George Boole

First published Wed Apr 21, 2010; substantive revision Wed Apr 18, 2018

George Boole (1815–1864) was an English mathematician and a founder of the algebraic tradition in logic. He worked as a schoolmaster in England and from 1849 until his death as professor of mathematics at Queen’s University, Cork, Ireland. He revolutionized logic by applying methods from the then-emerging field of symbolic algebra to logic. Where traditional (Aristotelian) logic relied on cataloging the valid syllogisms of various simple forms, Boole’s method provided general algorithms in an algebraic language which applied to an infinite variety of arguments of arbitrary complexity. These results appeared in two major works, The Mathematical Analysis of Logic (1847) and The Laws of Thought (1854).

1. Life and Work

George Boole was born November 2, 1815 in Lincoln, Lincolnshire, England, into a family of modest means, with a father who was evidently more of a good companion than a good breadwinner. His father was a shoemaker whose real passion was being a devoted dilettante in the realm of science and technology, one who enjoyed participating in the Lincoln Mechanics’ Institution; this was essentially a community social club promoting reading, discussions, and lectures regarding science. It was founded in 1833, and in 1834 Boole’s father became the curator of its library. This love of learning was clearly inherited by Boole. Without the benefit of an elite schooling, but with a supportive family and access to excellent books, in particular from Sir Edward Bromhead, FRS, who lived only a few miles from Lincoln, Boole was able to essentially teach himself foreign languages and advanced mathematics.

Starting at the age of 16 it was necessary for Boole to find gainful employment, since his father was no longer capable of providing for the family. After 3 years working as a teacher in private schools, Boole decided, at the age of 19, to open his own small school in Lincoln. He would be a schoolmaster for the next 15 years, until 1849 when he became a professor at the newly opened Queen’s University in Cork, Ireland. With heavy responsibilities for his parents and siblings, it is remarkable that he nonetheless found time during the years as a schoolmaster to continue his own education and to start a program of research, primarily on differential equations and the calculus of variations connected with the works of Laplace and Lagrange (which he studied in the original French).

There is a widespread belief that Boole was primarily a logician—in reality he became a recognized mathematician well before he had penned a single word about logic, all the while running his private school to care for his parents and siblings. Boole’s ability to read French, German and Italian put him in a good position to start serious mathematical studies when, at the age of 16, he read Lacroix’s Calcul Différentiel, a gift from his friend Reverend G.S. Dickson of Lincoln. Seven years later, in 1838, he would write his first mathematical paper (although not the first to be published), “On certain theorems in the calculus of variations,” focusing on improving results he had read in Lagrange’s Méchanique Analytique.

In early 1839 Boole travelled to Cambridge to meet with the young mathematician Duncan F. Gregory (1813–1844), the editor of the Cambridge Mathematical Journal (CMJ)—Gregory had founded this journal in 1837 and edited it until his health failed in 1843 (he died in early 1844, at the age of 30). Gregory, though only 2 years beyond his degree in 1839, became an important mentor to Boole. With Gregory’s support, which included coaching Boole on how to write a mathematical paper, Boole entered the public arena of mathematical publication in 1841.

Boole’s mathematical publications span the 24 years from 1841 to 1864, the year he died from pneumonia. Breaking these 24 years into three segments, the first 6 years (1841–1846), the second 8 years (1847–1854), and the last 10 years (1855–1864), we find that his published work on logic was entirely in the middle 8 years.

In his first 6 career years, Boole published 15 mathematical papers, all but two in the CMJ and its 1846 successor, The Cambridge and Dublin Mathematical Journal. He wrote on standard mathematical topics, mainly differential equations, integration and the calculus of variations. Boole enjoyed early success in using the new symbolical method in analysis, a method which took a differential equation, say:

\[ d^2 y/dx^2 - dy/dx - 2y = \cos(x), \]

and wrote it in the form Operator\((y) =\) cos\((x)\). This was (formally) achieved by letting:

\[ D = d/dx, D^2 = d^2 /dx^2, \text{etc.} \]

leading to an expression of the differential equation as:

\[ (D^2 - D - 2) y = \cos(x). \]

Now symbolical algebra came into play by simply treating the operator \(D^2 - D - 2\) as though it were an ordinary polynomial in algebra. Boole’s 1841 paper “On the integration of linear differential equations with constant coefficients” gave a nice improvement to Gregory’s method for solving such differential equations, an improvement based on a standard tool in algebra, the use of partial fractions.

