Llull to revise the structure of this Art, in the light of the difficulties discussed during his public lectures.
1.3 On the way to infidel lands
Llull went back to Montpellier during the summer of 1289. He stayed there until the autumn of 1290. During this stay he publicly presented his comments to the Art and wrote a new, simpler version of this work called Ars inventiva veritatis. When he finished his work in Montpellier, Llull left for Genoa, a city that held great relevance to him, both for his personal relationship with the Spinola family and the events that would later unfold.
In April 1289, the city of Tripoli, in Syria, was taken by the Egyptians, who imprisoned the Latin armies in Acre. The Crusades are nearing their end, and it is a delicate political moment, among others, for the Genoese who had taken part in the Crusades. Even if the defense of Tripoli and Acre were not important priorities for the papacy, Pope Nicholas IV asked the kings of Europe to support the Crusade, which spawned a series of initiatives to support the reconquest of the Holy Land.
Ramon Llull arrived in Rome under these circumstances at the end of 1290, where he writes Liber de passagio, a text preceded by a letter called Quomodo terra sancta recuperari potest, in which Llull took advantage of the political situation to show the relevance of his mission and his Art, linking his work for the first time with the Crusade and the possibility of using military force against the infidels.
This visit to Rome had no beneficial outcome, and in 1291 Llull was back in Genoa, and this time he had the firm intention of traveling to Tunisia to continue his missionary vocation. This trip would be filled with extreme difficulties, mainly due to a profound personal crisis.
This crisis, narrated in great detail in De vita, must have started when he was preparing his trip to Tunisia in the spring of 1292 and reached its most critical point in May 1293 during the celebration of Pentecost. Two significant events must have influenced his mood. Llull had turned 60 years old, and in January 1292 King James II had decided to close the monastery of Miramar. Llull had already made the necessary arrangements for his missionary trip, but he started to consider the possibility of being murdered or incarcerated by the infidels. This situation caused him to be filled with fear. Consequently, he did not embark on this trip. As soon as the ship that would have have taken him to Tunisia set sail without him, Llull, filled with shame, got sick. This illness would last until the feast of Pentecost, in which Llull was taken to the Church of Saint Dominic. While he was at the church, he had a vision in which he was told that “he would be saved in this order” (De vita IV-20). Consequently, Llull resolved to join the Dominican Order at that exact moment but was unable to because the prior was not present at the church. Finally, after a careful process of deliberation and new visions, and considering that his Art had been favorably received by the Franciscan Order, Llull decided to join the Franciscans.
With new found enthusiasm, even though he was still ill and feverish, he embarked on the first available ship to Tunisia, but he was promptly stopped by his friends. A few days later, fully recovered, he boarded a new ship and and set sail. Around September 1293 he arrived in Tunisia and started his mission. His plan was to establish contact and prompt dialogue with the intellectual circles in the city, using the method proposed in his Art to convince them of the error of their ways. The endeavor did not last long, and he was incarcerated. He was expelled from the city and sent to Naples in October 1293.
1.4 Back to Rome and new travels
Ramon Llull left Naples when Pope Celestine V was elected in July 1294, and he traveled to Rome. This was an extraordinary period for his work. During the two years he would spend in Rome he wrote diverse texts about his Art. However, the two most important works in this period were Desconhort, a poem in which he reflected on his life, his plans, his failures, and his hopes; and Arbor Scientiae, an encyclopedia in which he classified knowledge, which would be very appreciated during the Renaissance.
After his stay in Rome, Llull went to Paris, where he would live from August 1298 until July 1299. He wrote 17 texts addressed to the scholars in the arts and theologians, which showed his involvement in the academic and political discussions of the University. After this prolific period, he returns to Majorca but new events will make travel him again.
The invasion of Syria by the Mongolian armies lead by Ghazan Khan in 1299 and his subsequent advance on the Holy Land raised new hopes among the Crusaders. Filled with enthusiasm by this news, Llull decided to travel to Cyprus during the summer of 1301. On his arrival he found out that, a year before, the Mongols had retired once again. His disappointment would not stop him, and he convinced the King of Cyprus to help him convert the Muslim, Nestorian, and Jacobite population of the island. His sermons met with little success, and in 1302 he traveled to Port Ayas, in Armenia, where he made another attempt to preach to the infidels.
Ramon Llull went back to Genoa in May 1303. He would spend the following years between Genoa and Montpellier, and he would write more than 18 texts, the majority of which would be directed towards the application of his Art to various disciplines and topics.
After this relatively quiet period, Llull set out on a new trip to Africa. This time he went to Libya, on his way to Béjaïa. De vita narrates this trip in detail. Llull spent most of the time in prison. Instead of seeking to meet intellectuals, as he did on his first trip to Tunisia, right after disembarkation, he went to the main square and harangued passersby and anyone present at the time. The crowd was infuriated, and Llull was placed under arrest. The authorities questioned and imprisoned him. He would stay there for six months, receiving visits from sages who sought to convert him to Islam. He was later expelled from the city, but his hardships would not end there. His ship sank on the trip back to Genoa, but Llull and another passenger managed to survive by reaching the coast. He would then remain in Pisa, where he would finish texts he had previously began writing, such as Ars generalis ultima.
1.5 Philosophical and political success
Ramon Llull traveled again to Paris on November 1309. This was a different visit, not only due to the increasing acceptance of Llullian thought at the University, but also for his involvement in political activities. Clear proof of this situation was the letter of approval signed by professors in the Faculties of Medicine and Theology after hearing a lecture on his Art on February 1310. In addition, Llull met King Philip IV and was awarded a letter of recommendation by the King. The following year, the chancellor of the University of Paris certified Llullian doctrine to be “in accordance to the Catholic faith”. (Dominguez Reboiras and Gayá 2008: 108)
When Pope Clement V summoned a General Council in Vienna during the summer of 1311, Llull sent a series of requests that defined his religious and political program. Some of the petitions included were the foundation of language schools, the unification of the military orders, funds for a new Crusade, questions regarding the clothing of the priests, the eradication of Averroism, and a program to preach Catholic faith in synagogues and mosques. Some of these petitions were already part of the topics to be discussed and were addressed during the Council. The most important of his requests was the decision to found and promote Hebrew, Arabic, and Chaldean language schools, which was one of the main objectives of the Llullian project. Regarding the unification of the military orders, the Council seemed to acknowledge Llull’s proposal and used it to discuss the fate of the Templars, a Christian military order which would be formally dissolved after the Council.
1.6 The last trip
By 1313 relations between Tunisia and Sicily had radically changed. Frederick III, King of Sicily, signed a treaty with Tunisia to stop piracy. Taking advantage of this treaty, he undertook a project to promote catechesis, naturally joined by Ramon Llull. He traveled to Sicily during the summer of 1313. Shortly afterwards, he traveled to Tunisia, with the approval of Frederick III and the support of James II of Aragon, who translated some of Llull’s work from Catalan to Latin. After this last trip to African lands, Llull went back to Majorca. He passed away in this island, at the age of 84, after March 1316.
2. A universal model to understand reality
Ramon Llull’s philosophy is not easily situated in the context of the 13th century. Some authors such as Libera (1991: 135), conceptualize it as part of a movement whose main objective was to “unprofessionalize” (dèprofessionnalisation) philosophy. While Johnston (1996) emphasizes the vernacular character of Llull’s thought, aimed at promoting popular instruction and not only debates in universities, Pereira (2012) highlights that the originality of his thought lies not in the use of the vernacular, but rather in the way in which he presents previously disseminated ideas as newly founded, what ultimately granted the recognition from his peers.
However, the general consensus is that his philosophy is separated from the novelties proposed by scholasticism and Aristotelianism. His thought is based on the widely spread ideas of philosophers such as Saint Augustine, Dionysius the Areopagite, Saint Anselm, Hugh of Saint Victor, and Saint Bonaventure. The main feature of Llull’s philosophy is its unifying character. Philosophy, theology, and mysticism are not treated as separate disciplines in his work. Rather, they are different aspects of the same process of knowledge. Therefore, his philosophical ideas are generated according to theological principles and with the intention of elevating the soul to its contact with God.
