Retributive Justice

First published Wed Jun 18, 2014

The concept of retributive justice has been used in a variety of ways, but it is best understood as that form of justice committed to the following three principles: (1) that those who commit certain kinds of wrongful acts, paradigmatically serious crimes, morally deserve to suffer a proportionate punishment; (2) that it is intrinsically morally good—good without reference to any other goods that might arise—if some legitimate punisher gives them the punishment they deserve; and (3) that it is morally impermissible intentionally to punish the innocent or to inflict disproportionately large punishments on wrongdoers. The idea of retributive justice has played a dominant role in theorizing about punishment over the past few decades, but many features of it—especially the notions of desert and proportionality, the normative status of suffering, and the ultimate justification for retribution—remain contested and problematic.

1. The appeal of retributive justice

The appeal of retributive justice as a theory of punishment rests in part on direct intuitive support, in part on the claim that it is better than alternative accounts of punishment, and in part on arguments tying it to deeper moral principles.

Many share the intuition that those who commit wrongful acts, especially serious crimes, should be punished even if punishing them would produce no other good. Consider, for example, a rapist who has since suffered an illness that has left him physically incapacitated so that he cannot rape again, and who has enough money to support himself without resorting to criminal activities. Suppose that this suffices to ensure that there is no need to deter or incapacitate him to prevent him from committing serious crimes in the future. Suppose, in addition, that he will regularly report to a prison to be filmed in prison garb, thereby conveying the impression that he is living in prison, though the truth is that he spends his days relaxing and pursuing his interests on a tropical island. If that ruse were secure from discovery, then general deterrence could be achieved as well. Even if the goods normally achieved by punishment are thereby achieved, is there not still some reason to want him to be punished? Many find it intuitive that there is (see Moore 1997: 98–101). This intuitive judgment is supported by a widely shared emotional response to serious crime, which Jeffrie Murphy called “retributive hatred” (Murphy & Hampton 1988: ch. 3).

Not only is retributivism in that way intuitively appealing, the primary set of competitor theories, utilitarian or consequentialist theories of punishment that focus on deterrence and incapacitation, seem to confront a deep problem. They have difficulty explaining a core and intuitively compelling feature of retributivism, namely the claim that it is always or nearly always impermissible either to inflict punishment on those who have done no wrong or to inflict disproportionately large punishments on those who have done some wrong. Some respond to this point by adopting a mixed theory, according to which retributivism provides a necessary condition for punishment, but consequentialist considerations provide the reasons to punish (Hart 1968: ch. 1). Such mixed theories can still seem morally problematic, however, because they seem to justify using people merely as a means (within retributive limits) for promoting the greater good (Duff 2001: 13). The thought that punishment treats wrongdoers as they deserve to be treated addresses this objection to mixed theories.

Both of these sources of appeal have clear limits. The direct intuition can be challenged with the claim that it is merely the reflection of a morally dubious psychological propensity to feel an excess of what Nietzsche, in the Genealogy of Morals, called ressentiment,

a witches brew [of] resentment, fear, anger, cowardice, hostility, aggression, cruelty, sadism, envy, jealousy, guilt, self-loathing, hypocrisy and self-deception. (Moore 1997: 120)

And the argument that retributivism justifies punishment better than consequentialism presupposes that punishment is justifiable (for criticism of this premise, see Golash 2005; Boonin 2008), and that there are no alternatives that are better than both (for two alternatives, see Quinn 1985; Tadros 2011).

To respond to these challenges, retributive justice must ultimately be justified in a larger moral context that shows that it is plausibly grounded in, or at least connected to, other, deeply held moral principles. Only in this way should its intuitive appeal be regarded, in reflective equilibrium, as morally sound. For a discussion of the prospects for deeper justification, see section 5.

2. Background concepts

Two background concepts should be addressed before saying more about retributive justice: (1) punishment, and (2) the sorts of wrongs for which punishment might be thought deserved.

2.1 Punishment

The nature of punishment is the subject of two other entries in this Encyclopedia (Bedau and Kelly 2010; Duff 2013). The following comments merely summarize the points that are most important for the purpose of understanding retributivism.

For an act to count as punishment, it must have four elements. First, it must impose some sort of cost or hardship on, or at the very least withdraw a benefit that would otherwise be enjoyed by, the person being punished.

Second, the punisher must do so intentionally, not as an accident, and not as a side-effect of pursuing some other end. For example, while sending a criminal to prison often has foreseeable harmful effects on the criminal's family, retributivists would say that those harms do not constitute punishment, not unless they are purposely inflicted as part of the punishment for the crime.

Some critics of retributivism reject this limitation as an appeal to a “definitional stop”, which they say is illicitly used to avoid having to justify the costs of the practice (Hart 1968: 5–6; Christopher 2002: 879–880). The worry is that retributivists will seek to justify only the purposeful infliction of hardship on wrongdoers, and will ignore the overall costs of the practice. But there is no reason to think that retributivists generally ignore the need to justify the negative effects of punishment on the innocent. See section 4.5. The retributivist's point is only that the intentional infliction of harm in the form of punishment has to be justified in a different way than the collateral damage that may befall the innocent as a result of punishing the guilty. See section 4.3.3.

Third, the hardship or loss must be imposed in response to what is believed to be a wrongful act or omission. It is a confusion to take oneself to be “punishing” another for some fact over which he has or had no control (Mabbott 1939). One need not be conceptually confused to take oneself to have reason to intentionally inflict harsh treatment on another, whether because one wants to look like one is punishing the guilty (what Rawls 1955 called “telishment”), or because one is simply oppressing others on the basis of some trait, say their ethnicity or physical appearance, that they could not help having. Doing so would presumably be immoral, but it need not be conceptually confused. What would be confused is thinking that one is inflicting “punishment”.

Fourth, the hardship or loss must be imposed, at least in part, as a way of sending a message of condemnation or censure for what is believed to be a wrongful act or omission (Feinberg 1970). This element allows us to distinguish taxes and fees from punishment. Even if taxes and fees are meant to discourage certain kinds of activities, they do not convey censure for a wrongful act or omission.

It is interesting to note that crime is not the only legal basis for meeting out punishment. Torts too can serve that function. Contemporary tort law has mostly shed the root meaning of the word, which derives from the Latin tortum, meaning “wrong” or “injustice”. Tortfeasors are generally treated not so much as wrongdoers as harm causers, who simply have a duty to make their victims whole. But damages for intentional torts sometimes include punitive damages, which carry all the marks of punishment, though the procedural route to getting them is vastly different from that of criminal punishment (see Coleman & Mendlow 2010).

2.2 The relevant kinds of wrongs

Not all wrongdoing justifies a punitive response. What kinds of wrongs can be morally fitting bases for punishment? This is a much-debated topic, beyond the scope of the present entry (Shafer-Landau 1996: 289-292; Husak 2008; Asp 2013). Nonetheless, a few comments may be helpful.

The paradigmatic wrong for which punishment seems appropriate is an intentional or knowing violation of the important rights of another, such as murder or rape. It is almost as clear that an attempt to do the same is a proper basis for punishment, though how to define the concept of an attempt is highly contested (Duff 1996; Alexander, Ferzan, and Morse 2009: ch. 6; Yaffe 2010). The more tenuous the connection to a rights violation, the more controversial punishment for an act becomes. This is true as well when no rights violation is in view, as when dealing with a purely regulatory offense. (For a critical discussion of mala prohibita offenses, see Husak 2008: 103–119.)

The dimension of mens rea also matters for determining whether conduct can serve as a morally appropriate basis for punishment (Feinberg 1990: 147–150). As the level of culpability goes from purpose and knowledge through recklessness to negligence, it becomes progressively harder to justify a punitive response to any given rights violation, harm, or inchoate step thereto. It is harder still if culpability for what criminal lawyers call an element of the wrong or crime is completely lacking—making the wrong or crime a matter of strict liability. Similar points can be made about ignorance of the law or the moral basis for the claim that the act is wrongful (on the law, see Husak 2010a; on morality, see Rosen 2004; Harman 2011).

The most problematic kinds of wrongs for liberal retributivists are moralistic or paternalistic wrongs. The fundamental reason moralistic wrongs are thought wrong is that they are taken to flout certain moral values, or divine commands, regarding proper human behavior. And the fundamental reason paternalistic wrongs are thought wrong is that they are self-destructive. Liberals think such matters of virtue and vice (or sin) are best left to the autonomous individual, and are not proper bases for punishment.

