Notes to Ibn Sina's Natural Philosophy

1. In Avicenna's cosmological system, the Giver of Forms (wāhib al-ṣuwar) is the last of the emanated Intellects, which itself is associated with the intellect of the Moon. It is also identified with the Active or Agent intellect (ʿaql faʿʿāl) in psychology. There is some dispute over the exact function of the Giver of Forms. On one side, there are those who see the Giver of Forms as the cause of each particular substantial forms that comes to be, e.g., my form of humanity, your form of humanity, etc.; this position is the more traditional reading (Aquinas, De Potentia, q., a. 8; Davidson 1992, pp. 78–79; Janssens 2006). Alternatively, it has recently been persuasively argued that the Giver of Forms is the cause merely of the forms as universals not of their individual instantiation in the physical world (Richardson 2012).

2. According to Aristotelian and Neoplatonic cosmology the motions of the various heavenly bodies, whether the apparent daily motion of the stars, the seemingly erratic and wandering motions of the planets, sun and moon, are all the result of distinct souls uniquely associated with each of those bodies. In other words, for this tradition the heavenly bodies were seen as alive and as such must have a principle of life and animation, which accounts for that specific and particular body's characteristic motions and actions. A soul just is the principle of life and animation, accounting for a body's characteristic motions and actions.

3. Avicenna appears to have had an earlier translation of Aristotle's Physics than the later and more precise one of Isḥāq b. Ḥunayn (Aristotle, [AP]). Most specifically Isḥāq's translation retains the medio-passive sense of Aristotle's original Greek, kineisthai kai hēremein, “to be moved and be at rest,” which he renders as li-an yataḥarraka wa yaskuna, “so that it is subject to being moved [or ”to motion“] and being at rest.” In contrast, Avicenna's text uses the corresponding nominalization, reading li-ḥaraka … wa sukūnihi, “for motion … and being at rest.” The significance of this point is that Avicenna's text more easily lends itself to understanding nature as an active principle. For a discussion of Arabic translations of Greek physical texts see Lammer 2016, ch. 1.

4. Interestingly, while Avicenna's claim about active nature seems antipathetic with Aristotle, Avicenna has the wherewithal to reconcile the two positions, given his understanding of an efficient cause, even if he does not do so in the present context. For Avicenna, what explains why any efficient cause or agent acts is that it is directed toward some end or final cause. Thus the final cause is the cause of the efficient cause's acting, and so in a sense even an efficient cause has a passive element, at least among natural things.

5. The twentieth century mathematician Hermann Weyl reproduced this argument in his criticism of discrete geometries. It is sometimes referred to as the Distance Function Argument or more colloquially as Weyl's Tile Argument.

6. To be exact, in the Salvation (Avicenna, [Sal], IV.2.xi, “On the Finite and the Infinite”) Avicenna in fact allows that there can be (indeed must be) sets with an actual infinity of members. There are, however, two conditions on such actually infinite sets, Avicenna continues. (1) The members cannot have a position essentially, by which he means that the members cannot be material entities, that is bodies. (2) The member cannot be essentially ordered to one another, that is, one cannot stand to another as a cause to an effect. He gives as an example of such an infinite set the actually infinite number of souls that currently exists and indeed to which new members are continuously being added. (For a discussion see Marmura 1960 and McGinnis 2010, §4.)

7. One can find an example of an Avicennan argument against an actual infinity based upon the impossibility of motion at Avicenna, [Ph], 2.8 [8] & Avicenna, [Sal], IV.2.x, “On Place”. (The argument is discussed and explained in McGinnis 2010.) Avicenna's preferred non-motion argument against infinite space in both The Cure and The Salvation, is in fact a variation of an argument from al-Kindī (al-Kindī, [OPS], pp. 28–31, 136–165; English translations in al-Kindī, [PWK], pp. 20–21, pp. 63–8).

8. Strictly speaking, Avicenna argues that rectilinear motion cannot be the contrary of circular motion. Still one might think that, for example, a clockwise motion is the contrary of a counter-clockwise motion. While these two types of motions are distinct, they are not contraries in the strict sense. Contrary motions requires motion to distinct contrary termini. For example, according to the worldview that Avicenna adopts, downward motion is toward a distinct place: the center of the universe. Upward motion is away from the center of the universe. Or again, heating is the contrary of cooling, since hot and cold are distinct contrary states. In circular motion, there are no distinct contrary termini, since the point from which a circular motion begins is the same point toward which it moves. For a fuller analysis of circular motion see section 3.3.2, on positional motion.

9. While Avicenna would not have known of St. Augustine and his Confessions there is a curious similarity between Avicenna's analysis of traversal motion and Augustine analysis of time or duration as an extension of the mind. For a brief discussion of Augustine's theory of duration see the discussion of duration in the entry on the experience and perception of time.

10. Avicenna in fact recognizes that there are two ways that a surface might indicate the place of a body (Avicenna, [Ph], 2.6 [1]). It might indicate the innermost surface of the containing body, as in Aristotle's definition. Alternatively, the surface might be the contacting surface of the placed body itself, a position identified with certain Muslim theologians. While Avicenna acknowledges that this latter understanding does indicate the surface on which a body is placed, it fails to indicate the surface in which a body has its place. (The best study to date of Avicenna's theory of place and his understanding of surface is Lammer 2016, ch. 5, especially pp. 305–30.)

11. Lammer maintains that Avicenna did not intend his initial discussion at Physics, 2.11 [1–2] to be an argument for the existence of time but only to show that there is a particular magnitude associated with motion. Instead, according to Lammer, Avicenna first shows what the essence of time is and then only at Physics, 2.11 [5] does he prove that time exits (Lammer 2016, 399–400). This claim is only half correct. At Kitāb al-Burhān, 1.3–6, the Avicennan text that most closely follows Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, Avicenna discusses how scientific inquiry proceeds from prior knowledge. He notes that the first step of scientific inquiry begins with some pre-scientific notion of what a term (ism), “x” means. As part of this first step, one next proves that x in fact exists, that is, that “x” refers at all. In other word, the first step in a scientific inquiry into x is to see if x exists absolutely. The second step is to provide a rigorous account of what the true essence of x is and then to confirm that x exists as the purported essence claims. Thus contrary to Lammer, Avicenna does begin with a proof that time exists absolutely. The passage that Lammer cites is Avicenna's proof that time exists in the way that Avicenna's account of time's essence suggests.

Copyright © 2016 by
Jon McGinnis <>

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