With this purpose in mind, Llull aims to conceive a universal model to understand reality. As Bordoy (2012) points out, on the one hand, this model would allow us to know God in his existence and action, and on the other hand, it would acknowledge the rest of creation as generated by the divinity. These ideas would allow the writing of the Ars, a book that would serve as a method to reach truth for any Jewish, Catholic, or Muslim scholar. Its ultimate purpose, as Rubio (2008a) argues, would be to convert infidels through the necessary reasons stated throughout the text.
For Ramon Llull, God necessarily exists, and he is the beginning of all existing things. However, under the influence of the negative theology proposed by Dionysius the Areopagite, Llull considers God to be incomprehensible due to the limitations of human nature to understand Him. This inability establishes an initial difficulty with general knowledge, for there would be no means to access the ultimate source of existence, truth, and knowledge, according to Llull’s ideas.
The means by which this difficulty is solved, according to Llull, is to recognize the cognitive value of the predicates that describe the positive qualities of the things created by God as a reflection of the divine qualities, thus serving as a way to know God by his attributes.
When we talk about the goodness or the greatness of something, we express a quality in things that, for Llull, corresponds to a divine attribute as well. These attributes are called Dignities, although they are sometimes referred to as “reasons” or “virtues”. Llull defines “Dignity” in Gayá’s (2008: 466) words as “God’s perfection, or attributes that in God, and only in God, reach their most perfect realization”.
Dignities are varied in number throughout Llull’s work. Among them we find infinity (infinitas), eternity (aeternitas), unity (unitas), wisdom (sapientia), which are common to the Christian tradition, as well as others such as magnitude (magnitudo), virtue (virtus), mercy (misericordia), or simplicity (simplicitas), which correspond to attributes that we recognize in ourselves (quoad nos) or in relation to other creatures. These attributes are, according to Mayer (2016), the means through which men can perceive the work of God in creation so that they can then project it onto divinity.
These “Dignities” designate divine properties and are, thus, the starting point for Llull’s thought, and at the same time, his ultimate object of reflection. We find them enunciated in the different versions of the Ars in “Figure A”.
3.1 The principles
Goodness is that whereby good does good.
That is how Ramon Llull defines the first principle in his Ars brevis 3–1. The principles are axioms that Ramon Llull will formulate based on the Dignities. He defines them as principles of existence and action (principia existendi et agendi). As principles of existence, they are abstract and allude to the Dignities. As principles of action, they are used to apply the Ars to the knowledge of particular sciences, such as law, navigation, and astrology, among others. The principles can be absolute, if they are taken by themselves, or relative, if they are applied to a particular subject (e.g., Peter is great). Llull explains in Ars Brevis this quality of the principles as
a ladder for ascending and descending; as, for instance, descending from a completely general principle to one neither completely general nor completely particular, and from a principle neither completely general nor completely particular to one that is completely particular. (Ars Brevis 2-I. Translation Yanis Dambergs)
3.2 Order, Participation, Influence
During his process of formation, Ramon Llull develops a metaphysics of similarity, under the probable influence of Saint Bonaventure. This metaphysics dominates his first texts and his first versions of the Ars. It is based on the idea that creation has a representative function: it is a mirror (Mayer 2016) or a net of “traces” (Rubio 2008b: 325) in which divine perfection is reflected.
In Llull’s metaphysics, the existence of things is explained based on the “similarity” that their nature shares with other beings, and the way in which this resemblance “participates” in the nature of other superior beings like Principles or Dignities. The “similarity” expresses a relationship of correspondence among beings, which is also designated “signification” by Llull, as it is a relationship by which God is manifest in creation. “In the perfection of the created goodness”—wrote Llull in Libre dels proverbis de Ramon LXXXI—“the perfection of the uncreated goodness is signified”.
Signification does not only describe the relationship between creation and divinity. In addition, it describes the relationship among the different degrees of existence. Llull shares the theory—commonly used in Christian, Jewish, and Arab cultures—of a ladder of beings. It is organized based on the existence of an order—a structure that organizes things according to a purpose—which results in a hierarchy defined by similarity or difference in each degree of being ascending or descending in the ladder. In Llull’s metaphysics, these degrees are as follows: (1) Elementative, which corresponds to the four elements; (2) Vegetative, which encompasses beings capable of nutrition, growth, and reproduction; (3) Sensitive, which includes beings who are able to have sensory perception; (4) Imaginative, which includes beings who are capable of internally reproducing what they have perceived; (5) Man, as a rational being, and at the same time, participant of both the spiritual and the material field; (6) Heaven, which includes the celestial spheres; (7) Angels, pure spirits without a body; and finally (8) God, the highest step of the ladder.
All beings, except God, are dependent, for the ultimate signification of creation is given by the divinity, who expresses itself through creation. An important feature of this organization of creation is that, according to Llull, regardless of the step in the ladder in which a being is found, it is possible to ascend or descend through it due to the similarity that interconnects all the steps. This network of significations given by the similarities—as shown in the case of the principles—shows a ladder of knowledge through which both ascent and descent are possible, through sensory data to the intellectual understanding of spiritual reality, and inversely.
One of the innovations introduced by Llull in the ladder of beings is the category he calls instrumentality or artifice, which is introduced after he begins the reformulation of the Ars in 1290. It encompasses instrumental or artificial beings, which are a result of the instrumental or artificial power or faculty of man. Within the ladder, they would be found below the Elementative step.
3.3 Theory of the Correlatives
One of the most original aspects of Llull’s philosophy is the theory of the correlatives, which does not follow the analogic logic found in the first formulations of the Ars, but a logic whose foundations are the ontological principles that explain the concatenation between beings based on their own nature.
According to the theory of the correlatives, the nature of a being is something defined by its activity. Therefore, being and activity are inseparable and identified (esse and agere). Consequently, according to the theory of the correlatives, the nature of a being is defined based on (a) its activity, that which makes it active and allows it to execute different intrinsic and extrinsic actions; (b) its passion, that which affects the being either intrinsically by itself or extrinsically by another; and (c) its action, that which makes it being in act and being in constant movement. This structure, which will receive diverse formulations throughout his work, namely matter/form/conjunction, beginning/middle/end, or doer/done/means (Gayá 2008; Bonner 2007), is presented in the book Liber de ascensu et descensu intellectus as follows: every being has a natural virtue, which can be “active”, “passive”, and “connective”. These virtues are the correlatives that Llull linguistically distinguishes using suffixes. For the active nature he uses -tivus (e.g., bonificativus), for the passive, -bilis (bonificabilis), and for the connective, -are (bonificare).
The nature of each being is constituted, intrinsically, by its correlatives, which are, for example, in the case of man, “homificativus”, “homificabilis”, and “homificare”. Through the actions carried out by these correlatives, man must actualize the potentiality of his act. However, as every being is formed by certain faculties, the activity, the passivity, and the connectivity of man’s nature must be exercised through each one of these faculties. Thus, to see, he will use the vision formed by its correlatives (which will be explained in the following sections), and so on. When he uses each one of these correlatives, he must apply the dynamism of the correlatives of the principles such as “bonitas” or “magnitudo”, by which he is also constituted, to reflect the divinity of the dignities in his action.
The correlatives form, therefore, a complex structure that is reproduced throughout the ladder and in each one of the beings, from God to a stone, to ontologically explain the continuity among all beings. In each one of them, the chain of the whole of creation is reproduced.
The correlatives are also distinguished in God because, for Llull, activity is needed for nature, and there could only be divine nature if it has an activity. Llull identifies the divine correlatives in their intrinsic action through the Trinity, namely the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit, while their extrinsic action, through the Dignities, will result in creation.
4. Theory of Knowledge
Homo est animal homificans / Man is a manifying animal.
In this definition of man in the Ars Brevis 9-IV, Ramon Llull identifies human nature with its activity, with its dynamic principle as López Alcaide (2016) explains. Homificans is produced through the realization of the three main activities of the human soul, which for Llull are knowing, remembering, and loving, which correspond to the three superior faculties of the soul: understanding, memory, and will.
In Liber de homine, Llull acknowledges that man must know what man is, and as he is able to know himself, he will be able to know other men and, naturally, God as well. However, the knowledge that man can reach is different from the rest of the beings. Animals, for example, can only know through senses and imagination, whereas angels can only intellectually know through themselves. As man is constituted by a soul and a body, he can know through the senses but is not limited by them. He is capable of going up the ladder and understanding other beings through the principles; additionally, he can also go down the ladder and understand the principles through beings.