In 1841 Boole also published his first paper on invariants, a paper that would strongly influence Eisenstein, Cayley, and Sylvester to develop the subject. Arthur Cayley (1821–1895), the future Sadlerian Professor in Cambridge and one of the most prolific mathematicians in history, wrote his first letter to Boole in 1844, complimenting him on his excellent work on invariants. He became a close personal friend, one who would go to Lincoln to visit and stay with Boole in the years before Boole moved to Cork, Ireland. In 1842 Boole started a correspondence with Augustus De Morgan (1806–1871) that initiated another lifetime friendship.

In 1843 the schoolmaster Boole finished a lengthy paper on differential equations, combining an exponential substitution and variation of parameters with the separation of symbols method. The paper was too long for the CMJ—Gregory, and later De Morgan, encouraged him to submit it to the Royal Society. The first referee rejected Boole’s paper, but the second recommended it for the Gold Medal for the best mathematical paper written in the years 1841–1844, and this recommendation was accepted. In 1844 the Royal Society published Boole’s paper and awarded him the Gold Medal—the first Gold Medal awarded by the Society to a mathematician. The next year Boole read a paper at the annual meeting of the British Association for the Advancement of Science at Cambridge in June 1845. This led to new contacts and friends, in particular William Thomson (1824–1907), the future Lord Kelvin.

Not long after starting to publish papers, Boole was eager to find a way to become affiliated with an institution of higher learning. He considered attending Cambridge University to obtain a degree, but was counselled that fulfilling the various requirements would likely seriously interfere with his research program, not to mention the problems of obtaining financing. Finally, in 1849, he obtained a professorship in a new university opening in Cork, Ireland. In the years he was a professor in Cork (1849–1864) he would occasionally inquire about the possibility of a position back in England.

The 8 year stretch from 1847 to 1854 starts and ends with Boole’s two books on mathematical logic. In addition Boole published 24 more papers on traditional mathematics during this period, while only one paper was written on logic, that being in 1848. He was awarded an honorary LL.D. degree by the University of Dublin in 1851, and this was the title that he used beside his name in his 1854 book on logic. Boole’s 1847 book, Mathematical Analysis of Logic, will be referred to as MAL; the 1854 book, Laws of Thought, as LT.

During the last 10 years of his career, from 1855 to 1864, Boole published 17 papers on mathematics and two mathematics books, one on differential equations and one on difference equations. Both books were highly regarded, and used for instruction at Cambridge. Also during this time significant honors came in:

1857 Fellowship of the Royal Society
1858 Honorary Member of the Cambridge Philosophical Society
1859 Degree of DCL, honoris causa from Oxford

Unfortunately his keen sense of duty led to his walking through a rainstorm in late 1864, and then lecturing in wet clothes. Not long afterwards, on December 8, 1864 in Ballintemple, County Cork, Ireland, he died of pneumonia, at the age of 49. Another paper on mathematics and a revised book on differential equations, giving considerable attention to singular solutions, were published post mortem.

The reader interested in an excellent and thorough account of Boole’s personal life is referred to Desmond MacHale’s George Boole, His Life and Work, 1985/2014, a source to which this article is indebted.

