Notes to Bradley's Regress

1. Some interpreters might disagree with my unqualified use of “real” in this context. They see Bradley as holding that all attributions of reality and truth come in degrees. On such a reading, Bradley did not think that internal relations have a better chance of being real; rather, he thought of internal relations as having a higher degree of reality than external relations, with neither kind of relation enjoying the highest degree of reality. I disagree with this reading mainly because I do not see Bradley at this stage engaging and applying his doctrine of degrees of truth and reality (which he expounds in chapter XXIV of AR) to relations. The aim of the initial chapters of AR strikes me as purely destructive when it comes to relations.

2. Bradley’s monism is not easy to characterize. He certainly seems committed to the existence of only one thing but it is not always clear how, according to him, the plurality is to be treated within such unity. For more on different types of monism, see the entry on monism (Schaffer 2016). For more on Bradley’s particular type of monism, see the entry F. H. Bradley (Candlish and Basile 2017), and Phemister 2016.

3. Russell writes:

I maintain that there are such facts as that x has the relation R to y, and that such facts are not in general reducible to, or inferable from, a fact about x only and a fact about y only: they do not imply that x and y have any complexity, or any intrinsic property distinguishing them from a z and a w which do not have the relation R. This is what I mean when I say that relations are external. But I maintain also—and it is here that Mr. Bradley sees an inconsistency—that whenever we have two terms x and y related by a relation R, we have also a complex, which we may call “xRy,” consisting of the two terms so related. This is the simplest example of what I call a “complex” or a “unity”. […] A complex differs from the mere aggregate of its constituents, since it is one, not many, and the relation which is one of its constituents enters into it as an actually relating relation, and not merely as one member of an aggregate. I confess I am at a loss how this is inconsistent with the above account of relations, and I suspect that the meaning which I attach to the word “external” is different from Mr. Bradley’s meaning; in fact he seems to mean by an “external” relation a relation which does not relate. (Russell 1910: 374)

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