The ascent and descent describe the two paths the soul can traverse to obtain knowledge of the world. They are different but supplementary ways. The ascent starts with corporeal objects, whose sensible species (form or similarity) are captured by the external senses and transformed into internal species by the imagination; then, the higher faculties of the soul in the intellect transform them into knowledge of exterior beings. The descent is the opposite path, from the universal to the particular. It takes the principles as starting points through which the human soul can recognize these principles—goodness, truth, etc.—in particular beings.
4.1 The Sixth Sense
Llull explains how the senses function perceptually and cognitively based on the theory of the correlatives. Each one of the five traditional senses has its three correlatives. Following the example proposed by Romano and de la Cruz (2008: 380), the eye functions intrinsically according to “Visituus”, “Visibilis”, and “Videre”, whereas “Visibilitas” is found in objects, that is, its visible species. Since the act of seeing is similar to the act of being seen, they are connected in such a way that the extrinsically visible species can be perceived and transformed in the intrinsically visible species through the activity of the mind, by the imagination, which is the faculty that completes the process of abstraction.
Llull presents an original contribution he designates as Affatus, which operates in the same way as the five traditional senses. The Affatus is defined as the potentiality by which an animal manifests its conceptions through its voice to another animal. This is the means, as he writes in the Libre dels proverbis de Ramon CCLXII, through which man communicates with the rational soul more than with any other sense, by which the soul produces sound, and, in the case of man, communicates science. It is the image of understanding, it allows communication with God, and it is how the mechanical arts are expressed.
All the senses have the same purpose as the affatus: to realize the activity of man, the homificans, through the connection of the internal and external species in order to enable man to know, remember, love, and live. Consequently, the senses are necessary for living, but particularly the lowest kind, such as touch, taste, and smell, are especially important for distinguishing pleasure from pain. The superior senses, such as hearing, sight, and affatus, not only allow man to live, but they also activate his highest faculties and they bring man closer to God. Hearing is necessary to know and remember, especially God’s name; sight, to understand, remember, and love, particularly God; and affatus, to communicate knowledge and to talk to God.
4.2 Analogic Knowledge
Taken as a whole, the process of knowledge in Llull includes several steps that, even if they have a sequence of ascent and descent, form a circle which can be traversed in both directions. This process would begin, as was previously stated, with self-knowledge. Initially man would use his intellect to understand his own dynamism (Petit 2004), and in that process he will find the principles whose similarities—goodness, greatness, etc.—he will look for in the sensible things as he descends.
From this descending move, an ascending one will follow, through which the intrinsic species are deduced from the extrinsic species. The process would end in a final intellectual move that López Alcaide (2015) describes as horizontal, in which the intellect, by considering the goodness of the senses, will consider the goodness of the intellect itself, thus reaching goodness in itself.
Through this process of concatenating the similarities of external objects with the internal principles of understanding, man realizes what the structure of creation is, as well as its order, the mutual participation and influence among beings, and among the principles and the dignities.
In this sense, knowledge in Llull consists of perceiving and understanding the meanings revealed by the objects found in the divine attributes. As Petit (2004: 219) observes, according to Llull, knowing “is the result not only of seeing, feeling or touching, but also contemplating”.
4.3 Doctrine of the Transcendent Points
During his stay in Paris between 1297 and 1299, Llull participated in the discussion against Averroism, specifically against “the theory of double truth”. In the context of this dispute, he developed what is known as the doctrine of the transcendent points, which tries to solve the problem of the discontinuities in the process of acquiring knowledge and ultimately show that faith and knowledge do not differ.
Llull’s starting point is to identify that truth is found above man’s own capabilities in two senses. First, the knowledge that man gets from the world, through his sensitive faculties, is insufficient to build an accurate truth of the world. Consequently, man must overcome this initial level. It is then when, according to Llull, happens the transcendental move that encourages man to look for the objects that are characteristic of his superior faculties, that is, the intelligible things, allowing him to reach the knowledge that science and philosophy can offer. But this knowledge is also limited and insufficient. Thus, he must leap forward to transcend and surpass himself. His purpose will be to reach the divine objects, the dignities, recognizing in them, in a superlative way, what were mere human concepts before. This is proper theological knowledge.
Even if the main function of the doctrine of the transcendent points is fundamentally polemical, it is associated with two central elements in Llull’s logic. The first one is the formulation of the existence of three types of objects of knowledge, sensitive, intellective, and divine, which correspond to the three degrees of the adjective in language: positive, comparative, and superlative. In this way, it would be related to the three ways of logical demonstration that, according to Rubio (2008a), Llull used in the Ars. The first two are the propter quid and quia proofs from Aristotelian logic: (1) when the effect is proven by its cause (e.g., When the sun is shining, it must be daytime); (2) when the cause is proven by its effect (e.g., It is daytime; therefore, the sun must be shining). The third demonstration is designated by Llull as argumentum per aequiparantiam or by equivalence, according to which the demonstration is produced when a thing is equal to another. For example, God cannot sin because his power is equal to his will, and by his will he does not want to sin.
5. The Ars
The Ars, or to be more precise, the development through numerous texts of a combining logical system to reveal the truth, is the most important and original product of Ramon Llull’s philosophy, and the main core of his work.
Its development is divided into two great phases. The first one is called the Quaternary Phase, for it is organized based on the model of the four elements which form the base of the majority of the analogies used by Llull. The Quaternary Phase comprises two main texts: the Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem, written by Llull following the revelation of the Art at the Puig de Randa Mount in 1274, and the Ars demonstrativa in 1283, in addition to other texts that comment or explain the Ars. The second phase is known as Ternary Period, for it follows the structure of a trinity. It began with the criticism experienced in Paris with the Ars inventiva veritatis (1290), followed by the modification of the Tabula generalis (1293–4), and it concludes with the Ars generalis ultima (1305–8) and its abbreviated version, which incidentally had the most comments and discussions during the Renaissance, the Ars brevis of 1308.
The Ars was conceived by Ramon Llull as an instrument to correct the mistakes of the infidels. In that way, it was to be a tool to aid the missionaries’ work. As a result, Llull did not structure this work based on the main Christian dogmas, the Trinity and the Incarnation, but on the common principles to the three religions of the book. As Rubio (2008a: 245) argues, “the secret of the Art consists of its demonstrating that the accepted world view implies the Christian view of God”. The most recent studies on the Ars (Ruiz Simón 1998; Rubio 2008a; Jaulent 2010) show that it addresses the criticism made by Llull to Scholastic logic. This criticism has two great stages: on the one hand, the insufficiency of the demonstration by syllogisms—the basis of all Scholastic science—to reveal new truths, because it only explicitly states the relationship between known facts and evident principles (Ruiz Simón 1998), thus relegating dialectics (or ars inveniendi), which consists of finding arguments and counterarguments based on some loci or “places”, to the domain of opinion. On the other hand, this criticism (Jaulent 2010) addresses the fact that demonstration by syllogisms only works through second intentions, that is, it describes relationships within logical propositions and not according to objects in reality, which are conceptualized as first intentions.
Llull’s Ars would seek to form a logic system different to the scholastic one, through which novel truths that describe not only logical relationships, but also metaphysical relationships, can be discovered. According to Ruiz Simón (1998) and Bonner (2007), the Ars is defined by Llull based on four adjectives: compendioso and inventivo, like its first version; demostrativo, as in the second one; and general, in the final phase: (1) compendioso, for it is from some limited principles that an unlimited number of arguments can be found; (2) inventivo, because, through its combining mechanism, it makes it possible to find those arguments; (3) demostrativo, because it allows one to reach necessary conclusions; (4) and general, because it encompasses both real and logical objects, and it is thus applicable to any topic.
Therefore, the Ars is a system to access any logical or metaphysical truth, a means to find novel arguments, an instrument to access all general and particular knowledge, and a tool for the missionary that seeks to refute the arguments of the infidels.
5.1 The structure of the Ars
The Ars is structured to answer questions, which are invariably found in the final sections of the different versions of the Ars. These answers are usually a combination of terms constituted by using the elements that form the Ars: terms, figures, and alphabet.
The terms are the basic concepts of the Ars. For example, the Dignities, such as Goodness, Beauty, Greatness, Eternity; or the principles, such as Difference, Concordance, Contrariety, etc.
The figures are graphical forms of different types, such as circles, tables, and triangles, which form the combinations of both the internal elements and their combinations with other figures.
