Notes to Auguste Comte

1. When possible, the quotations are from the translations made by English positivists in the 19th century. Page reference is given first to the French text, and, in the case of the Course of Positive Philosophy, the number of the lesson is given too; then follows the reference to the English translation. For instance (1830 (56), v. 2, 466; E., v. 2, 522 ) refers to the passage of the 56th lesson which is in the second volume of the french edition, p. 466, the translation of which is in the second volume of the english edition, p. 522. The same conventions are used for all Comte’s works.

2. Comte uses “material” in a wide sense, refering to temporal power, in contradistinction to spiritual power. Furthermore, he uses here a term which is difficult to translate: “légiste”; today, “lawyer” means rather “avocat”. As a matter of fact, kings used those légistes in order to enlarge their power against medieval aristocraty; such was for instance Leibniz’s function at the Hannover Court.

3. After the creation of the religion of Humanity, Comte, according to the context, capitalizes or do not capitalize the word.

4. See the first letter Mill sent to Comte (India House, London, 8 nov 1841). Mill wrote in French:

C’est dans l’année 1828, Monsieur, que j’ai lu pour la première fois votre traité de Politique Positive et cette lecture a donné à toutes mes idées une forte secousse, qui, avec d’autres causes, mais beaucoup plus qu’elles, a déterminé ma sortie définitive de la section Benthamiste…

There may, of course, have been some flattery going on.

5. See, for example, H. Taine, in his Le positivisme anglais, étude sur Stuart Mill (1864). Note also that the distinction W. Dilthey drew between Naturwissenschaft and Geisteswissenschaft arose in a critical discussion of Mill’s theory of moral sciences (the last part of the System of Logic). Dilthey considers this, with some reason, as a positivist conception. (See S. Mesure, Dilthey et la fondation des sciences historiques, Paris: PUF, 1990.) It might be surprising that Mill was considered a positivist on the continent. One can ask if this interpretation is correct, but this is another point.

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Michel Bourdeau <>

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