Many have sought to capture this objection to moralistic and paternalistic wrongs by appealing to John Stuart Mill's “harm principle” (Mill 1859: ch. 1). But the harm principle, on any of a number of interpretations, is too restrictive to be consistent with retributive justice, which, unlike the harm principle, calls for giving the wrongdoer his just deserts even if no other good (such as the prevention of harm) should follow (Tomlin 2014). A broader, more defensible liberal position is that the wrongs relevant to punishment have to be a matter of proper public concern for citizens (Duff 2001: §4.3; Duff 2011).

It is important to keep in mind, however, that retributive justice is not limited to liberal moral and political philosophy. Retributive justice may also be deemed appropriate by illiberal persons and inside distinctly illiberal organizations, ranging from religious groups to families (Zaibert 2006: 16–24). Illiberal persons and groups may also make a distinction between wrongs that call for punishment and those that do not, but they will not draw the distinction in the same way that liberals would.

3. Range of Meanings

John Cottingham (1979) famously distinguished nine “varieties of retribution”, arguing that much discussion of retributive justice is confused because people are not clear what they mean. Most prominent retributive theorists have since converged more or less on the first of the meanings given below. Nonetheless, it is worth briefly following in Cottingham's tracks—though departing somewhat from Cottingham's list, which was a mix of meanings and justifications—to be clear about what is meant by “retributive justice”.

3.1 Retributivism

Retributivism, without qualification, involves both positive and negative desert claims. The positive desert claim holds that wrongdoers morally deserve punishment for their wrongful acts. This claim comes in stronger and weaker versions. For example, Michael Moore (1997: 87) writes: “Retributivism … is the view that punishment is justified by the desert of the offender”. Jeffrie Murphy (2007: 11) adds a note of qualification, writing: “[A] retributivist is a person who believes that the primary justification for punishing a criminal is that the criminal deserves it”. A retributivist could take an even weaker view, that there is some positive value in punishing a wrongdoer for his wrongful acts, apart from any consequences that might arise from doing so.

This positive desert claim is complemented by a negative one: Those who have done no wrong may not be punished. This prohibits both punishing those not guilty of wrongdoing (who deserve no punishment), and punishing the guilty more than they deserve (i.e., inflicting disproportional punishment).

Of course, the innocent will inevitably sometimes be punished; no human system can run without mistakes. And retributivists should not duck what it means to commit such a mistake: it wrongs the innocent person. But this is not a fatal problem for retributivists. It does not imply that they risk acting impermissibly if they punish people. Permissibility is best understood as an action-guiding notion, not one tied directly to what is objectively justifiable (Scanlon 2008: 47–52). As an action-guiding notion, it must make use of a relevant standard of proof. If the right standard is met—the “beyond a reasonable doubt” standard has recently been called into question (Laudan 2011)—then punishers act permissibly, even if they unwittingly punish the innocent (see also Simons 2012: 67–69).

Most contemporary retributivists accept both the positive and the negative desert claims, along with the thought that it is morally good if those who deserve punishment get the punishment they deserve.

3.2 Negative retributivism

What has been called “negative” (Mackie 1982), “minimalist” (Golding 1975), or “weak” (Hart 1968: ch. 1) retributivism is the view that only the negative component of retributivism is true. It is the view that wrongdoers forfeit their right not to suffer proportional punishment, but that the positive reasons for punishment must appeal to some other goods that punishment achieves, such as deterrence or incapacitation. Wrongdoing, on this view, is merely a necessary condition for punishment. The desert of the wrongdoer provides neither a sufficient condition for nor even a positive reason to punish (see also Mabbott 1939; Quinton 1954).

Of these three labels, negative retributivism seems the most apt, as it picks up the idea that wrongdoing negates the right one otherwise has not to be punished. The alternative labels also risk confusion with the fact that the positive reasons for punishment that retributivists generally accept can be stronger or weaker. Differences along that dimension should not be confused with a position that denies that guilt, by itself, provides any reason to punish.

The line between negative retributivism and retributivism that posits a weak positive reason to punish may seem vanishingly small. Negative retributivism holds that punishment, especially the harsh treatment aspect of it, must be justified by the instrumental value of punishment. Depending on how weak the positive desert claim is, a positive retributivist who seeks to offer an all-things-considered justification for punishment may need to cite the same instrumental benefits as a negative retributivist (see section 4.5). For both, a full justification of punishment will be “mixed”, appealing to both retributive and consequentialist ideas (Garvey 2004: 449–451).

Nonetheless, there are three reasons it is important to distinguish the two. First, the challenge of justifying wrongdoers' forfeiture of the right not to be punished, if they do not deserve to be punished, is different from the challenge of doing the same if they do deserve to be punished. Second, it is not clear whether forfeiture theories can make sense of the proportionality restrictions that are central to retributivism. That is, if forfeiture is not tied to some limited positive desert, then further argument is needed to show that it is limited to a proportional punishment (Duff 2001: 14–16). Third, positive desert arguably makes punishment respectful of the dignity of the individual in ways that mere forfeiture does not. Thus it is important to maintain a clear distinction between retributivism and negative retributivism.

3.3 Payback as debt

As Cottingham notes, the Latin root of retribution is re + tribuo, which means “I pay back”. One way to understand the notion of paying back is that it concerns paying debts that are owed. This understanding connects to the commonly shared retributive thought that a criminal who has been appropriately punished has “paid his debt to society”.

This idea of a debt owed may be connected to the idea that criminals have taken unfair advantage of the law-abiding. Punishment in the form of harsh treatment can then be thought of as pay back in the sense that it strips away that advantage and restores the status quo ante that was wrongfully disturbed.

There are numerous problems with this as a substantive theory of why harsh treatment might be deserved—see section 5.2. For present purposes, the important point is that this notion of payback is better understood as a theory that purports to explain why punishment is deserved, rather than as providing the meaning of retributive justice.

3.4 Lex talionis: Payback as response in kind

Another meaning of payback is concerned not with paying a debt but with giving wrongdoers a response in kind. This is the Biblical idea of “an eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth” (Exodus 21: 23–25; Leviticus 24:17–20). Kant also endorses, in a somewhat different way, this notion of punishment. Invoking the principle of equality for punishment, Kant writes: “whatever undeserved evil you inflict upon another within the people, that you inflict upon yourself” (1797: 141). Thus, he who steals “deprives himself (by the principle of retribution) of security in any property…. [and if] he has committed murder he must die” (ibid.: 142).

Lex talionis provides a controversial principle of proportionality (for more on proportionality, see section 4.4). But as with the previous conception of payback, one should not confuse the concept of payback with the concept of retribution. Retributive justice includes a commitment to punishment that is proportional to the crime. But retributive justice cannot be reduced to a measure of proportionality (Moore 1997: 88).

3.5 Limiting Retributivism

“Limiting retributivism” is not so much a conception of retributivism as a view about the limits of retributivism as a theory of punishment. It is retributivism with the addition of skepticism about our ability to make any but the most general statements about proportionality (see N. Morris 1982: 182–87, 196–200; Frase 2005: 77; Slobogin 2009: 671). Utilitarian or consequentialist considerations, it is proposed, should be consulted to fill in the gap left by the supposed vagueness of proportionality.

This view may move too quickly to invoke utilitarian or consequentialist considerations. Even if our ability to discern proportionality constraints is crude in absolute terms, comparative proportionality may leave relatively little leeway with regard to what punishments are morally defensible in a given jurisdiction (Robinson 2003; von Hirsch and Ashworth 2005: 180–185; von Hirsch 2011: 212)—see section 4.4. Nonetheless, insofar as the constraints of proportionality seem inherently vague, retributivists may have to make some sort of peace with the thesis of limiting retributivism.

3.6 Retrospective criminal justice

It is commonly said that the difference between utilitarian and retributive theories of punishment is that the former is prospective, looking to the good that punishment may accomplish, while the latter is retrospective, seeking to do justice for what a wrongdoer has done. That is a difference between the two, but retributivism should not be reduced to the claim that it is punishment in response to a past crime. Other theories may refer to the fact that wrongdoers have already done something in virtue of which it is proper to punish them without thereby being retributivist. See, e.g., Quinn 1985 (it is rational to threaten people with punishment for crimes, and that rationality is transmitted to punishment if they go ahead and commit crimes); Tadros 2011 (criminals have a duty to endure punishment to make up for the harm they have caused).

3.7 Sublimated vengeance

Retributivism has also often been conflated with revenge or the desire for vengeance. But the two concepts should not be confused. Robert Nozick drew five distinctions between the two, including that revenge is personal but retribution is not, and that

[r]evenge involves a particular emotional tone, pleasure in the suffering of another, while retribution either need involve no emotional tone, or involves another one, namely, pleasure at justice being done. (1981: 367)

These imply that even if no one wanted to take revenge on a wrongdoer, there could still be a retributive reason to punish him (Moore 1997: 89).