Finally, the alphabet is used, above all, in the Ternary Period, and it is formed by nine letters whose meaning is not fixed, as it is understood according to the use of the figures and their combinations.
5.2 The Figures of the Quaternary Phase and their functioning
Figure A. Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem XV Century. Palma, BP, 1031. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
The first figure of the Ars is Figure A, composed by 16 terms that correspond to the Dignities: Goodness, Wisdom, Glory, Simplicity, Greatness, Will, Perfection, Nobility, Eternity, Virtue, Justice, Mercy, Power, Truth, Generosity, Dominion.
Two cases should be noted in this figure: The use of the alphabet—the letters that surround the figure from “b” to “r”, whose function is to refer to the terms inside of the figure in a simplified way, although they are not found in all the versions of the Ars—and the network of lines that join each term within the figure with all the remaining ones, which are not shown in all the versions either. These lines illustrate the combinations found within this figure. In this case, each one of the 16 terms would have 15 combinations with the remaining terms. This combining possibility is supported by the fact that each Dignity may be converted into another, by the principle of the unity of all divine attributes. Moreover, it reflects the principle of the argument of equivalence, which, as was already explained, is one of the demonstrative forms of the Ars.
Each one of these combinations would form a compartment, and its set, a table with all the possible combinations (see the Second Figure of A).
The Second Figure of A. Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem XV Century. Palma, BP, 1031. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
The second figure of the Ars is called Figure S, where the rational soul is represented, following St. Augustine, as formed by Memory, Intellect, and Will. The representation is, however, not according to the faculties, but to their acts and their combinations.
The acts of the faculties of the soul are found in the compartments of Figure S: the intellect, understanding and not understanding; the memory, remembering and forgetting; the will, loving, hating, and loving and hating. In addition, the compartments contain combinations of letters, corresponding to the ones found in the internal circle, that refer to the combined acts of the faculties. Therefore, d. h. m. refers to, for example, the combined acts of the will that loves, the will that hates, the will that loves and hates. b. c. d. refers to the combined acts of the memory that remembers, the intellect that understands, the will that loves. Llull groups these combinations in four species named E, I, N, R, which are identified by the letter of the compartment where the combination of the acts of the faculties is found, and which forms one of the squares drawn within the circle. Therefore, the species E identifies the combination b. c. d. The I, the combination f. g. h.; the N, the combination k. l. m.; and finally, the R, the combination of these combinations, o. p. q.
Figure S. Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem XV Century. Palma, BP, 1031. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
The species not only organize certain acts of the faculties of the soul. Additionally, they also represent certain conducts. Thus, species E, for example, which is formed by the intellect that understands, the memory that remembers, and the will that loves, corresponds to the attitude of someone who affirms a proposition with arguments. I, formed by the intellect that understands, the memory that remembers, and the will that hates, represents the attitude of someone that denies a proposition with arguments.
Species N, where intellect and memory fail to understand and remember, thus confirming or denying something, represents supposition, a belief that is not sustained either by arguments or by reasons.
Finally, R, formed by the combination of all the aforementioned options, represents doubt.
The use of the letters in this case has a distinctive function. F and B, for example, have the same meaning: the intellect that understands, but its sense varies according to the relationships found in the species E and I. Consequently, the use of this letter allows one to emphasize this structural sense above the meaning of the words (Bonner 2007.
Figure S can be combined with the rest of the figures of the Ars. As a result, it is used to build solutions to the questions that are formulated in the final sections of the Ars.
5.2.1 Figure T
Figure T is crucial because it is used to build solutions through its combination with other figures. It is formed by three circles connected by triangles of different colors. The triangles connect three concepts (i.e., Difference, Concordance, Contrariety), with three species in each one of the edges that form the circles (i.e., sensual and sensual, sensual and intellectual, intellectual and intellectual).
- Blue Triangle: God (unity, essence, and dignities); Creature (sensual, intellectual, and animal); Operation (intellectual, natural, and artificial)
- Green Triangle: Difference (between sensual and sensual, sensual and intellectual, intellectual and intellectual); Concordance (between sensual and sensual, sensual and intellectual, intellectual and intellectual); Contrariety (between sensual and sensual, sensual and intellectual, intellectual and intellectual)
- Red Triangle: Beginning (time, quantity, or cause); Middle (extremities, measurement, or conjunction); End (final cause, termination, or privation)
- Yellow Triangle: Majority (between substance and substance, substance and accident, accident and accident); Equality (between substance and substance, substance and accident, accident and accident); Minority (between substance and substance, substance and accident, accident and accident)
- Black Triangle: Affirmation (doubt to being, to non-being, or to possible and impossible); Doubt (doubt to being, to non-being, or to possible and impossible); Negation (doubt to being, to non-being, or to possible and impossible)
Figure T. Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem XV Century. Palma, BP, 1031. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
5.2.2 Figure V
Figure V is simpler and refers to the virtues and vices, including seven of each. In some representations, virtues are red and vices are blue, and both are interconnected with each other by lines.
Figure V. Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem XV Century. Palma, BP, 1031. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
5.2.3 Figures X, Y and Z
Figure X, or “Figure of Opposites” or “Figure of contraries and concordances”, is formed by different oppositions: Predestination/Free Will; Being/Privation; Perfection/Defect; Merit/Blame; Supposition/Demonstration; etc. As in Figure A, the lines join all terms with each other. However, as Llull himself explains, these connections are at times contradictory and at times in concordance, for with this figure Llull represents the problem that certain oppositions—namely predestination and freedom—pose for man.
Figure X. Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem XV Century. Palma, BP, 1031. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
Finally, Figures Y and Z are formed by only one concept: Truth Y and Falsehood Z. The Ars leads to these two directions, represented by the two concepts: towards the definition of the truth or falsehood of certain propositions.
Figure Y and Figure Z. Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem XV Century. Palma, BP, 1031. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
5.3 The Application of the Ars
Once the figures and terms within have been defined, Llull proceeds to show how they are combined. A substantial part of the several versions of the Ars is to show how the relationships between the figures are useful to build a specific argument or to solve a certain matter. Llull uses the word enter (intra) to express the way in which a figure is related to another, occasionally using for this purpose another figure, usually figure T. Thus, in the Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem, for example, he uses figures A S T V to explain which are the species contrary to the vices. Consequently, he explains that if X (the human soul), with the species E I N enters T in V (figure of vices and sins), it is because with species E it understands (b), remembers (c), and loves (d) abstinence, whereas by I it understands (g), remembers (f), and hates (h) Gluttony. I forms patience when b c d are in abstinence, for it is transformed. When the soul enters N (it does not understand, does not remember, loves and hates) in A (God), Perfection and Justice (the compartment [Perfection, Justice]) strengthens E I with a greater concordance through the red triangle (equality).
This example allows us to follow Llull’s construction of this argument, based on the combination of the different figures. Therefore, it is an example of a possible combination and a valid philosophical proposition for Llull. If we follow the example, Llull uses the combination of the figures to build the argument through which it is explained how the soul transforms the negation of the vices into virtues, when it assumes perfection and justice in God.
Llull does not exhaust all the possible combinations in the different versions of the Ars. He presents those that are relevant for the construction of arguments to confront, first and foremost, the arguments offered by the infidels, by affirming doctrinal principles of Christianity. Thus, the possibility remains open for the artist, that is, whoever uses the Ars, to find new combinations and new arguments to be applied in other contexts.
5.4 Two Variations of the Quaternary Ars
In Ars demostrativa (1283), Llull introduces two important variations. The first is the inclusion of the Elemental Figure, which in the first version of the Ars was just a figure that supported Figure T. The function of this figure, as Bonner (2007) explained, is an analogical substitute of the table of oppositions to emphasize two aspects: the proper and appropriated qualities, and their concordant and contrary.
Figura Elementalis. Ars demostrativa. Beati Raymundi Lulli Opera, ed. Ivo Salzinger i Franz Philipp Wolff, III (Magúncia: Häffner, 1722. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
Nevertheless, the introduction of the Demonstrative Figure in Ars demostrativa is particularly meaningful, for it synthesizes the other figures and makes their relationship dynamic. The Demonstrative Figure is formed by six circles, and it includes a mechanism that allows the circles to rotate. At the center, Llull places a triangle, as those found in Figure T. The first two circles correspond to the Elemental Figure, the following two, with seven letters, represent Figures A, S, T, V, X, Y, Z. The last two circles have the letters B–R that are the terms of Figure S, but Figures A, T, V, X as well, and other two figures, the Principles of Theology and the Principles of Philosophy, which are introduced when the operation of the Art is extended to both fields.