  • 1815 — Birth in Lincoln, England
  • 1830 — His translation of a Greek poem printed in a local paper
  • 1831 — Reads Lacroix’s Calcul Différentiel
  • Schoolmaster
  • 1834 — Opens his own school
  • 1835 — Gives public address on Newton’s achievements
  • 1838 — Writes first mathematics paper
  • 1839 — Visits Cambridge to meet Duncan Gregory, editor of the Cambridge Mathematical Journal (CMJ)
  • 1841 — First four mathematical publications (all in the CMJ)
  • 1842 — Initiates correspondence with Augustus De Morgan — they become lifelong friends
  • 1844 — Correspondence with Cayley starts (initiated by Cayley) — they become lifelong friends
  • 1844 — Gold Medal from the Royal Society for a paper on differential equations
  • 1845 — Gives talk at the Annual Meeting of the British Association for the Advancement of Science, and meets William Thomson (later Lord Kelvin) — they become lifelong friends
  • 1847 — Publishes Mathematical Analysis of Logic
  • 1848 — Publishes his only paper on the algebra of logic
  • Professor of Mathematics
  • 1849 — Accepts position as (the first) Professor of Mathematics at the new Queen’s University in Cork, Ireland
  • 1851 — Honorary Degree, LL.D., from Trinity College, Dublin
  • 1854 — Publishes Laws of Thought
  • 1855 — Marriage to Mary Everest, niece of George Everest, Surveyor-General of India after whom Mt. Everest is named
  • 1856 — Birth of Mary Ellen Boole
  • 1857 — Elected to the Royal Society
  • 1858 — Birth of Margaret Boole
  • 1859 — Publishes Differential Equations; used as a textbook at Cambridge
  • 1860 — Birth of Alicia Boole, who will coin the word “polytope”
  • 1860 — Publishes Difference Equations ; used as a textbook at Cambridge
  • 1862 — Birth of Lucy Everest Boole
  • 1864 — Birth of daughter Ethel Lilian Boole, who would write The Gadfly, an extraordinarily popular book in Russia after the 1917 revolution
  • 1864 — Death from pneumonia, Cork, Ireland

2. The Context and Background of Boole’s Work In Logic

To understand how Boole developed, in such a short time, his impressive algebra of logic, it is useful to understand the broad outlines of the work on the foundations of algebra that had been undertaken by mathematicians affiliated with Cambridge University in the 1800s prior to the beginning of Boole’s mathematical publishing career. An excellent reference for further reading connected to this section is the annotated sourcebook From Kant to Hilbert, 1996, by William Ewald, which contains a complete copy of Boole’s Mathematical Analysis of Logic.

The 19th century opened in England with mathematics in the doldrums. The English mathematicians had feuded with the continental mathematicians over the issues of priority in the development of the calculus, resulting in the English following Newton’s notation, and those on the continent following that of Leibniz. One of the obstacles to overcome in updating English mathematics was the fact that the great developments of algebra and analysis had been built on dubious foundations, and there were English mathematicians who were quite vocal about these shortcomings. In ordinary algebra, it was the use of negative numbers and imaginary numbers that caused concern.

The first major attempt among the English to clear up the foundation problems of algebra was the Treatise on Algebra, 1830, by George Peacock (1791–1858). A second edition appeared as two volumes, 1842/1845. He divided the subject into two parts, the first part being arithmetical algebra, the algebra of the positive numbers (which did not permit operations like subtraction in cases where the answer would not be a positive number). The second part was symbolical algebra, which was governed not by a specific interpretation, as was the case for arithmetical algebra, but solely by laws. In symbolical algebra there were no restrictions on using subtraction, etc.

The terminology of algebra was somewhat different in the 19th century from what is used today. In particular they did not use the word “variable”; the letter \(x\) in an expression like \(2x + 5\) was called a symbol, hence the name “symbolical algebra”. In this article a prefix will sometimes be added, as in number symbol or class symbol, to emphasize the intended interpretation of a symbol.

Peacock believed that in order for symbolical algebra to be a useful subject its laws had to be closely related to those of arithmetical algebra. In this connection he introduced his principle of the permanence of equivalent forms, a principle connecting results in arithmetical algebra to those in symbolical algebra. This principle has two parts:

  1. General results in arithmetical algebra belong to the laws of symbolical algebra.
  2. Whenever an interpretation of a result of symbolical algebra made sense in the setting of arithmetical algebra, the result would give a correct result in arithmetic.