These distinctions do not imply that the desire for revenge plays no motivational role leading people to value retributive justice. Perhaps retributive justice is the sublimated, generalized version of the thirst for revenge. The two are nonetheless different. As George Fletcher wrote (2000: 417), retributivism “is not to be identified with vengeance or revenge, any more than love is to be identified with lust”.

3.8 Safety valve to stop vigilantism

Finally, some have thought that retributive justice is simply a name for the way the law takes over punishment from private groups, who would otherwise engage in vigilante justice, with no due process, no respect for proportionality, and the worrisome risk of a cycle of vendettas. This view actually expresses a utilitarian justification for punishment, which should not be confused with retributivism (Moore 1997: 89–90).

4. Range of issues

This section will address six issues that arise for those trying to make sense of retributive justice: (1) the nature of the desert claim and questions it raises; (2) the proper identity of the punisher; (3) the normative status of suffering; (4) the meaning of proportionality; (5) the strength of retributive reasons; and (6) whether retributivism should be thought of as a consequentialist or deontological theory.

4.1 Desert

Desert has been analyzed into a three-way relationship between the person who deserves something, what she deserves, and that in virtue of which she deserves it. These can usefully be cast, respectively, as the desert subject, the desert object, and the desert basis (Feinberg 1970; Berman 2011: 437). A fourth dimension should also be noted: the person or persons who can appropriately give, or have a duty to give, the desert subject what she deserves. I call these persons desert agents. They raise a distinct set of issues, which are addressed in section 4.2.

4.1.1 The desert subject

Retributivism presents no special puzzles about who is the desert subject: the wrongdoer. What may be particularly problematic for retributivism is the claim that certain kinds of persons (children or the insane) or entities (states or corporations) can deserve punishment. (For contrasting views on the last possibility, see French 1979; Narveson 2002.)

4.1.2 The desert object

The desert object has already been discussed in section 2.1: punishment. There is, of course, much to be said about what punishments are deserved for what wrongs. I highlight here three issues that are particularly salient for retributivists. First, is the question of whether the retributivist can justify inflicting harsh treatment in addition to censure—see section 5. This is tied to the relevance of suffering, which is discussed in section 4.3. Second, is the challenge of identifying proportional punishments—discussed in section 4.4.

To those two familiar problems we can add one more: Can retributivists make sense of punishments that do not aim to inflict suffering, but that reflect the idea that a wrongdoer's particular acts make her unfit to retain certain rights going forward? Consider, for example, the rights to vote, to bear arms, or to be free from preventive detention. The U.S. Supreme Court has held that the loss of these rights need not be punitive. But arguably such losses are punitive, and can be accounted for within a retributive framework as long as they are not merely a reflection of society's fear of what the person may do in the future, but carry a message of censure and are proportionate to the wrongdoer's prior wrongful action (Walen 2011; for a different view of how the line between punitive and non-punitive sanctions should be drawn, see Chiao 2013). However, even if such losses can, as a class, be justified as retributive punishments, individual instances of them may be substantively unjustifiable (see, e.g., Lippke 2001, on the loss of the right to vote).

One more matter should be mentioned under the heading of the desert object: namely the idea put forward by some retributivists, that wrongdoers have a “right to be punished” such that not punishing them wrongs them (Hegel 1821; Morris 1968). It is important to be clear about what this right is. It would be ludicrous to hold that an executive wrongs a wrongdoer by showing him mercy and pardoning him. What is meant is that wrongdoers have the right to be treated as the kind of being who can be held responsible and punished, rather than as sick or dangerous beasts. See section

4.1.3 The desert basis

The desert basis has already been discussed in section 2.2: a certain kind of wrong. The focus of the discussion at this point is on two puzzles about the existence of a desert basis. The first puzzle concerns how humans, given the fact that our choices are grounded in our brain activity, and that our brains are parts of the physical world, can have the sort of free will necessary to deserve punishment at all. The second puzzle concerns why, even if they deserve punishment, that fact should make it permissible for anyone to take on the role of giving them the punishment they deserve. Physical laws and desert

The laws of physics might be thought to imply that we are no more free and responsible for our “choices”, and therefore no more capable of deserving punishment, than any other physical object, be it a falling tree or a wild animal. One can resist this move by arguing that while we are physical beings, most of us have the capacity to use reason to think about our options, to weigh reasons for and against them, and to choose—these being the key abilities for being responsible agents who can deserve punishment if they choose to do wrong (Morse 2004). But this invites the reply that even in normally functioning adults the attribution of responsibility for choices is an illusion (Smilansky 2000). None of us are ultimately responsible for our genes (or our cells) and the environment in which we were born and raised, and yet those two factors, combined with the situations we happen to face and a certain amount of quantum randomness, determine what we do. Upon closer inspection, the agent dissolves and all we are left with is a brain responding to stimulus in a way fully consistent with the underlying physical laws (Greene and Cohen 2011; Vihvelin 2011).

Michael McKenna's (2009) entry in this Encyclopedia surveys a range of possible responses to this argument. Assessing these is beyond the scope of this entry. Two types of compatibilist response, however, deserve special mention. One is the view introduced by P.F. Strawson (1962), and developed by R. Jay Wallace (1994) and Christine Korsgaard (1996), according to which we normally have good moral reasons to hold normal adults morally responsible for their choices, while also holding those who suffer certain informational, rational, or motivational deficits, or who have been manipulated in certain ways, not responsible. The basis of this view is that it is more respectful of normal humans to treat them as beings with the kind of dignity that comes with being responsible for their choices than not. Treating normal humans as merely more or less dangerous animals, whose behavior can hopefully be modified with threats and rewards and, failing that, who should be more or less fully incapacitated, is to over-extend the medical model. The medical model should be applied only to those whose mental capacities are distinctly sub-normal (Hegel 1821: 71 & 246; Morris 1968).

This first approach prioritizes the moral/practical point of view over the theoretical/metaphysical point of view. But it arguably trades on theoretical claims about the abilities of normal persons to make choices as agents. Thus the view may be well complemented by another sort of view, exemplified by the work of John Martin Fischer and Mark Ravizza (1998), which focuses on ways in which persons can exercise meaningful agency by being responsive to reasons (for a collection of essays discussing this issue, see Nadelhoffer 2013). The Gap Between Desert and the Right to Punish

Assuming that wrongdoers can, at least sometimes, deserve punishment, the next question is: why think others may punish them just because they are deserving? David Dolinko (1991) points out that there is a difference between someone morally deserving something and others having a right to give it to her. In one example, he imagines a father who (perversely) gives his reprobate son almost everything in his will, and leaves his loving and respectful son a pittance. We may believe that the loving son deserves to inherit at least half of his father's estate, but that would not entitle anyone to take property from the other son to give to him (ibid.: 544). Putting the point more generally, desert by itself does not justify the violation of rights. Moreover, since people normally have a right not to suffer punishment, desert alone should not justify punishing them.

The most promising way to respond to this criticism within a retributive framework is to distinguish two kinds of desert: desert that corresponds to a view about what would be a good outcome, and desert that concerns rights (Hill 1999: 425–426). Dolinko's example concerns the first kind of desert. If it were modified so that the executor of the will misread it to give the reprobate son almost everything, then we would think that the loving son deserved to get his rightful share under the will. The relevant agents of the state would then not only have a reason but also a right to take property from the reprobate son and give it to the loving son. When it comes to retributivism, then, Dolinko's challenge trades on the thought that retributivism claims that wrongdoers deserve to suffer in the sense that their suffering is a good outcome. As will be argued in section 4.3, retributivism is more properly understood as holding that wrongdoers deserve to be punished—a claim about what certain others have not only a reason but a right to do to them.

4.2 Who may punish?

Assuming that wrongdoers deserve to be punished, who has a right to inflict the punishment? Who, in other words, are the appropriate desert agents? One might start, as social contract writers like Hobbes and Locke do, with the view that in the state of nature, the victim has the right to punish, and that the reasons for creating a state include reasons for potential victims to transfer that right to the state (Hobbes 1651: chs. 14 & 18; Locke 1690: ch. 9).

One worry about the social contract view is that it licenses vigilante punishment. Social contract theorists can handle that by emphasizing that people not only delegate but transfer their right to punish, retaining only a vestigial right to punish in the case of minor punishments, such as would be doled out outside the criminal justice system, or if the state fails or is unable to act. Communitarians like Antony Duff (2011: 6), however, object to even a vestigial right to vigilante punishment. Duff sees the state, which speaks on behalf of the whole community, as the only proper punisher, at least in the context of crimes (For an even stronger position along these lines, see Hegel 1821: §102).