The importance of the Demonstrative Figure resides in its being a step towards the universalization of the Ars, for it initiates a process of greater abstraction of the principles. Even though the terms used in the original figures are kept, they, as well as the figures themselves, have been substituted for letters. At the same time, it is a figure that rotates, which evidently shows the combining character of the Ars. Finally, it opens up the Ars beyond its own principles, to be used in other fields, such as theology, philosophy, and law.
5.5 The Ternary Ars
After his first visit to Paris and the criticism that ensued, in 1290 Llull starts to make profound changes that will lead him to reformulate the Ars. The Ars generalis ultima, written between 1305 and 1308, and the Ars brevis, from 1308, establish the most accomplished formulations of this new version of Llull’s tool. The changes he introduced to the Ars aim to simplify its structure and its function through a greater abstraction of its figures and a reduction of its elements.
A general overview of these changes include the reduction of the seven basic figures—A, S, T, V, X, Y, Z—in the first version, to only four. Particularly remarkable is the disappearance of Figure S, an essential element in the first version, as well as that of figures V, X, Y and Z. In the case of V, its terms will be found in other sections of the text. The Elemental Figure and the Demonstrative Figure, incorporated in the Ars demostrandi, are removed as well. The name of the figures is changed. Instead of using letters, they are now designated First, Second, Third, and Fourth. In all of them, the terms shown in the first versions are substituted by letters, and the meanings of these letters, in each one of the figures, are found in an “alphabet”. In addition, only 9 out of the 16 terms contained in them remain, for the new base of the formulation of the Ars is a ternary model, and not a quaternary one.
5.6 The Alphabet and the Figures of the Ternary Ars
The alphabet is a central element in the ternary formulation of the Ars. It is formed by nine letters, B, C, D, E, F, G, H, I, K, that using the figures, will be organized to form propositions and arguments, formulate and solve questions. Each letter has six terms associated with it:
|F.||wisdom||middle||how much?||imagination||faith||sloth (acedia)|
|K.||glory||minority||how and with what?||instruments||compassion||inconstancy|
The first of these terms refers to positive attributes that are applicable to all the scale of beings. The second corresponds to the definition of a relationship between entities (it is a reformulation of the former Figure T). The third term corresponds to the Rules and the Questions, and it constitutes the most important tool for research within this model, for they will be used to formulate problems and their solutions. The last three terms correspond to (a) the subjects addressed by the Ars, (b) virtues, and (c) vices. The figures will be used to visually represent the relationships between the different terms in a similar way to the previous formulation of the Ars. They are 54 principles in total, which constitute the basis of the whole system and whose relationships are established through the figures.
5.6.1 First Figure
The First Figure is formed by a sole circle of nine elements, whose letters correspond to the terms of the first meaning of the alphabet.
First Figure. Ars brevis XVIII Century. Palma de Mallorca BP MS998. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
5.6.2 The Second Figure
The Second Figure is formed by three concentric circles connected by three triangles, similarly to the way Figure T was shown in the first version of the Art. In this case, only one of the triangles was lost. In the edges of the triangles the terms of the second meaning of the alphabet are found, each one of them unfolded in three species. Thus, for example: the first triangle deals with difference, concordance, and contrariety (B, C, D). Each one of these concepts has three species: sense and sense, sense and intellect, intellect and intellect. The second triangle, beginning, middle, end (E, F, G) has different species in each one of the edges. The species of beginning are cause, quantity, and time. In Ars brevis 2-II, Llull explains the following
cause means the efficient, material, formal and final causes. Quantity and time signify the other predicates and whatever can be reduced to them.
Bonner (2007) has argued that in this section Llull introduces the Aristotelian causes and categories, which entails the adoption of the terminology and concepts of this logic into his system. The middle has, at the same time, three species that will be formed by the middle between subject and predicate (e.g., Man is an animal—the physical life), the middle between agent and patient (Love, in the relationship between loved and lover), and the middle between extremes (e.g., between two points). The edges of the last minor triangle, minor, equal, major (H, I, K) share the same three species: accident and accident, substance and accident, substance and substance.
Second Figure. Ars brevis XVIII Century. Palma de Mallorca BP MS998. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
5.6.3 The Third and Fourth Figure
The Third and Fourth Figure of the new formulation of the Art have a similar function. The third is a square in which the binary combinations are represented, whereas the fourth is a representation of the ternary combinations inside the Art. The latter is formed by three concentric circles, and Llull explains that it must be rotated to form the different combinations. That is, if the starting point of an initial combination is BCB, the one that will follow is CCB, building the first nine ternary combinations accordingly. The circles are, therefore, rotated to the next alignment, which is BDB, and the process continues.
Third Figure. Ars brevis XVIII Century. Palma de Mallorca BP MS998. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
Fourth Figure. Ars brevis XVIII Century. Palma de Mallorca BP MS998. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
Unlike the two first figures, whose letters refer to the terms of the first and second signification given in the alphabet, in the Third and Fourth Figures the letters can be substituted by any of the six meanings presented in the alphabet. For example, the combination BC can mean “goodness is great”—the terms are taken from the first meaning of the alphabet—but it can also mean “difference is great”, when the first term is taken from the second meaning, and the second term is taken from the first meaning. Likewise, its sense can be “goodness is concordant”, when the first term is taken from the first meaning, and the second term is taken from the second meaning. Some authors use capital letters when the first sense is used and lowercase letters when the second sense is used to facilitate the understanding and use of the Art. Thus, the given examples could be expressed as BC, bC, Bc.
Llull introduces a table, originated from the Fourth Figure, in which all the combinations of this figure are found.
Table of the Fourth Figure (fragment). Ars brevis XVIII Century. Palma de Mallorca BP MS998. Digital version Biblioteca Virtual del Patrimonio Bibliográfico. Spain. Ministerio de Educación, Cultura y Deporte.
In this table, the letter T is introduced with a syntactic function to state what terms are taken from the first meaning and which are taken from the second. The rule is that the letters found before letter T use the first of the meanings of the alphabet, and the ones found after, the second.
5.7 Practicing the Ars
Llull uses the term “evacuate” to illustrate how all the senses of each one of the combinations are extracted, using the intellect as agent. The evacuation starts “by making statements, then we interchange subjects with predicates, and then put questions” (The Ars generalis ultima 6–1. Translation Yanis Dambergs) That is, statements are formed using a term from the first meaning of the alphabet (e.g., B, C: goodness is great); then another one is formed by using the first and second meaning of the alphabet (e.g., b, B: difference is good), and then the subject and the predicate are inverted (e.g., B, b: goodness is different). There are 12 meanings in total for each combination of letters. The example for BC is:
|B||C||goodness is great||b||B||difference is good|
|B||b||goodness is different||b||C||difference is great|
|B||c||goodness is concordant||b||c||difference is concordant|
|C||B||greatness is good||c||B||concordance is good|
|C||b||greatness is different||c||C||concordance is great|
|C||c||greatness is concordant||c||b||concordance is different|
Afterwards, the corresponding questions to the third meaning of the letters according to the alphabet are introduced. In the case of B and C, it would be whether and what. Thus, based on the affirmations, the example would be: “Goodness is great”, “Whether goodness is great?”, and “What is great goodness?” This process is applied to the 12 affirmations, thus obtaining a total of 36 possible meanings for the combination BC. This procedure must be followed with all the combinations found in the Third Figure.
5.7.1 The Definitions and the Rules
The definitions and rules offered by Llull as part of the Ars must be used to complete the evacuation and make sense of all 36 possible combinations. There are 18 definitions: nine of them correspond to the first meaning of the alphabet, and the other nine, to the second meaning. The first five, for example, state that:
|B.||Goodness is that whereby good does good.|
|C.||Greatness is that through which goodness, duration etc. are great.|
|D.||Duration is that through which goodness, greatness etc. are lasting.|
|E.||Power is that through which goodness, greatness etc. can exist and act.|
|F.||Wisdom is a property by which the wise understand.|
Bonner (2007) has noted that a distinctive feature of the definitions proposed by Llull is that they do not follow the Aristotelian model. On the contrary, they define the subject based on his activity, which allows the application of the definition of greatness, for example, to any of the beings in the ladder and not exclusively to God. That is precisely what he would do to complete the evacuation of the Third Figure, as will be explained later.