A fascinating use of algebra was introduced in 1814 by François-Joseph Servois (1776–1847) when he tackled differential equations by separating the differential operator part from the subject function part, as described in an example given above. This application of algebra captured the interest of Gregory who published a number of papers on the method of the separation of symbols, that is, the separation into operators and objects, in the CMJ. He also wrote on the foundation of algebra, and it was Gregory’s foundation that Boole embraced, almost verbatim. Gregory had abandoned Peacock’s principle of the permanence of equivalent forms in favor of three simple laws, one of which Boole regarded as merely a notation convention. Unfortunately these laws fell far short of what is required to justify even some of the most elementary results in algebra, like those involving subtraction.

In “On the foundation of algebra,” 1839, the first of four papers on this topic by De Morgan that appeared in the Transactions of the Cambridge Philosophical Society, one finds a tribute to the separation of symbols in algebra, and the claim that modern algebraists usually regard the symbols as denoting operators (e.g., the derivative operation) instead of objects like numbers. The footnote:

“Professor Peacock is the first, I believe, who distinctly set forth the difference between what I have called the technical [syntactic] and the logical [semantic] branches of algebra”
credits Peacock with being the first to separate (what are now called) the syntactic and the semantic aspects of algebra. In the second foundations paper (in 1841) De Morgan proposed what he considered to be a complete set of eight rules for working with symbolical algebra.

3. The Mathematical Analysis of Logic (1847)

Boole’s path to logic fame started in a curious way. In early 1847 he was stimulated to launch his investigations into logic by a trivial but very public dispute between De Morgan and the Scottish philosopher Sir William Hamilton (1788–1856)—not to be confused with his contemporary the Irish mathematician Sir William Rowan Hamilton (1805–1865). This dispute revolved around who deserved credit for the idea of quantifying the predicate (e.g., “All \(A\) is all \(B\),” “All \(A\) is some \(B\),” etc.). Within a few months Boole had written his 82 page monograph, Mathematical Analysis of Logic, giving an algebraic approach to Aristotelian logic, then looking briefly at the general theory. (Some say that this monograph and De Morgan’s book Formal Logic appeared on the same day in November 1847.)

Although Boole’s algebra of logic is not the Boolean algebra of power sets \(P(U)\) with the operations of union, intersection and complement, nonetheless the goal of the two algebras is the same, namely to provide an equational logic for the calculus of classes and propositional logic. The name “Boolean algebra” was introduced by Charles Sanders Peirce (1839–1914) and adopted by his friend, the Harvard philosopher Josiah Royce (1855–1916) around 1900, then by Royce’s students and other Harvard mathematicians, and eventually the world. It essentially referred to the modern version of the algebra of logic, introduced in 1864 by William Stanley Jevons (1835–1882), a version that Boole had rejected in their correspondence—see Section 5.1. For this reason the word “Boolean” will not be used in this article to describe the algebra of logic that Boole actually created; instead the name Boole’s algebra will be used.

In MAL, and more so in LT, Boole was interested in the insights that his algebra of logic gave to the inner workings of the mind. This pursuit has met with little favor, and will not be discussed in this article.

3.1 Boole’s Version Of Aristotelian Logic

In pages 15–59, a little more than half of the 82 pages in MAL, Boole focused on a slight generalization of Aristotelian logic, namely augmenting its four types of categorical propositions by permitting the subject and/or predicate to be of the form not-\(X\). In the chapter on conversions, such as Conversion by Limitation—All \(X\) is \(Y\), therefore Some \(Y\) is \(X\)—Boole found the Aristotelian classification defective in that it did not treat contraries, such as not-\(X\), on the same footing as the named classes \(X, Y, Z\), etc. For example, he wanted to be able to convert “No \(X\) is \(Y\)” into “All \(Y\) is not-\(X\)”. (MAL, p. 28)

With his extended version of Aristotelian logic in mind (where contraries enjoy equal billing), he gave (MAL, p. 30) a set of three transformation rules which allowed one to construct all valid two-line categorical arguments (providing you accepted the unwritten convention that simple names like \(X\), and perhaps not-\(X\), denoted non-empty classes).

Regarding syllogisms, Boole did not care for the Aristotelian classification into Figures and Moods as it seemed rather arbitrary (and not well-suited to the algebraic setting). In particular he did not like the requirement that the predicate of the conclusion had to be the major term in the premises.

