Notes to Civic Education

1. Civic education can also include any type of systematic process that seeks to mobilize people politically, say through public interest or reform groups or through trade or professional associations. As one example of the efficacy of such civic education, see Steven E. Finkel's “Civic Education and the Mobilization of Political Participation in Developing Democracies,” Journal of Politics 64, no. 4, 2002, 994-1020.

2. In this section we refer to philosophers who discussed the education and political participation of men and not of women. This is true of the works of John Stuart Mill that we cite, but not, of course, of his The Subjection of Women. In the sections dealing with modern and contemporary philosophers we have changed the term “good men” to “good person” or “good persons.”

3. William Galston, “Civic Education and Political Participation,” Community Matters: Challenges to Civic Engagement in the 21st Century, Verna V. Gehring (Ed.), Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 2005, p. 23. In 2001 William Damon observed: “Young people across the world have been disengaging from civic and political activities to a degree unimaginable a mere generation ago. The lack of interest is greatest in mature democracies, but it is evident even in many emerging and troubled ones. Today there are no leaders, no causes, no legacy of past trials or accomplishments that inspire much more than apathy or cynicism from the young.” “To Not Fade Away: Restoring Civil Identity Among the Young,” in Ravitch and Viteritti 2001, p. 123.

4. In examining civic education in democracies, it is useful to focus on the educational system of the longest continuous constitutional democracy—the United States. Another advantage of this focus is that the educational system in the United States developed alongside the growth of the republic without having had to overthrow, as Tocqueville pointed out, a hereditary and hierarchical system, including that system's educational prejudices.

5.1989, p. 189. Ironically, as Wolin points out, the power implied—which is “remote, abstract, and virtually unseen”—“bore certain unfortunate resemblances to the kind of power which the colonists had rejected less than two decades earlier when they had rebelled against the authority of the British Crown…” (Idem).

6. We take Dewey to mean by “democracy as a way of life” that democracy creates and needs a democratic culture in which the values that underlie democracy and the uses to which democratic processes can be put are both pervasive. For perhaps the best exposition on democratic culture, its nature and its limits, see Alexis de Tocqueville's Democracy in America.

7. The terms used in describing teaching or education are significant. Both the terms “instill” and “nurture” connote teaching of some kind. But each also connotes a different concept of how that teaching begins. To instill or to inculcate a desire suggests some outside force planting or impressing that desire. Once planted, the desire is then nurtured or nourished. If we begin, however, with the idea of nurturing that desire, then we might think of the literal definition of education: to bring or lead forth or out of (educare). In other words, nurture suggests a desire that is innate but that needs to be developed and nourished; whereas a desire that is instilled is put in from the outside. Most advocates of character education seem to follow the “inculcation” model. Ultimately, however, where the teaching begins is perhaps not as significant as how the teaching proceeds. That process appears to be the same for character education. Whether the condign desires or traits are instilled or nurtured, they need to be developed.

8. For our purposes, and we speak here for the advocates of character education as well as their critics, this distinction will suffice. It may be problematic, however, because definitions of character often refer to temperament or personality. The Oxford Etymological Dictionary, for example, defines character as a “natural tendency or bent of mind, especially in relation to moral or social qualities.” Its editors list “temperament” as a synonym (p. 493).

9. For an extensive treatment of civic education and the Mozert case, see Macedo, 2000, especially chapters six and seven.

10. Even the devil might be said to have some virtues, as Peters (op. cit., p. 43) wryly notes: “A Quaker lady was once told that she would find something good to say even about the devil. To which she replied, ‘Well, he is persistent.’” To this virtue we might add, on the devil's behalf, the virtues of consistency, industry, and imagination, all of which Peters describes as character traits.

11. What's the difference between character education and character indoctrination? Indoctrination is a form of socializing persons into proper behavior or socializing them to hold the “right” values. Education, on the other hand, implies some critical distance from the topics so that persons can reflect on different aspects of and on alternatives to what's presented. Indoctrination, which often carries a negative connotation, is not without an important place in character education, or so I shall argue. Young children need to be socialized before they can be critics.

12. In the mid-1970's public-school teachers rated values clarification as the most widely approved approach to teaching morals. See Macedo 2000, 122-25.

13. This is not to suggest that an ethos of this sort will not itself be controversial. Pierre Bourdieu, for one, argues that when teachers demand “good behavior” from their students, they are perpetuating a system of domination by coercing students to take up pre-determined social and political roles. At the same time, through such demands teachers reinforce their authority and subordinate the students. See Pierre Bourdieu and Jean-Claude Passeron, Reproduction in Education, Society, and Culture, trans. Richard Nice, (London: Sage Publications, 1990), 10.

14. Dewey, 1916/2004, 10-11, 49. See also Harry Boyte, 2004.

15. See Mariana Souto-Manning (2007). Souto-Manning cites L. Chouliaraki and N. Fairclough, Discourse in Late Modernity, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1999 and N. Fairclough, Analysing Discourse: Textual Analysis for Social Research, London: Routledge, 2004 for evidence of the distinction between appropriating language and being colonized by it.

16. Theodore Roosevelt, “Religion and the Public Schools,” Collected Works, 15; quoted in Macedo (2000), p. 93.

Copyright © 2013 by
Jack Crittenden
Peter Levine <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]