The rules correspond to the third of the meanings given to the alphabet. Each one of these questions has, at the same time, species that will be useful to establish the type of answer that is sought or the nature of the question that wishes to be formulated. For example, the first, “Whether?”, has three species, namely doubt, affirmation, and negation. The second, “What?”, has four species: the first defines the subject, the second defines the correlatives, the third asks what a certain thing is in another thing (e.g., “What is the intellect in other things?”), and the fourth asks what a certain thing does or has in another thing (e.g., “What does the intellect have in other things?”).
To finalize the evacuation of the third figure, the intellect has to build the meanings with these tools, following the guide offered by the definitions and the rules. For example, in the case of the first combination BC, “goodness is great”, following rule C, the question is formulated as “Is goodness great?” Its evacuation would follow the application of the first species of Rule C, to define the predicate: “Greatness is a being on account of which goodness is great.” Then, the second species of Rule C, by which the subject is defined by its correlative, would be: “Goodness is great because it has its essential bonifier, bonifiable, and bonifying”. Consequently, following the fourth species in Rule C (What does goodness have in greatness?), goodness would have in greatness its “natural repose”. Finally, the third species of Rule C (What is goodness in greatness?),
it is in difference and concordance by definition as it differentiates and merges its coessential correlatives within its genus and essence from which great moral goodness arises. (The Ars generalis ultima 6–1. Translation Yanis Dambergs)
5.7.2 Multiplication of the Fourth Figure
For the fourth figure, Llull follows a similar procedure to the one found in the third figure. First, ternary combinations can be made based on the initial combination. For example, based on B C D, B C E would follow, then B C F, and so on. Consequently, for each triple combination of letters, for example, B C D, it is possible to formulate 20 questions based on the first, the second, and the third meaning of the alphabet to obtain the form of a question. There are 20 questions in total for each column in the table. For example:
|B||C||D||Whether goodness is so great that it is eternal?|
|B||C||b||Whether there is some goodness so great that it contains within itself different things coessential with itself?|
|C||D||b||What is great difference of eternity?|
|C||D||c||What is great and eternal concordance?|
|D||b||c||Of what does the difference of concordance and eternity consist?|
|D||b||d||Of what does the difference of eternity and contrariety consist?|
The way to solve these questions follows the same procedure as in the case of the third figure, combining definitions and rules, according to the involved letters, their meaning in the alphabet, and the species of the rules used in each one of them.
5.7.3 Combination of the Principles, the Rules, the Subjects, the Virtues, and the Vices
In the ternary form of the Ars, Llull extensively uses the combining structure. Thus, the principles of the Ars—the first and the second meaning of the alphabet—are combined among themselves and the rules to obtain an exhaustive relationship of all that can be affirmed from the combination of the principles and the rules. This is a fundamental tool for the user of the Ars, for it is following this “mixture”, as designated by Llull, of the principles, that the identification of the appropriate principle to solve the questions will be easier. The same combining procedure must be applied to the nine subjects or beings with which Llull has formed a hierarchy of reality—the fourth meaning of the alphabet: God, Angel, Heaven, Man, imaginative, sensitive, vegetative, elementative, instrumentality or artifice. Each one of these must be combined with the principles and the rules to exhaustively obtain what can be said of each one, in order to answer concrete questions. This procedure is also applied to the fifth and sixth meaning of the alphabet, that is, the virtues and vices.
5.7.4 Questions and Use of the Ars
Both Ars Generalis Ultima and Ars Brevis conclude with a sequence of questions that can be formulated, and it is normally illustrated how they are answered using the combining mechanisms of the Ars. However, these are not the only questions that the Ars can answer. Llull himself explains in both texts that, above all, the Ars is an instrument to solve problems and develop arguments. Consequently, the majority of the resolved questions show the exemplary character of the use of the Ars. In the section dedicated to the teaching of the Ars, Llull notes two things. The first highlights the intention of creating an instrument to reason without appealing to authority. He writes in Ars Generalis Ultima 13–2:
Second, he shall clearly explain the text to the students through reasoning, without any appeal to authority, and the students shall read through the text, and put any questions they have about it to the teacher. (Translation Yanis Dambergs)
But the ultimate sense of the teaching and use of the Art is illustrated in this recommendation in the Ars generalis ultima 13–3:
The teacher shall propose questions to the students and solve them by providing reasons according to the process of this art, for without reasoning, the artist cannot make it work. Here we should note that the art has three friends, namely intellectual subtlety, skill in reasoning, and good intentions, for without these, no one can learn it. (Translation Yanis Dambergs)
Cited Primary Literature
- Desconhort, in [ORL] XIX (1936), 217–254 pp.
- De vita coaetanea, in [MOG] (1721) I Int. i, 1–12 (35–46). English translation Anthony Bonner, Ramon Llull: A Contemporary Life.
- Arbor Scientiae, in [ORL] XI-XIII (1917, 1923, 1926), xxi + LVI + 335, 451 i 521 pp.
- Ars Brevis, in [ROL] XII / CCCM 38 (1984), 171–255. English translation SW 569–646 pp.
- Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem, in [MOG] I (1721), Int. vii, 1–41 (433–473) [+31].
- Ars demonstrativa, in [MOG] III (1722), Int.iii (93–204), and [ROL] XXXII / CCCM 213 (2007), lxxx + 343 pp. English translation SW 305–568. pp.
- Ars inventiva veritatis, in [MOG] V (1729), Int. i (1–211) and [ROL] XXXVII / CCCM 265 (2014), cxxii + 513 pp.
- Ars generalis ultima, in [ROL] XIV / CCCM 75 (1986), 4–527 pp. English translation Mnemonic Arts of Blessed Raymond Lull (see Other Internet Resources)
- Liber de ascensu et descensu intellectus, in [ROL] IX / CCCM 35 (1981), 1–199 pp
- Liber de homine, in [ORL] XXI (1950), 1–159 pp.
- Liber de passagio, in [ROL] XXVIII / CCCM 182 (2003), 255–353 pp.
- Libre dels proverbis de Ramon, in [MOG] VI (1737), Int. vi (283–413). Spanish translation Garcías Palou, Sebastián. Proverbis de Ramon.
- Quomodo terra sancta recuperari potest, Manuscript Palma, Vivot, 4. (XVIII). 207–209v; 211–212v
Primary Literature Collections
In Latin, Catalan, Spanish
- [MOG] 1721–1742, Raymundi Lulli Opera omnia, Ivo Salzinger et al. (eds), 8 vols. Mainz (Reprinted Frankfur am Main 1965).
- [ROL] 1959–1967, 1975–, Raimundi Lulli Opera Latina, I–V (Palma) and VI– Turnholt, Belgium: Brepols.
- [CCCM], Corpus Christianorum Continuatio Mediaevalis. This is a reference to the series by the publisher Brepols in which [ROL] appear.
- [NEORL] 1990, Nova Edició de les Obres de Ramon Llull, Palma de Mallorca.
- [OE] 1957–1960, Obras essencials, Joaquín Carreras y Artau et al. (eds), 2 Vol., Barcelona.
- [OL] 1948, Obras literarias, Miquel Batllori and Miguel Caldentey (eds), Madrid.
- [ORL] 1906–1950, Obres de Ramon Llull, Salvador Galmés et al. (eds), 21 vols., Palma de Mallorca.
Translations (English, Spanish, French)
- [SW] Bonner, Anthony (ed. and trans.), 1985, Selected Works of Ramon Llull, 2 vols., Princeton: Princeton University Press. Includes translations of Ars demonstrativa and Ars brevis.
- Johnston, Mark D. (ed. and trans.), 1996, The Book of the Lover and the Beloved, Warminster: Aris & Phillips.
- Bonner, Anthony (ed. and trans.), 2010, Ramon Llull: A Contemporary Life, New York: Tamesis. Translation of De Vita Coetanea
- Fallows, Noel (trans.), 2013, The Book of the Order of Chivalry, Suffolk: The Boydell Press.
- Cortijo Ocaña, Antonio (ed. and trans.), 2015, The Book of the Order of Chivalry = Llibre de l’Ordre de Cavalleria = Libro de la Orden de Caballeria, Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing Company. (original Catalan with modern Spanish and English translations)
- Peers, Allison E. (trans.), 1926, Blanquerna: A Thirteenth Century Romance, London: Jarrolds.