It is somewhat curious that when it came to analyzing categorical syllogisms, it was only in the conclusion that he permitted his generalized categorical propositions to appear. Among the vast possibilities for hypothetical syllogisms, the ones that he discussed were standard, with one new example added.

3.2 Class Symbols and Elective Symbols

The “Introduction” chapter starts with Boole reviewing the symbolical method. The second chapter, “First Principles”, lets the symbol 1 represent the universe which “comprehends every conceivable class of objects, whether existing or not.” Capital letters \(X, Y, Z,\ldots\) denoted classes. Then, no doubt heavily influenced by his very successful work using algebraic techniques on differential operators, and consistent with De Morgan’s 1839 assertion that algebraists preferred interpreting symbols as operators, Boole introduced the elective symbol \(x\) corresponding to the class \(X\), the elective symbol \(y\) corresponding to \(Y\), etc. The elective symbols denoted elective operators—for example the elective operator “red” when applied to a class would elect (select) the red items in the class. (One can simply replace the elective symbols by their corresponding class symbols and have the interpretation used in LT in 1854.)

3.3 Operations and Laws for Elective Symbols

The first operation Boole introduced was the multiplication \(xy\) of elective symbols. The standard notation \(xy\) for multiplication also had a standard meaning for operators (for example, differential operators), namely one applied \(y\) to an object and then \(x\) is applied to the result. (In modern terminology, this is the composition of the two operators.) Thus, as pointed out by Theodore Hailperin (1916—2014) in his insightful book (1976/1986) on MAL and LT, it seems likely that this established notation convention handed Boole his interpretation of the multiplication of elective symbols as composition of operators.

When one switches to using classes instead of elective operators, as in LT, the corresponding multiplication of two classes results in their intersection—that is, one has \(xy = z\) if and only if \(XY = Z\), where \(XY\) is the intersection of \(X\) and \(Y\).

The first law in MAL was the distributive law

\[ x(u+v) = xu + xv, \]

where Boole said that \(u+v\) corresponded to dividing a class into two parts. This was the first mention of addition in MAL. From LT one can determine the proper interpretation of the addition of elective operators in MAL:

\((x + y)(Z)\) is the union of \(x(Z)\) and \(y(Z)\) provided \(X\) and \(Y\) are disjoint classes; otherwise \(x + y\) is not defined.

Thus addition is a partial operation on elective operators. Likewise one finds that subtraction is defined by:

\((x - y)(Z)\) is \(x(Z) \smallsetminus y(Z)\) provided \(Y\) is contained in \(X\); otherwise \(x - y\) is not defined.

Thus subtraction is also a partial operation on elective operators.

Boole added (MAL, p. 17) the commutative law \(xy = yx\) and the index law \(x^n = x\)—in LT the latter would be replaced by the law of duality \(x^2 = x\) (called the idempotent law in 1870 by the Harvard mathematician Benjamin Peirce (1809–1880), in another context).

After stating the above distributive and commutative laws, Boole believed he was entitled to fully employ the ordinary algebra of his time, saying (MAL, p. 18) that

“all the processes of Common Algebra are applicable to the present system”,

and indeed in addition to the usual algebra of polynomials one sees power series and Lagrange multipliers in MAL.

Boole went beyond the foundations of symbolical algebra that Gregory had used in 1840—he added De Morgan’s 1841 single rule of inference, that equivalent operations performed upon equivalent subjects produce equivalent results.

3.4 Common Algebra

It is likely more difficult for the modern reader to come to grips with the idea that Boole’s algebra is based on ordinary algebra than would have been the case with Boole’s contemporaries—the modern reader has been exposed to modern Boolean algebra (and perhaps Boolean rings). In the mid 1800s the word “algebra” meant, for most mathematicians, simply the algebra of numbers. Boole’s algebra was mainly concerned with polynomials with integer coefficients, and with their values when the variables were restricted to taking on only the values 0 and 1. To put the reader in the proper frame of mind, some of the key polynomials in Boole’s work, along with their values on \(\{0,1\}\), are presented in the following table:

\(x\) y \(1 - x\) \(x - x^2\) \(xy\) \(x + y\) \(x - y\) \(x+y - xy\) \(x+y - 2xy\)
1 1 0 0 1 2 0 1 0
1 0 0 0 0 1 1 1 1
0 1 1 0 0 1 \(-1\) 1 1
0 0 1 0 0 0 0 0 0

Note that all of the polynomials \(p\)(x,y) in the above table, except for addition and subtraction, take values in \(\{0,1\}\) when the variables take values in \(\{0,1\}\). Such polynomials are called switching functions in computer science and electrical engineering, and as functions on \(\{0,1\}\) they are idempotent, that is,  p\(^2 =\) p. The switching functions are exactly the idempotent polynomials in Boole’s algebra.