Others take a different view about vigilantes, namely that anyone is pro tanto entitled to punish a wrongdoer. Some forfeiture theorists hold that restrictions on the right to punish someone who has forfeited his right not to be punished arise only as a matter of political morality (Wellman 2012: 378–80). It is hard to see why a desert theorist could not take the same position. Indeed, some retributivists think that what vigilantes do should at least count against the total punishment someone is due (Husak 1990: 441–442; but see Kolber 2013 (discussed in section 4.4) for a challenge to the logical implication that vigilantes “punish”).

Even if the state normally has an exclusive right to punish criminal wrongdoing, questions arise whether it is permitted to punish if it sustains or fails to address important social injustices (from distributive injustice to the denial of civil and political rights to socially disempowered groups). Some think that such conditions call for mitigation in punishment (von Hirsch and Ashworth 2005: 69). Others think that they may negate the state's right to punish (Murphy 1973; Duff 2001: 182–184).

Finally, can the wrongdoer herself be her own punitive desert agent? Can she repent and voluntarily take on hardships, and thereby preempt others' right to punish her? Duff has argued that she cannot unless she has also suffered public criticism and social ostracism—and even then, such informal punishment should be discouraged as a substitute for formal punishment (Duff 2001: 118–120).

4.3 Moral puzzles of suffering

Retributive justice holds that it is intrinsically (or non-instrumentally) good that wrongdoers suffer at the hands of punishers. But as Hart put it, retributive justice

appears to be a mysterious piece of moral alchemy in which the combination of the two evils of moral wickedness and suffering are transmuted into good. (Hart 1968: 234–235)

Moreover, some critics think the view that it is intrinsically good to inflict suffering is “barbaric” (Tadros 2011: 63).

The core retributivist response to these criticisms has to be that it is neither absurd nor barbaric to think that the normative valence of suffering might sometimes be positive. There are, however, reasons to think that this response is itself defensible only if retributivists accept two further positions. First, wrongdoers deserve not merely to suffer but to suffer punishment. Second, punishment should be calibrated to inflict objective deprivations, not subjective suffering.

4.3.1 The variable normative valence of suffering

Retributivists think that deserved suffering should be distinguished from non-deserved suffering. While the latter is inherently bad to inflict, the former is inherently good to inflict (if inflicted by a proper punitive desert agent). Of course, it would be better if there were no occasion to inflict suffering, but given that a wrong has been committed, inflicting deserved suffering in response is better than not doing so (Hegel 1821: §99; Zaibert 2006: 202–216). This can be thought of as an application of John Rawls's (1972: 31) claim that the right is prior to the good. Just as desire satisfaction loses its positive value if the desires are unjust, so suffering loses its negative value if it is deserved. (For another example of something with a variable normative valence, see Kant's doctrine of the highest good: happiness in proportion to virtue. Kant 1788: 115.)

Contra Victor Tadros (2013: 261), this response to Hart's objection does not imply that if a person were already suffering, then the situation might be made better, on the whole, if the person engaged in wrongdoing, thereby making the suffering more valuable. This objection presupposes—wrongly; see section 4.3.2—that retributivists should value the suffering of wrongdoers in the abstract, as opposed to the suffering inflicted by punishment. Moreover, even if retributivists valued the suffering of wrongdoers, detached from any punishment, they could take the position that the negative value of the wrong outweighs any increased value in the suffering.

4.3.2 Suffering in the abstract versus suffering through punishment

Some retributivists take the view that what wrongdoing calls for is the wrongdoer's suffering, whatever causes it. As Mitchell Berman writes (2013: 87), “the dominant retributivist view” is “that what wrongdoers deserve is ‘to suffer’” (see also Zaibert 2013: 43 n.19; but see Kleinig 1973: 67, discussing the value of imposing suffering). Even though Berman himself does not quite embrace that view, he embraces a close cousin, namely that “what wrongdoers deserve … is that their lives go less well” (2013: 87).

There is something intuitively appealing, if one has retributive intuitions, about the thought that it is better if a wrongdoer—especially one who has committed serious wrongs—lives miserably than if he lives happily. There is something galling, if one feels the retributive impulse, in the thought that he might “get away with it”. Nonetheless, it is important to separate the true retributive thought, that it is good to punish a wrongdoer so that he does not “get away with it”, from the quasi-retributive thought, that it is better that he suffer than that he live happily, even if the suffering is not inflicted by punishment. This quasi-retributive thought may draw on the same emotional wellspring as retributivism. But a retributivist—at least one who rejects the fantasy that God inflicts such suffering as a matter of cosmic justice—should not base her conception of retributivism on it.

If retributivism were based on the thought that wrongdoers' suffering is good in itself, then punishment is not necessary as a bridge connecting the suffering and the individual bad acts. Suffering becomes fungible, and a retributivist is left with the need to keep a whole-life ledger of good and bad acts, for which she wants a person to have the appropriate amount of whole-life happiness or suffering (Ezorsky 1972: xxvi; Tadros 2011: 68). But the idea of tracking all of a person's good and bad deeds, and all of her happiness or suffering, and aiming to align them is highly problematic. First, it would undermine the idea that punishment should be doled out for particular wrongs, as punishers would instead have reason to make up for wrongs that went unpunished, while keeping track of all good deeds that should mitigate punishment. Second, it implies that one could bank good deeds and “earn the ability to commit misdeeds with impunity” (Alexander 2013: 318). Third, if a desert agent is optional, then Dolinko's question about how punishers get from desert to a right to punish re-emerges, for then it looks like desert must concern good outcomes, not rights—see section The better position, therefore, relinquishes the illusory appeal of the idea of cosmic justice—if there is a God, let God handle cosmic justice—and locates the value of suffering in the context of a desert agent giving a wrongdoer the punishment he deserves for a particular wrong.

4.3.3 Subjective suffering or measures expected to cause suffering

Adam Kolber, no retributivist, argues that retributivists cannot escape a subjective approach to punishment, one which, he argues, also causes problems for them.

To be retributively punished, the person punished must find the punishment aversive and the severity of the punishment is at least partly a function of how aversive he finds it. (2009: 215)

Kolber continues:

Retributivists who fail to consider variation in offenders' actual or anticipated experiences of punishment are not measuring punishment severity properly and are therefore punishing disproportionally. (ibid.; see also Bronsteen et al. 2009: 1068–1072)

Yet, such variation would be intuitively problematic for retributivists, calling, for example, for short sentences for those who would suffer a lot in prison, even if they would pose a danger to society, and for extra harsh treatment for those who find prison easy to handle.

Many retributivists disagree with Kolber's claim that the subjective experience of suffering of particular individuals should be a significant concern for them. As Andrew von Hirsch and Andrew Ashworth put it:

What makes punishments more or less onerous is not any identifiable sensation; rather, it is the degree to which those sensations interfere with people's legitimate interests

—interests people generally share, such as in

freedom of movement, choice regarding … activities, choice of associates, privacy, and so on. (von Hirsch and Ashworth 2005: 147; see also Gray 2010; Markel and Flanders 2010).

Kolber's argument also has a flaw in it. He starts with two sound premises: (a) that some experience more suffering with a given punishment than others, and (b) that such differences must be justified. But his conclusion—that retributivists must justify imposing greater subjective suffering on some rather than others as a matter of retributive justice—does not follow. As was pointed out in section 2.1, punishment must be intentional; what results as a mere side-effect of punishment is not itself part of the punishment. Retributivists can intend to impose punishments that will generally be experienced as more severe the more serious the wrong for which they are imposed—for example, longer prison terms or more austere prisons—knowing but not intending that different people will experience the same term in the same prison differently.

Of course, even unintended differences in suffering are morally significant. But they can justifiably be caused if (a) the punishment that leads to them is itself deserved, (b) the importance of giving wrongdoers what they deserve is sufficiently high, and (c) the problems with eliminating the unintended differences in experienced suffering are too great to be overcome. This last condition is arguably the case with regard to most variations in the experience of punishment. The reason is that individual tailoring has a number of problems that would be hard to overcome: (1) it invites gaming the system; (2) it would be perceived by some as unfair because those who claim to be extra sensitive would seem to be given undo leniency, and that would lead to resentment and extra conflict; (3) it would undermine predictability, and it would likely lead to abuse of power; and (4) with regard to those who are relatively insensitive to punishment, it would seem to call for brutality or torture that the state should not want to condone. It can also be less problematic to cause most variations in the experience of punishment than it may at first seem if people are to some degree responsible for their own hypersensitivity—compare Rawls's thought that people are responsible for their own preferences (Rawls 1975: 261). Finally, the state should accommodate people who would suffer extreme trauma from normal punishments, but that does not imply that the punishers should try to tailor the subjective experience of suffering to be proportional to the crime.