- Peers, Allison E. (trans.), 1978, The Book of the Beasts, Westport: Hyperion Press.
- Llull, Ramon, Llibre de Les Bèsties, Col·lecció L’Aljub, núm. 2. Alicante: Editorial Aguaclara, 1990. (Catalan)
- Garcías Palou, Sebastián (ed. and trans.), 1978, Proverbis de Ramon, Madrid: Editora Nacional. (Spanish)
- Gustà, Marina (ed.), 1980, Llibre de Meravelles, Barcelona: Edicions 62. (Catalan)
- Butinyà i Jiménez, Júlia (ed. and trans.), 2015, Libro de la orden de caballeria, Madrid: Centro de Lingüística Aplicada ATENEA. (Spanish)
- Moga Bayona, Eduardo (trans.), 2006, Libro de Amigo y Amada, Barcelona: DVD Ediciones. (Spanish)
- Rubio Albarracín, Josep-Enric (ed and trans.), 2004, Arte breve, Pamplona: Ediciones Universidad de Navarra. (Spanish)
- Llinarès, Armand (trans.), 1988, Traité d’astrologie Raymond Lulle, Paris: Stock. (French)
- Badia [Pàmies], Lola, Joan Santanach [Suñol], and Albert Soler [Llopart], 2016, Ramon Llull as a Vernacular Writer: Communicating a New Kind of Knowledge, Woodbridge: Tamesis.
- Badia [Pàmies], Lola and Albert Soler [Llopart] (eds), 1991, Robert Pring-Mill Estudis sobre Ramon Llull, Barcelona: Curial—Publicacions de l’Abadia de Montserrat.
- Bonillo Hoyos, Xavier, 2005, “L’estructura dels llibres del Paradís i de l’Infern al Fèlix de Ramon Llull”, in Ripoll Perelló 2005: 217–233.
- Bonner, Anthony, 1993, “L’Art lul·liana com a autoritat alternativa”, Studia Lulliana, 33: 15–32.
- –––, 2002, “A Background to the Desconhort, Tree of Science, and Apostrophe”, Religion, Text, and Society in Medieval Spain and Northern Europe. Essays in honor of J.N. Hillgarth, Thomas E. Burman, Mark D. Meyerson, and Leah Shopkow (eds), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 122–133.
- –––, 2003a, “Estadístiques sobre la recepció de l’obra de Ramon Llull”, Studia Lulliana, 43: 83–92.
- –––, 2003b, “Les estructures de l’Art durant l’etapa quaternària”, Studia Lulliana, 43: 57–82.
- –––, 2007, The Art and Logic of Ramon Llull: A User’s Guide, Studien Und Texte Zur Geistesgeschichte Des Mittelalters, Leiden, Boston: Brill.
- Bonner, Anthony and Lola Badia [Pàmies], 1988, Ramon Llull. Vida, pensament i obra literària, Barcelona: Empúries.
- Bonner, Anthony and Maria Isabel Ripoll Perelló, 2002, Diccionari de defnicions lul·lianes/Dictionary of Lullian Defnitions, Palma/Barcelona: Universitat de les Illes Balears/Universitat de Barcelona.
- Bordoy Fernández, Antoni, 2012, Raimundo Lulio y la filosofía del siglo XIII, Madrid: Liceus.
- Butiñá Jiménez, Julia (ed.), 2012, Los mundos de Ramón Llull en las lenguas de hoy, Madrid: Universidad Nacional de Educación a Distancia.
- Carreras y Artau, Tomás and Joaquín, 1939–43, Historia de la filosofía española, 2 vols. Madrid.
- Colom Mateu, Miquel, 1982–5, Glossari general lul·lià, 5 vols. Palma de Mallorca: Editorial Moll.
- Colomer [Pous], Eusebi, 1975, De la Edad Media al Renacimiento: Ramón Llull—Nicolás de Cusa—Juan Pico della Mirandola, Barcelona: Herder.
- –––, 1986, “El pensament de Ramon Llull i els seus precedents històrics com a expressió medieval de la relació fe-cultura”, Fe i cultura en Ramon Llull, Publicacions del Centre d’Estudis Teològics de Mallorca II. Palma de Mallorca: 9–29.
- Cruz Hernández, Miguel, 1977, El pensamiento de Ramon Llull, Madrid: Fundación Juan March-Editorial Castalia.
- Domínguez Reboiras, Fernando, 2016, Ramon Llull: El Mejor Libro Del Mundo, Barcelona: Arpa Editores.
- Domínguez Reboiras, Fernando, Viola Tenge-Wolf, Peter Walter, and Raimundus-Lullus-Institut (eds.), 2011, Gottes Schau und Weltbetrachtung: Interpretationen zum “Liber contemplationis” des Raimundus Lullus: Akten des internationalen Kongresses aus Anlass des 50-jährigen Bestehens des Raimundus-Lullus-Instituts der Albert-Ludwigs-Universität Freiburg, 25.–28. November 2007, Turnhout: Brepols.
- Domínguez Reboiras, Fernando and Jordi Gayá, 2008, “Life”, in Fidora and Rubio 2008: 3–124.
- Drton, M., G. Hägele, D. Haneberg, F. Pukelsheim, and W. Reif, 2004, “A Rediscovered Llull Tract and the Augsburg Web Edition of Llull’s Electoral Writings”, Le Médiéviste et l’ordinateur, 43. Drton et al. 2004 available online
- Fidora, Alexander, 2003, “Ramón Llull frente a la crítica actual al diálogo interreligioso: el arte luliana como propuesta para una ‘Flosofía de las religiones’”, Revista Española de Filosofía Medieval, 10: 227–243.
- Fidora, Alexander and José G. Higuera [Rubio] (eds.), 2001, Ramón Llull, caballero de la fe: el arte luliana y su proyección en la edad media Pamplona, Anuario Filosófico 17, España: Universidad de Navarra.
- Fidora, Alexander and Josep E. Rubio [Albarracín] (eds.), 2008, Raimundus Lullus: An Introduction to His Life, Works and Thought, Turnhout: Brepols.
- Gardner, Martin, 1982, The Ars Magna of Ramon Lull. Logic Machines and Diagrams, New York: McGraw-Hill.
- Gayà Estelrich, Jordi, 1980, “Sobre algunes estructures literàries del Libre de Meravelles”, Randa, 10: 63–69.
- –––, 1989, “Honori d’Autun i Ramon Llull. Raons per a una hipòtesi”, La cultura mallorquina des de l’Edat Mitjana fins al segle XX. Homenatge al Pare Miquel Batllori. Estudis Balèarics, 29/30: 19–24.
- –––, 2002, Raimondo Lullo. Una teologia per la missione, Milan: Jaca Book.
- –––, 2008, “The Divine Realm”, in Fidora and Rubio 2008: 462–515
- Hames, Harvey, 2003, “The Language of Conversion: Ramon Llull’s Art as a Vernacular”, The Vulgar Tongue. Medieval and Postmedieval Vernacularity, Fiona Somerset and Nicholas Watson (eds), University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 43–56.
- Higuera Rubio, José G. and International Society for the Study of Medieval Philosophy (eds.), 2015, Knowledge, Contemplation and Lullism: Contributions to the Lullian Session at the SIEPM Congress—Freising, August 20–25, 2012, Turnhout: Brepols.
- Hillgarth, J.N., 1971, Ramon Lull and Lullism in Fourteenth-Century France, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Jankélévitch, Vladimir, 1974, La philosophie de l’amour chez Raymond Lulle, Paris: Mouton.
- Jaulent, Esteve 2010, “El Ars Generalis ultima de Ramon Llull: Presupuestos metafísicos y éticos”, Anales del Seminario de Historia de la Filosofía, 27: 87–113
- Johnston, Mark D., 1987, The Spiritual Logic of Ramon Llull, Oxford/New York: Clarendon Press/Oxford University Press.
- –––, 1996, The Evangelical Rhetoric of Ramon Llull: Lay Learning and Piety in the Christian West around 1300, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Libera, Alain de, 1991, Penser au Moyen Âge, Paris: Seuil.
- Lohr, Charles, 1986, “Ramon Llull: ‘Christianus arabicus’”, Randa, 19: 7–34.