3.5 Impact of the Index Law

Boole’s three laws for his algebra of logic are woefully inadequate for what follows in MAL. The reader will, for the most part, be well served by assuming that Boole is doing ordinary polynomial algebra augmented by the assumption that any power \(x^n\) of an elective symbol \(x\) can be replaced by \(x\). Indeed one can safely assume that any polynomial equation p = q that holds in the integers is valid in Boole’s algebra. Also any equational argument

\[ p_1 = q_1, \ldots, p_k = q_k \therefore p = q \]

that holds in the integers is valid in Boole’s algebra.
[A note of caution: the argument “\(x^2 = x \therefore x = 1\) or \(x = 0\)” is valid in the integers, but it is not an equational argument since the conclusion is a disjunction of equations, not a single equation.]

In Boole’s algebra, any polynomial \(p(x)\) in one variable can be reduced to a linear polynomial \(ax + b\) since one has

\[\begin{align} a_n x^n + \cdots + a_1 x + a_0 &= a_n x + \cdots + a_1 x + a_0 \\ &= (a_n + \cdots + a_1)x + a_0. \end{align}\]

Likewise any polynomial \(p(x, y)\) can be expressed as \(axy + bx + cy + d\). Etc.

However Boole was much more interested in the fact that \(ax + b\) can be written as a linear combination of \(x\) and \(1-x\), namely

\[ ax + b = (a + b)x + b(1-x). \]

This gives his Expansion Theorem in one variable:

\[ p(x) = p(1)x + p(0)(1-x). \]

The Expansion Theorem for polynomials in two variables is

\[\begin{align} p(x,y) =& p(1,1)xy + p(1,0)x(1-y)\ + \\ & p(0,1) (1 - x)y + p(0,0) (1 - x)(1 - y). \end{align}\]

For example,

\[\begin{align} x + y &= 2xy + x(1-y) + (1-x)y \\ x - y &= x(1-y) - (1-x)y. \end{align}\]

The expressions \(xy, \ldots, (1 - x)(1 - y)\), are called the constituents of \(p(x,y)\)—it would be better to call them the constituents of the variables \(x, y\)—and the coefficients \(p(1,1), \ldots, p(0,0)\) are the modulii of \(p(x,y)\).

Similar results hold for polynomials in any number of variables (MAL, pp. 62–64). In Boole’s algebra there are three important facts about the constituents for a given list of variables:

  1. each constituent is idempotent,
  2. the product of two distinct constituents is 0,
  3. the sum of all the constituents is 1.

The index law, \(x^n = x\), was different from Boole’s two fundamental laws for the common algebra—it only applied to the individual elective symbols, not in general to compound terms that one could build from these symbols. For example, one does not in general have \((x + y)^2 = x + y\) in Boole’s system since, by ordinary algebra with idempotent class symbols, this would imply \(2xy = 0\), and then \(xy = 0\), which would force \(x\) and \(y\) to represent disjoint classes. But it is not the case that every pair of classes is disjoint.

Keeping the laws and valid equational arguments from the algebra of numbers, augmented by the index law, forces addition \(x + y\) to be undefined unless the classes \(X\) and \(Y\) are disjoint. The only place where Boole wrote down the argument showing that addition must be a partial operation was in his unpublished Nachlass—see Boole: Selected Manuscripts …, 1997, edited by Ivor Grattan-Guiness and Gérard Bornet, pp. 91,92.