4.4 Proportionality

Retributive justice holds that it would be bad to punish a wrongdoer more than she deserves, where what she deserves must be in some way proportional to the gravity of her crime. Inflicting disproportionate punishment wrongs her just as, even if not quite as much as, punishing an innocent person wrongs her (Gross 1979: 436).

The possibility of punishing less than deserved is also normatively significant, but it provides a much weaker constraint. First, it does not seem to wrong anyone in particular (see Duus-Otterström 2013: 472–475). One might think that the victims of crime are wronged if wrongdoers are not punished. Arguably this view was held by Kant (1797: 142) who wrote that if a people do not insist on the execution of murderers, “blood guilt” would “cling” to them “as collaborators in this public violation of justice”—though this text might better be read as an assertion that the people have an obligation to do justice, not for the victim, but for the integrity of the law (see Hill 1999: 443). But the view that it wrongs victims not to punish wrongdoers confuses vengeance, which is victim-centered, with retributivism, which is agent-centered: concerned with giving the wrongdoer the punishment he deserves (see Paul Robinson's 2008 contrast between vengeful and deontological conceptions of deserved punishment). Second, it is clear that in any criminal justice system that allows plea-bargaining, intentional deviations below desert will have to be tolerated. Russell Christopher (2003) has argued that retributivists cannot accept plea-bargaining. But he bases his argument on a number of unsound assumptions, including that “[r]etributivism imposes an absolute duty to punish culpable wrongdoers whenever the opportunity arises” (ibid.: 101), and that punishing a wrongdoer less than he deserves violates his “right to punishment” (ibid.: 128–129). Both of these have been rejected above. Christopher correctly notes that retributivists desire to treat equally culpable people alike (ibid.: 131). But this desideratum can be sacrificed for the sake of other goods, as long as no one is punished to a disproportionately large degree.

This leaves two fundamental questions that an account of proportionality must address: how should we measure the gravity of a wrong, and how can a punishment be “proportional” to it? After these are address in sections 4.4.1 and 4.4.2, criticisms of retributivism based on problems with proportionality will be addressed in 4.4.3.

4.4.1 Measuring the gravity of a wrong

Two dimensions of wrongdoing figure most prominently in its gravity: the magnitude of the harm or wrong inflicted or risked, and the culpability of the wrongdoer for bringing it about or risking it. The difficulty, as regards proportionality, is in bringing these two dimensions together into a single dimension of “gravity”. Consider Hart's question (1968: 162): “Is negligently causing the destruction of a city worse than the intentional wounding of a single policeman?”

Other complexities only add to that fundamental difficulty. First, does it matter if harm is caused, or is the gravity of the wrong set fully by the wrong risked or intended? (For the position that harm does not matter, see Feinberg 1995; Alexander, Ferzan, and Morse 2009; for a criticism of that view, see Levy 2005; Walen 2010. The Model Penal Code, 5.05(1), aspires to reject the relevance of harm caused, but does not do so completely.)

Second, what significance, if any, should be given to the difference between being punished for the first time, and having been punished before and then having committed the same or a similar wrong again? Many retributivists resist the idea that past convictions should matter, on the grounds that having been punished already, more severe punishment for the next wrong would effectively constitute double punishment for the first (Fletcher 2000: 462; Singer 1979: ch. 5). Others think there is a way around this problem. One approach is to hold the repeat offender guilty of a culpable omission: the failure “to organize his life in a way that reduces the risk of his reoffending” (Lee 2009: 578). Another is to defend a first-offender discount, reflecting human susceptibility to temptation (frailty). This discount would progressively diminish for subsequent comparable offenses, effectively raising the offender's culpability (von Hirsch and Ashworth 2005: 148–155), and it would apply only to lesser wrongs, as it is hard to sympathize with frailty when it comes to serious crimes such as rape or murder (Duff 2001: 169). Both versions of a recidivist premium should be distinguished from Duff's view that persistent dangerous offenders may effectively forfeit their right to be treated as equal citizens (ibid.: §4.2).

Third, do the background conditions in which a wrongdoer acts affect her culpability for a particular wrong? Some think that coming from a severely deprived or “rotten social background” undermines a wrongdoer's culpability (Bazelon 1976; Delgado 1985; Gardner 1998; Delgado 2011). Others think coming from such a background is a “tragedy, but it should not be a defense to crime” (Morse 2011). Others distinguish ways in which it might be relevant to punishment, not because it limits what a proportional punishment can be, but because it calls for compassion (von Hirsch and Ashworth 2005: §5.3.1) or disqualification of the state—see section 4.2.

Despite all these sources of complication (and there are others; see Feinberg 1995: 132), there is empirical evidence that people across a wide range of demographics can rank order even subtle variations of “core wrongs…—physical aggression, takings without consent, and deception in exchanges—” with surprising consistency (Robinson and Kurzban 2007: 1892). These subtle variations involve, for example, two thefts differing primarily only in that one involved sneaking into an open garage while the other involved breaking into a locked house (ibid.: 1895). Not every one of the complicating variables just mentioned was tested in the studies, but extreme concerns about arbitrariness in rankings are somewhat alleviated by them.

4.4.2 Punishment proportional to a crime

There are two basic senses of proportionality: cardinal and ordinal. Cardinal proportionality sets absolute measures for punishment that is proportional to a given crime; ordinal proportionality requires only that more serious crimes should be punished more severely.

Lex Talionis (section 3.4) offers a theory of cardinal proportionality. In its traditional form—an eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth—it seems implausible, both for being too lenient in some cases (take $10 from a thief who stole $10), and too extreme in others (repeatedly torture and rape someone who had committed many such acts himself). Kant proposed what might be thought a better version, saying that the thief should lose not just the value of what he stole, but instead all rights to property (1797: 142), and prohibiting those forms of “mistreatment that could make the humanity in the person suffering it into something abominable” (ibid.). Nonetheless, his measure for theft swings to the overly punitive side, leaving the convicted thief a dependent on the state, and thereby “reduced to the status of a slave for a certain time, or permanently if the state sees fit” (ibid.). Others have tried to rehabilitate lex talionis, arguing, for example, that it can be rendered plausible if interpreted to call for punishment that “possess[es] some or all of the characteristics that made the offense wrong” (Waldron 1992: 35). But however one spells out the wrong-making characteristics, it seems likely that lex talionis will provide a measure either too vague to be of much help (see Shafer-Landau 1996: 299–302; 2000: 197–198), or too specific to be plausible (at least in some cases).

A purely ordinal approach, however, also has problems. If all that were required to do justice is to rank order wrongs by their gravity and then provide a mapping onto a range of punishments that likewise went from lighter to more serious—respecting the norms of rank-ordering and parity—then neither the range of punishments from a fine of $1 up to a fine of $100, nor from 40 years to 60 years in prison, would provide disproportionate punishment, no matter what the crimes. This seems wrong. Murder should not be punished with a $100 fine, and littering should not be punished with 40 years in prison. Some vague degree of cardinality therefore seems to be called for, punishing grave wrongs with heavy penalties and minor wrongs with light penalties.

The possibility of anchoring certain punishments within these broad bands of acceptable cardinal values, and then using ordinal proportionality to fill in the spaces between these anchor points, arguably provides for an acceptable and complete scale of proportional punishment (see Kleinig 1973: 123–124). If one believes that it is also possible to have a sense for relative degree of gravity, then such an anchored ordinal system can prevent clustering near any anchor point, and provide a fairly precise, plausible scale of proportional punishment that could be used in any given jurisdiction (von Hirsch and Ashworth 2005: §9.3). It is worth emphasizing that such a scale would not have universal application. It would depend on a jurisdiction choosing certain anchor points within the acceptable ranges, and thus would apply only within that jurisdiction. But if such jurisdictional variation can be tolerated, then the scales so provided would be far less vague and open to consequentialist input in setting punishment than the scale embraced by limiting retributivism—see section 3.5.

Parsimony adds downward normative pressure to the range of anchoring points. The idea is that since punishment involves suffering, it should be inflicted as minimally as possible, consistent with the vague limits of cardinal desert and any other goals (including deterrence and incapacitation) that should be cited to help provide a full justification for punishment. Any excessive punishment, it can be argued, is a sign of cruelty. Some think that retributivism is inherently inclined towards cruel harshness (Dolinko 1991; Garland 2001; Whitman 2003; Ristroff 2009), but this is a mistake (Robinson 2008; Flanders 2010; Gray and Huber 2010; Duus-Otterström 2013). Importantly, parsimony is not to be confused with mercy. Mercy involves giving a wrongdoer less than she deserves out of compassion or humanitarian concern for her wellbeing (Hampton in Murphy and Hampton 1988: 158–159; Gray 2010: 1692). Parsimony is a reason for lowering the scale of punishments from which one can determine what a wrongdoer deserves, again within any given jurisdiction.