- –––, 1987, “Les fondements de la logique nouvelle de Raymond Lulle”, Raymond Lulle et le Pays d’Oc, Cahiers de Fanjeaux 22. Toulouse: Privat, 233–248.
- López Alcalde, Celia, 2016, “Ontology of the Soul and Faculties of Knowledge. Soul, Body and Knowledge in Ramon Llull’s psychological work”, Anuario filosófico, 49(1): 73–95.
- Mayer, Annemarie C., 2016, “Llull y los atributos divinos en el contexto del siglo XIII”, Anuario filosófico, 49(1): 139–154.
- Musco, Alessandro, and Fernando Domínguez Reboiras (eds.), 2008, Il Mediterraneo del 300: Raimondo Lullo E Federico III d”Aragona, Re Di Sicilia; Omaggio a Fernando Domínguez Reboiras; Atti Del Seminario Internazionale Di Palermo, Castelvetrano-Selinunte (TP), 17 – 19 Novembre 2005, Turnhout: Brepols.
- Peers, E. Allison, 1929, Ramon Lull: A Biography, London: Society for promoting Christian knowledge.
- Pereira, Michela, 2012, “Comunicare la verità: Ramón Llull e la filosofía in volgare”, in Anna Alberni (ed.), El saber i les llengües vernacles a l’època de Llull i Eiximenis: estudis ICREA sobre vernacularització, Barcelona: Publicacions de l’Abadia de Montserrat, 22–44
- Petit, Leonci, 2004, “Conèixer en Ramon Lull”, Ars Brevis, 10: 201–225
- Platzeck, Erhard-Wolfram, 1953–4, “La Figura ‘A’ del Arte luliano y la esfera inteligible de Plotino”, Studia Monographica & Recensiones, 9–10: 19–34.
- Pring-Mill, Robert D.F., 1955–6, “The Trinitarian World Picture of Ramon Lull”, Romanistisches Jahrbuch 7: 229–256.
- –––, 1961, El microcosmos lul·lià, Palma de Mallorca: Editorial Moll.
- –––, 1962–7, “Entorn de la unitat del Libre d’amich e amat”, Estudis Romànics, 10: 33–61.
- –––, 1963, Ramón Llull y el número primitivo de las dignidades en el “Arte general”, Oxford: Dolphin.
- Ramis, Pedro, 1992, Lectura del Liber de civitate mundi de Ramón Llull, Barcelona: Biblioteca Universitaria de Filosofía.
- Ripoll Perelló, Maria Isabel (ed.), 2005, Actes de les Jornades Internacionals Lul·lianes: ‘Ramon Llull al s. XXI’ Palma, 1, 2 i 3 d’abril de 2004, Palma/Barcelona: Universitat de les Illes Balears/Universitat de Barcelona.
- Romano, Marta M.M. and Oscar de la Cruz, 2008, “The Human Realm”, in Fidora and Rubio 2008: 263–459
- Rossi, Paolo, 1960, Clavis universalis. Arti mnemoniche e logica combinatoria da Lullo a Leibniz, Bologna: Il Mulino, 1983 (second edition). Translated, 2000, Logic and the Art of Memory. The Quest for a Universal Language, Stephen Clucas (trans.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press; London, The Athlone Press.
- Rubio y Albarracín, Josep Enrico, 1993, “Les raons necessàries segons l’Art Demostrativa”, Studia Lulliana, 33: 3–14.
- –––, 1997, Les bases del pensament de Ramon Llull. Els orígens de l’Art lul·liana, Valencia and Barcelona: Publicacions de l’Abadia de Montserrat.
- –––, 2000, “Com és la vertadera Figura X de l’Ars compendiosa inveniendi veritatem”, Studia Lulliana, 40: 47–80.
- –––, 2002, “L’evolució de les figures A, S, T de l’Art quaternària en el trànsit cap a l’Art ternària”, Taula, 37: 83–98.
- –––, 2008a, “Thought: The Art”, in Fidora and Rubio 2008: 243–310
- –––, 2008b, “Natural Realm”, in Fidora and Rubio 2008: 211–362.
- Ruiz Simón, Josep Maria 1986, “De la naturalesa com a mescla a l’art de mesclar (sobre la fonamentació cosmològica de les arts lul·lianes)”, Randa, 19: 69–99.
- –––, 1993, “‘Quomodo est haec ars inventiva?’ (l’Art de Llull i la dialèctica escolàstica)”, Studia Lulliana, 33: 77–98.
- –––, 1996, “Ramon Llull y las contradicciones aparentes”, in Fernando Domínguez and Jaime de Salas. Constantes y fragmentos del pensamiento luliano: Actas del simposio sobre Ramon Llull en Trujillo, 17–20 septiembre 1994, Tübingen: Max Niemeyer Verlag, 19–38.
- –––, 1998 “El Joc de Ramon Llull I la Significació de L’àrt General”, Ars Brevis, 2: 55–65
- –––, 1999, L’Art de Ramon Llull i la teoria escolàstica de la ciència, Barcelona: Quaderns Crema.
- –––, 2005, “Las transformació del pensament de Ramon Llull durant les obres de transició cap a l’etapa ternària”, in Ripoll Perelló 2005: 167–196.
- Sala-Molins, Louis, 1974, La philosophie de l’amour chez Raymond Lulle, Paris and The Hague: Mouton.
- Saranyana, Josep-Ignasi, 2000, “Le vocabulaire philosophique en langue romane: les premiers écrits catalans de Ramon Llull”, in Jacqueline Hamesse and Carlos Steel (eds), L’élaboration du vocabulaire philosophique au Moyen Âge, Actes du Colloque International de Louvain-la-Neuve et Leuven, 12–14 septembre 1998, Turnhout: Brepols, 325–335.
- Soler [Llopart], Albert, 1992–3, “Els manuscrits lul·lians de Pere de Llemotges”, Llengua i Literatura, 5: 447–470.
- –––, 1993, “Ramon Llull and Peter of Limoges”, Traditio, 48: 93–105. doi:10.1017/S0362152900012897
- –––, 1994, “‘Vadunt plus inter sarracenos et tartaros’: Ramon Llull i Venècia”, in Lola Badia i Pàmies and Albert Soler, Intel·lectuals i escriptors a la baixa Edat Mitjana, Barcelona: Curial/Publicacions de l’Abadia de Montserrat, 49–68.
- Urvoy, Dominique, 1980, Penser l’Islam: Les présupposés islamiques de l’«Art» de Lull, Paris: Vrin.
- Vega [Esquerra], Amador, 2003, Ramon Llull and the Secret of Life: An Introduction to the Philosophy of the Human Person, New York, NY: Crossroad.
- Villalba y Varneda, Pere, 2015, Ramón Llull: escriptor i filòsof de la diferència: Palma de Mallorca, 1232–1316, Barcelona: Universidad Autonoma de Barcelona.
- Yates, Frances A. (ed.), 1982, Lull and Bruno: Collected Essays, volume 1, London/Boston: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Base de datos Ramon Llull, maintained by Centre de documentació Ramon Llull (Facultat de Filolofia Catalana. Universitat de Barcelona), is an electronic bibliography aimed at systematizing and facilitating a search for all information regarding the Lullian or pseudo-Lullian opus. Provides information concerning the 265 authentic Lullian Works, reference to manuscripts, and a extensive bibliography.
- Biblioteca digital NARPAN. Espai de literatura i cultura medieval coordinate by Sandurní Marti and Miriam Cabré (Universidad de Girona) has digital transcription and editions of Llull Works as Ars demostrativa, Doctrina Pueril, Tabula general, among others.
- Mnemonic Arts of Blessed Raymond Lull, maintained by Yanis Dambergs, is a repository of Llull’s documents translated to English by Dambergs. The site include versions of the Ars Brevis, Ars Generalis Ultima, The Book of Propositions.
- The Augsburg Web Edition of Llull’s Electoral Writings, maintained by the Institute of Mathematics of the University of Augsburg, exhibits the electoral writings of Ramon Lull: facsimiles, transcriptions, and translations of Llull’s three writings on electoral systems.
- Instituto Brasileiro de Filosofia e Ciência Raimundo Lúlio. The site contains translations of Llull’s work in to Portuguese, publications and reference to research on Llull.
- The Freiburg manuscript database of the Freiburg University is a comprehensive collection of digitized manuscripts of Llull’s work.