3.6 Equational Expressions of Categorical Propositions

In the chapter “Of Expression and Interpretation”, Boole said that necessarily the class not-\(X\) is expressed by \(1-x\). This is the first appearance of subtraction in MAL. Boole’s initial equational expressions of the Aristotelian categorical propositions as elective equations (MAL, pp. 21,22) will be called his primary expressions. Then in the next several pages he adds supplementary expressions; of these the main ones will be called the secondary expressions.

Propositions Primary Expressions Secondary Expressions
All \(X\) is \(Y\) \(x = xy\) \(x = vy\)
No \(X\) is \(Y\) \(xy = 0\) \(x = v(1-y)\)
Some \(X\) is \(Y\) \(v = xy\) \(vx = vy\)
Some \(X\) is not \(Y\) \(v = x(1 - y)\) \(vx = v(1 - y)\)

The first primary expression given was for “All \(X\) is \(Y\)”, an equation which he then converted into \(x(1-y) = 0\). This was the first appearance of 0 in MAL. It was not introduced as the symbol for the empty class—indeed the empty class does not appear in MAL. Evidently “\(= 0\)” performed the role of a predicate in MAL, with an equation \(E = 0\) asserting that the class denoted by \(E\) simply did not exist. (In LT, the empty class was introduced, and denoted by 0.)

Boole emphasized that when a premise about \(X\) and \(Y\) is translated into an equation involving \(x, y\) and \(v\), the symbol \(v\) expressed “some”, but only in the context in which it appeared in the premise. For example, “Some \(X\) is \(Y\)” has the primary translation \(v = xy\), which implies the secondary translation \(vx = vy\). This could also be read as “Some \(X\) is \(Y\)”. Another consequence of \(v = xy\) is \(v(1-x) = v(1-y)\). However it was not permitted to read this as “Some not-\(X\) is not-\(Y\)” since \(v\) did not appear with \(1-x\) or \(1-y\) in the premise. Boole’s use of \(v\) in the equational expression of propositions has been a long-standing bone of contention.

The simple algebra and considerable detail in this part of MAL can be appealing to the new reader, but there are complications that need to be dealt with. Does “Some not-\(X\) is \(Y\)” follow from “All not-\(X\) is \(Y\)”? There is a lack of clarity on when to use the primary and secondary equations when analyzing syllogisms, and with what one is permitted to do to derive \(0 = 0\) as a marker that the premises being considered do not belong to a valid syllogism.

Syllogistic reasoning is just an exercise in elimination, namely the middle term is eliminated from the premises to give the conclusion. Elimination was a standard topic in the theory of equations, and Boole borrowed a simple elimination result regarding two equations to use in his algebra of logic—if the premises of a syllogism involved the classes \(X, Y\), and \(Z\), and one wanted to eliminate the middle term \(Y\), then Boole put the equations for the two premises in the form

\[\begin{align} ay + b &= 0 \\ cy + d &= 0 \end{align}\]

where \(y\) does not appear in the coefficients a,b,c,d. The result of eliminating \(y\) in ordinary algebra gives the equation

\[ ad - bc = 0, \]

and this is what Boole used in MAL. Unfortunately this is a weak elimination result for Boole’s algebra. One finds, using the improved reduction and elimination theorems of LT, that the best possible result of elimination is

\[ (b^2 + d^2)[(a + b)^2 + (c + d)^2 ] = 0. \]

(Boole never pointed out this defect in MAL.)

The primary equational expressions were not sufficient to derive all of the desired syllogisms. For example, in the cases where the premises had primary expressions \(ay = 0\) and \(cy = 0\), elimination gave \(0 = 0\), even though Aristotelian logic might demand a non-trivial conclusion. Boole introduced the alternative equational expressions (see MAL, p. 32) of categorical propositions to be able to derive all of the valid Aristotelian syllogisms. With this convention, of using alternative expressions when needed, it turned out that the premises that only led to \(0 = 0\) were among those which did not belong to a valid syllogism. Boole did not offer an algebraic way to completely determine which premises could be completed to valid syllogisms.

Toward the end of the chapter on categorical syllogisms there is a long footnote (MAL, pp. 42–45) to support a claim (MAL, pp. 42, 43) that secondary translations alone are sufficient for the analysis of [his generalization of] Aristotelian categorical logic. The footnote loses much of its force because the results it presents depend heavily on the weak elimination theorem being best possible, which is not the case. In the Postscript he says that using only the secondary translations is altogether superior to what was presented in the main text.