While the idea of a scale of punishments may suggest a certain linear simplicity, it is important to keep in mind that the severity of a punishment depends on at least two dimensions: the degree of harshness, and its duration or repetition (for corporal punishment). One might think that duration and harshness can simply be traded off, but retributivists have reason favor shorter, harsher punishments over longer, more lenient ones (Tomlin forthcoming). In brief, it is bad, from a retributive point of view, if a wrongdoer does not get the punishment he deserves, and the longer it takes for him to get the full punishment he deserves, the greater the chance that he will either die or change in such a way that it is no longer reasonable to punish him for what he did.

4.4.3 Criticisms of retributivism based on problems with proportionality

Greg Roebuck and David Wood (2011) claim that it is incumbent on punishers to demonstrate that the punishment they propose to inflict is not disproportionately large. Given that moral anchoring can provide at best a very rough set of guidelines for proportional punishment, and that the methods of extrapolating from or interpolating between them are also highly underdetermined, they argue that no one can meet this burden. Therefore, a retributive commitment to proportionality would require the abolition of punishment.

This critique rests on the premise that there might be true proportional punishments that any actual punishment might exceed, no matter how parsimonious the scale of punishment on which it rests. But a more plausible reading of the vagueness of anchors and the process of reasoning from them is that they provide an acceptable range in which to build an internally consistent schedule of punishments. Thus a more reasonable conclusion to draw, in the face of epistemic uncertainty, is that any given schedule of punishments should stick to the lower end of the intuitively acceptable spectrum of punishments (Duus-Otterström 2013).

Claire Finkelstein (2004) raises a different sort of proportionality-based objection to retributivism, one based on the shortcomings of lex talionis. She claims that “retributivists' theory of punishment was supposed itself to answer the question of which punishments are morally acceptable and which are not” (ibid.: 213). Lex talionis at least promised to explain what sorts of punishments are justified, but if it fails, as it does, then it seems that retributivism cannot account for why we find certain punishments acceptable—primarily imprisonment, fines, community service, probation, the loss of certain rights, and possibly the death penalty—and reject others, such as torture, shaming punishments, or forced sterilization (ibid.: 212–213).

The problem with Finkelstein's objection is that she assigns to retributivists a task that they have no reason to accept. Yes, proportionality should rule out certain punishments on the ground that they are disproportionately large. But there is no reason for retributivists not to look to other criteria, such as respect for human dignity, to prohibit those forms of punishment that seem cruel or degrading. (Determining how to handle the death penalty, however—determining whether it can ever be a proportional punishment and whether it is ruled out as cruel or degrading—is a particularly thorny problem, beyond the scope of this entry. For a brief survey of the difficulty, see Edmundson 2002.)

Adam Kolber (2013) raises the most difficult proportionality-based criticism of retributivism. He that starts from the observation that countries that use pre-trial detention seem universally to give those who are convicted credit for the time they have served. For example, if someone gets a sentence of a year, and has spent six months in jail in pre-trial detention, he would have to serve only six additional months. Serving the full year, after spending six months in jail already, would seem to be a disproportionate sentence. But it is very hard to explain the intuition that this practice is morally required in any way other than by recognizing that harsh treatment inflicted in connection with a crime is relevant to the size of the punishment, even if it wasn't intended as punishment at the time it was inflicted. If, however, harsh treatment inflicted in connection with a crime counts towards the size of the punishment, then we seem to be thrown back onto the sort of view about suffering rejected in section 4.3.3, the view that what matters is how much a person suffers, whether or not the suffering was inflicted as part of a punishment.

Some of the problems with the view that suffering itself is what a retributivist should care about have already been mentioned. But one more should be brought up here, namely the implication for post-sentence deprivations, such as being subject to preventive detention if one is predictably very dangerous. One might argue that the punishment in those cases includes losing the normative status of benefiting from the presumption of innocence after serving one's term of punitive detention (Walen 2011). But if actual detention matters for proportionate sentencing in the pre-trial context, it must matter as well for the post-sentence context, and this would make it effectively impossible to pursue both proportionate punishment and post-sentence detention.

This is a difficult problem for retributivists. They might want to respond by saying that liberty deprivation that is not intended as punishment can be justified if and only if two conditions are met: (1) punishment is, all things considered, justified, and (2) these other deprivations can be avoided only at the cost of giving up punishment or causing even worse consequences or independent rights violations—see section 4.3.3. But if they respond to Kolber this way, retributivists cannot claim (contra Husak 1990) that their commitment to proportionality requires them to give credit for pre-trial detention, as pre-trial detention is not meant to be punitive. Perhaps they have other reasons for giving credit for pre-trial detention at sentencing, perhaps reasons of mercy or fairness. But it would be an odd sort of requirement of mercy, as mercy is usually taken to be discretionary. And if called for as a matter of fairness, it is unclear why fairness does not require the other accommodations that Kolber notes and that nonetheless seem counter-intuitive. This is not to say that retributivists could not come up with an adequate response to Kolber, but they have work to do.

4.5 Strength of retributive reasons

How strong are retributive reasons? As was argued in section 3.2, even if they are weak, the presence of positive desert makes a difference to the justification of punishment. It affects how one understands whether punishment respects the dignity of the punished wrongdoer. And it might affect how one understands the forfeiture of the right not to be punished. These issues concern whether the practice of punishment can be morally justified. It is a separate question, however, whether positive desert plays much of a role in establishing an all-things-considered reason to punish. If positive desert provides a strong reason for action, then there might be little to no need for non-retributive reasons to justify punishment; if positive desert provides a weak reason to punish, then punishment may often not be justified unless there are strong non-retributive reasons to punish.

To be more precise, there are actually two ways the strength or weakness of retributive reasons can be significant. It may (a) affect whether an individual wrongdoer should be punished, even if no instrumental good (primarily deterrence and incapacitation) would thereby be achieved, but it may also (b) affect whether institutions of punishment should be established, even if no instrumental goods would thereby be achieved. It may be relatively easy to justify punishing a wrongdoer by appeal to positive desert, even if his punishment yields no instrumental benefits, if the institutions of punishment are already up, running, and paid for (Moore 1997: 100–101; Husak 2000: 995). It is another matter to claim that the institutions of punishment, given all their costs, can be justified by positive desert alone. The point of saying this is not to suggest, in the spirit of Hart (1968: 9) that the justification of institutions of criminal justice should be purely consequentialist. The retributivist sees desert as a reason for setting up the institutions as well as for punishing the individual wrongdoer (Moore 1997: 154). The point is merely that one should be clear about just what one is assessing when weighing costs and benefits.

The primary costs of establishing the institutions of criminal punishment are:

  1. Financial: (according the U.S. Bureau of Justice Statistics, states spent over $38 billion on corrections in 2001) with corresponding opportunity costs (that money could have been spent on schools, medical research, infrastructure, or taxpayer refunds, to name only a few alternatives);
  2. Errors (convicting the innocent, disproportionately punishing the guilty, and punishing those who deserve no punishment under laws that overcriminalize);
  3. The risk of the abuse of power (political and other forms of oppressive uses of the criminal justice system); and
  4. Collateral harm to innocents (e.g., the families of convicts who lose the support from those who are punished). (See Husak 2000 for the first three.)

It is implausible that these costs can be justified simply by the importance of punishing wrongdoers as they deserve to be punished. The only plausible way to justify these costs is if criminal punishment has large instrumental benefits in terms of crime prevention (Husak 2000; Cahill 2011).

Importantly, this point is not lost even on those retributivists who are least inclined to cite instrumental benefits in support of punishment. For example, Michael Moore says:

in any accounting about setting up institutions to achieve justice, against enforcement and other costs we must balance any benefits. One obvious benefit punishment gives is crime prevention, through deterrence, education, and incapacitation. (Moore 1997: 151)

The interesting question, at the end of the day, then, is whether, given that institutions of punishment exist, there is a range of cases for which the instrumental costs of punishment exceed the benefits, but the intrinsic value of deserved punishment nonetheless justifies extending punishment to this range of wrongdoers. The point is not that punishment could be justified in such cases only if there is a retributive justification for doing so. Institutional commitments to punish certain kinds of wrongdoers might justify doing so even if the costs outweigh the benefits. They might do so if the institutions cannot be more finely tailored to track the line between efficient and inefficient punishment. Nevertheless, those are the sorts of cases in which the strength of retributivist reasons to punish are mostly likely to make a difference.

4.6 Retributive consequentialism versus retributive deontology

Retributivism seems to contain both a deontological and a consequentialist element. Its negative desert element is deontological. It is a conceptual, not a deontological, point that one cannot punish another whom one believes to be innocent (section 2.1). But it is a deontological point that an avenue of justification for harsh treatment is opened up if one believes that the person is guilty and therefore forfeits his right not to be so treated. A negative retributivist would, at that point, recognize that a certain class of consequentialist goals, having to do with deterrence and incapacitation, can now be cited to justify punishing the wrongdoer. A retributivist would add the element of positive desert to the justificatory reasons that a negative retributivist would cite. Both are to be contrasted with consequentialists who reject both the restriction on using people merely as a means of deterring others, and the existence of a liberty right not to be incapacitated even if believed to be dangerous, and who therefore do not see the need to cite any rights forfeiture to justify harsh treatment as long as it is a lesser evil.

Insofar as retributivism holds that it is intrinsically good if a legitimate punisher punishes the guilty, it seems to have a consequentialist element. This good has to be weighed against other possible goods to decide what it would be best to do. Thus most retributivists would accept that it is justifiable to forego punishing one deserving person if doing so would make it possible to punish two equally deserving people, or one more deserving person—as happens on a regular basis in plea-bargaining (Moore 1997: 157–158; Berman 2011: 451–452). See section 4.4.

Moore entertains the idea that one could take an absolutist sort of deontological attitude towards the positive duty to punish. In that spirit, one could assert that it is always wrong to make the sorts of tradeoffs made in plea-bargaining, or indeed in deciding to devote resources to anything other than punishing the guilty if those resources might help ensure that the guilty are punished. Obviously, this position is too extreme to be of any practical use unless one is a “threshold deontologist”, willing to put aside deontological restrictions when the harm of abiding by them is too great (Moore 1997: 158). This, however, is an implausibly brittle form of deontology—absolutist until it snaps. A more plausible view of deontology is one in which deontological reasoning determines how and when consequences count (Kumm and Walen 2014). For example, it is a deontological claim that it is harder to justify causing harm than allowing harm, but that does not mean that it is a violation of a deontological constraint to cause a small harm in the course of preventing a larger one. Likewise, a retributivist can hold that there is a deontological reason to punish the guilty, while acknowledging that that reason should be weighed against other reasons when determining whether to devote resources to punishment or other valuable goals.

Mitch Berman (2011) has argued that retributivism can appropriately be understood not just as having a consequentialist element, but as having an instrumentalist element, namely that punishment is a valuable tool in achieving the suffering that a wrongdoer deserves. But he argues that retributivism can also be understood as non-instrumentalist if the desert object is punishment, not suffering. It would be non-instrumentalist because punishment would not be a means to achieving the good of suffering; it would be good in itself. As argued in section 4.3, punishment, not suffering, should be thought of as the proper retributive desert object, and thus the instrumentalist conception should be rejected.

5. The question of justification

The principal focus of concern with justifying retributivism is justifying its desert object. If censure and harsh treatment are deserved in the way discussed in section, then forfeiture of the right not to be punished seems unproblematic. The question is, can we justify the claim that wrongdoers deserve censure and harsh treatment?

Censure is surely the easier of the two. It respects the wrongdoer as a responsible agent to censure her, and it respects the victim (if there is one) to stand up for her as someone whose rights should have been respected. The core challenge for justifying retributivism, then, is justifying the claim that harsh treatment is equally deserved.

As Michael Moore (1997: 106) points out, there are two general strategies for justifying retributive harsh treatment: (1) showing how such treatment “follows from some yet more general principle of justice that we think to be true”, and (2) showing that it fits with a theory of punishment that “best accounts for those of our more particular judgments that we also believe to be true”. These will be handled in reverse order.

5.1 Conformity with our considered judgments

The argument here has two prongs. First, most people intuitively think that it is important to punish wrongdoers with proportional harsh treatment, even if no other good would thereby be brought about. Second, there is no reason to doubt that these intuitions are reliable.

It seems clear that the vast majority of people share the retributive intuition that makes up the first prong (Moore 1997: 101). The weakness of this strategy is in prong two. There is good reason to suspect that retributive intuitions are merely the reflection of emotions, such as a thirst for vengeance, that are morally dubious. They may be deeply grounded in our species as part of our evolutionary history, but that fact by itself is insufficient to consider them morally reliable—compare other deeply engrained emotional impulses, such as tribalism, that are clearly morally problematic (Bloom 2013). Moreover, the label vengeance is not merely used as a pejorative; a retributive or vengeful response to wrongdoing has to confront moral arguments that it is a misplaced reaction. Foremost among these is the argument that we do not really have free will—see section Respect for the dignity of wrongdoers as agents may call for censuring them when they do wrong, and with requiring them to make reparations when those can be made. It is unclear, however, why it calls, in addition, for harsh treatment. Rather, sympathy for wrongdoers as products of their brains and environment seems to call for mercy and forgiveness (for a contrary view, see Levy forthcoming).

Moore (1997: 145) has an interesting response to this sort of criticism. He turns to the first-person point of view. He imagines that he has committed some horrible violent crime, and then says that he hopes his response “would be that I would feel guilty unto death”. As a result, he hopes that he would welcome punishment for having committed such a crime. Moore then turns the table and says that one should resist the “elitist and condescending” temptation to withhold that judgment from others (ibid.: 148).

This is a rhetorically powerful move, but at the end of the day, it is a question begging one. It presupposes that guilt and the desire to be punished is appropriate. But why accept that, rather than the view that they are just an internalization of a morally indefensible reaction to wrongdoing, or, as Nietzsche (1887: 60) put it, “bad conscience, … the will to self-violation”. Consider what Jeffrie Murphy (2007: 18) said, as a mature philosopher, looking back on his own efforts to justify retributivism:

[M]y enthusiasm for settling scores and restoring balance through retributive justice may in part have been extensions of what Nietzsche called ‘a soul that squints’—the soul of a shopkeeper or an accountant. If I had been a kinder person, a less angry person, a person of more generous spirit and greatness of soul, would robust retributivism have charmed me to the degree that it at one time did? I suspect not.

The point is not to say that this first justificatory strategy fails. It is to say that it does not succeed on its own. It needs to be supplemented by a theoretical justification for punitive harsh treatment that ties it to a more general set of principles of justice. Only in this way can one feel confident that retributive intuitions are a form of insight into retributive justice, rather than the crabbed judgments of a squinty soul.

5.2 Fairness and free riding

Arguably the most popular theoretical framework for justifying retributivism in the past fifty years or so has been Herbert Morris's (1968) appeal to fairness. The idea is that it is to our mutual benefit to live in society, and that to be in society, we have to accept certain limits on our behavior.

If a person fails to exercise self-restraint even though he might have… he renounces a burden which others have voluntarily assumed and thus gains an advantage which others, who have restrained themselves, do not possess. (ibid.: 33)

His unfair advantage should be erased by “exacting the debt” (ibid.: 34). This is done with harsh treatment.

Though influential, the problems with this account are serious. First, it is unclear that criminals have advantages that others have forsaken. Suppose someone murders another in a moment of anger, triggered by a minor offense. Does he get the “advantage” of getting to express his anger? What if most people feel they can express their anger sufficiently in such situations by expressing it in words? Then it seems that the only advantage he has is being able to express his anger violently. But if most people do not, at least not upon reflection, wish to do that sort of thing, then he is not renouncing a burden that others too wish to renounce.

Even if there is some sense in which he gains an advantage over others, such as the advantage of being free to use violence, what would then be the proper measure of bringing him back in line? To see the problem, compare how “far ahead” such a murderer is likely to get to the advantages someone might get by economic fraud. Fraud may produce a much greater advantage, but we normally think that violence is the greater crime. (Davis 1993 challenges this framing of the advantage gained, suggesting the right test is the value a crime would find at an auction of licenses to commit crimes; Shafer-Landau 1996: 303 rejects this solution as equally implausible.)

More problematically yet, it seems to be fundamentally missing the point to say that the crime of, for example, murder is, at bottom, free riding rather than unjustly killing another. (For these and related criticisms, see Braithwaite & Pettit 1990: 158–159; Dolinko 1991: 545–549; Murphy 2007: 13–14.)

An alternative interpretation of Morris's idea is that the relevant benefit is the opportunity to live in a relatively secure state, and the wrong is not the gaining of an extra benefit but the failure to accept the burdens that, collectively, make that benefit possible. Punishment then removes the benefit that the wrongdoer cannot fairly lay claim to, having shirked the burden that it was his due to carry (see Westen forthcoming). This interpretation avoids first of the problems outlined above. But it still has difficulty accounting for the thought that a crime such as murder is not fundamentally about free riding. Moreover, it has difficulty accounting for proportional punishment in a plausible way. Presumably, the measure of a proportional punishment would be something like this: the greater the shirking of one's duty to accept the burdens of self-restraint, the larger should be one's punishment. But how do we measure the degree of shirking? By the harm one causes or risks causing, by the benefit one receives, or by the degree to which respecting the burden shirked would have been burdensome? Only the first corresponds with a normal retributive notion of punishment, but this alternative reading seems to point to one of the latter two meanings as the measure of unjust gain. In addition, this view seems to imply that one who entered a secure society from some sort of failed state, and who has not yet benefited from the secure state, cannot be punished if he commits violent criminal acts in the secure state. This is quite an odd implication, though one that a social contract theorist might be willing to accept.

For another attempt to develop a better Morris-like view, making the wrong the undermining of the conditions of trust, see Dimock 1997: 41. For a criticism, see Korman 2003. For an attempt to build on Morris's idea, translating the basic wrong into flouting legitimate, democratic law, see Markel 2011.

5.3 Vindicating victims by defeating wrongdoers

Jean Hampton tried to improve upon the unfair advantage theory by focusing on the idea that what wrongdoers (at least those who have victims) do is an affront to the victim, not just to the whole community. Her view is that punishment must somehow annul this affront. As she puts it:

If I have value equal to that of my assailant, then that must be made manifest after I have been victimized. By victimizing me, the wrongdoer has declared himself elevated with respect to me, acting as a superior who is permitted to use me for his purposes. A false moral claim has been made… The retributivist demands that the false claim be corrected. The lord must be humbled to show that he isn't the lord of the victim. … [R]etributive punishment is the defeat of the wrongdoer at the hands of the victim (either directly or indirectly through an agent of the victim's, e.g., the state) that symbolizes the correct relative value of wrongdoer and victim. It is a symbol that is conceptually required to reaffirm a victim's equal worth in the face of a challenge to it. (Murphy and Hampton 1988: 125–126)

This theory too suffers some serious problems. First, why think that a wrongful act seriously challenges the equal moral standing of all? It may imply that the wrongdoer thinks of himself as above either the law in general or his victim in particular. But he's simply mistaken. Unless there is a danger that people will believe he is right, it is not clear why there is a pressing need to correct him.

Second, even if the message is offensive in a way that calls for correction, why isn't the solution simply to reaffirm the moral status of the victim, to censor the wrongdoer, and perhaps to require the wrongdoer to make compensation? The answer may be that “actions speak louder than words”. Perhaps some punishment may then be necessary to show that we really mean it when we say that he was mistaken. But why wouldn't it be sufficient to inflict “the punishment”—whatever that is—to reinforce the point? It's unclear why the punishment should rise above some baseline-level, in proportion with the gravity of the wrong, to show that “we mean it”.

Third, the message of equality through turning the tables seems peculiar. If the victim, with the help of others, gets to take her turn being lord, it is not clear how that sends the message of equality, rather than simply the message that this particular wrongdoer lost in the competition to be “lord”.

Fourth, Hampton seems to have fallen into a trap that also was a problem for Morris, namely substituting one wrong for another. The wrong of being raped is not the message that the rapist sends; it is the rape. (For variations on these criticisms, see Dolinko 1991: 551–554; for Hampton's replies to her critics, see Hampton 1992.)

5.4 Communication theories

Antony Duff (2001 and 2011) offers a communication theory according to which punishment is necessary to communicate censure for wrongdoing. It might be objected that his theory is too narrow to provide a justificatory framework for retributivism generally, because it is framed as a theory for legal punishment, meted out by a state that governs a community of equal citizens. (The same applies to the similar theory developed by Markel 2011.) But arguably it could be extended to any community.

Putting that issue aside, the main question is whether the theory can account for harsh treatment. As Duff raises the issue:

Censure can … be communicated by ‘hard treatment’ punishments …—by imprisonment, by compulsory community service, by fines and the like, which are burdensome independently of their censorial meaning…: but why should we choose such methods of communication, rather than methods that do not involve hard treatment? (Duff 2013)

One answer he gives is that:

[P]enal hard treatment [is] an essential aspect of the enterprise of moral communication itself. Punishment, on this view, should aim not merely to communicate censure to the offender, but to persuade the offender to recognize and repent the wrong he has done, … and to make apologetic reparation to those whom he wronged. [The] hard treatment aspects [of his punishment], the burden it imposes on him, should serve both to assist the process of repentance and reform, by focusing his attention on his crime and its implications, and as a way of making the apologetic reparation that he owes. (ibid.)

The problem, however, as Duff is well aware, is that it is not clear why “hard treatment [is] a necessary aspect of a communicative enterprise” (ibid., emphasis added). One might think it is enough if harsh treatment can constitute an important part of communicating to both the wrongdoer and the rest of the community the censure that the wrongdoer deserves. The worry, however, is that it may not suffice to say that harsh treatment is one possible method of communicating censure. Given the normal moral presumptions against imposing suffering on others, it may be necessary to show that without suffering censure cannot be fully or properly communicated.

That may be a particularly difficult thing to show, given that a wrongdoer might voluntarily repent, reform and make reparations, without the help of any punishment. Duff can try to take that into account by saying that certain formalities in punishment, including both censure and the taking on of burdens beyond those of making material reparations, are necessary to repair the social damage done by a crime. The question then is whether this doesn't beg the question in favor of a sort of retributive impulse that seeks to see the wrongdoer suffer before declaring that society and the wrongdoer are reconciled.

Finally, it is peculiar to say that an apology can be forced and at the same time be both meaningful to the hearer and respectful of the speaker (von Hirsch & Ashworth 2005: 94).

6. Conclusion:

Retributive justice has a deep grip on the punitive intuitions of most people. Nevertheless, it has been subject to wide-ranging criticism. Arguably the two most telling criticisms are (1) that its proportionality constraint cannot be met without sacrificing intuitive plausibility, and (2) that theoretical accounts of why wrongdoers positively deserve harsh treatment are inadequate.

If the second of these criticisms is correct, then retributive justice provides an incomplete theory of punishment, one that at most explains why wrongdoers deserve censure and forfeit the right not to be punished up to some proportional limit. To justify actually inflicting harsh treatment, it may be necessary to appeal to other explanations of (1) why harsh treatment is instrumentally valuable, and (2) why harsh treatment is consistent with respect for the wrongdoer.

This second prong may lead back, however, to a search for a better justification for retributivism. This is because the most plausible alternatives seem unable to account for it. They may seem to come close if they invoke something like institutional desert to replace moral desert. They can then hold, roughly, that a wrongdoer cannot reasonably complain that institutions that threaten proportional punishment if he does wrong, and then follow through on the threat if he is duly convicted of wrongdoing, treat him unjustly (Quinn 1985; Hill 1999; Finkelstein 2004; Bedau and Kelly 2010: §4). Surely there is utility in having such institutions, and a person should have a fair chance to avoid punishment—with the rare exception of false convictions—simply by avoiding wrongdoing. Nevertheless, this sort of justification of legal or institutional desert cannot straightforwardly explain the proportionality limit. For that the idea of retributive justice may be essential.

In other words, even if (a) there is utility in threatening people with punishment if they choose to do wrong, (b) people have a fair chance to avoid punishment by choosing not to do wrong, and (c) those who choose to do wrong deserve punishment within some institutional framework, it is not clear how an institutional account can come up with the restriction that only proportional punishment may be threatened.

This limitation to proportional punishment is central to retributivism. The negative desert claim holds that only that much punishment may be inflicted, and the positive desert claim holds that that much punishment, but no more, is morally deserved and in that sense respectful of the wrongdoer. Thus unless one is willing to give up on the idea that morality imposes a proportionality limit and on the importance of positive moral desert for justifying punishment up to that point as respectful of the individual—both intuitively difficult to give up—there is reason to continue to take notion of retributive justice, and the project of justifying it, seriously.


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Other Internet Resources

  • Beyond Intractability, by Michelle Maiese (University of Colorado); updated by Sarah Cast and Heidi Burgess.
  • Punishment, Kevin Murtagh (John Jay College of Criminal Justice), in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


The author would like to thank Michael DaSilva, Kim Ferzan, Beth Henzel, Doug Husak, Ken Levy and an anonymous editor for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for comments on an earlier draft.

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Alec Walen <>

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