Boole would use only the secondary translations of MAL in LT, but in LT the reader will no longer find a leisurely and detailed treatment of Aristotelian logic. Indeed the discussion of Aristotelian logic is delayed until the last chapter on logic, namely Chapter XV, and in this chapter it is presented in such a compressed form, using such long equations, that the reader is not likely to want to check that Boole’s analysis is correct.

3.7 Hypothetical Syllogisms

Boole analyzed the seven hypothetical syllogisms that were standard in Aristotelian logic, from the Constructive and Destructive Conditionals to the Complex Destructive Dilemma. Letting capital letters \(X, Y, \ldots\) represent categorical propositions, the hypothetical propositions traditionally involved in hypothetical syllogisms were in one of the forms “\(X\) is true”, “\(X\) is false”,“If \(X\) then \(Y\)”, “\(X\) or \(Y\) or …”, “\(X\) and \(Y\) and …”. At the end of the chapter on hypothetical syllogisms he noted that it was easy to create new ones, and one could enrich the collection by using mixed hypothetical propositions such as “If \(X\) is true, then either \(Y\) is true, or \(Z\) is true.”

One sees that Boole is taking first steps towards the general notion of a propositional formula \(\Phi(X,Y, \ldots)\), but he never reached our modern approach using a recursive definition, an approach which is essential to being able to do inductive proofs on the set of propositional formulas.

Most important in this chapter was Boole’s claim that his algebra of logic for categorical propositions was equally suited to the study of hypothetical syllogisms. This was based on adopting the standard reduction of hypothetical propositions to propositions about classes by letting the hypothetical universe, also denoted by 1, be the collection of all cases and conjunctures of circumstances (which was usually abbreviated to just the word cases). Evidently his notion of a “case” was an assignment of truth values to the propositional variables.

This brings up the question of whether or not his hypothetical universe depended on the variables being considered in an argument—if so then for \(n\) variables the universe would have \(2^n\) cases. However he makes the remark (MAL, p. 50) that “the extent of the hypothetical Universe does not at all depend upon the number of circumstances which are taken into account”. In this context “circumstances” means propositional variables; one still has the question of what he means by cases. A modern solution would be to use the collection of all mappings from the set of propositional variables to the set \(\{\rT, \rF\}\).

For \(X\) a categorical proposition Boole let \(x\) be the elective operator that selects the cases for which \(X\) is true. Consider the hypothetical proposition “If \(X\) then \(Y\)”, where \(X, Y\) are categorical propositions. A natural conversion of this hypothetical proposition into a categorical proposition would be “All \(Cases(X)\) are \(Cases(Y)\)”, where \(Cases(X)\) is the class of all cases for which \(X\) is true, etc. The equational translation would be \(xy = x\).

The hypothetical proposition “\(X\) or \(Y\)”, with the “or” being inclusive, can be expressed by “Every case is in \(Cases(X)\) or in \(Cases(Y)\) or in both”, but this is not in the form of a categorical proposition. Boole says the universe of a categorical proposition has two cases, true and false. To find an equational expression for a hypothetical proposition Boole resorts to a near relative of truth tables (MAL, p. 50). To each case, that is, assignment of truth values to \(X\) and \(Y\), he associates an elective expression as follows:

\(Cases(x)\) \(Cases(y)\) Elective Expressions
\(\rT\) \(\rT\) \(xy\)
\(\rT\) \(\rF\) \(x(1- y)\)
\(\rF\) \(\rT\) \((1 - x)y\)
\(\rF\) \(\rF\) \((1 - x)(1 - y)\)

These elective expressions are, of course, the constitutents of the elective operators \(x\), \(y\).

Boole translates a propositional formula \(\Phi(X,Y, \ldots)\) into an elective expression \(\phi(x,y, \ldots)\) by ascertaining all the distinct cases (assignments of truth values) which imply the formula, and summing their corresponding elective expressions. The elective equation for \(\Phi(X,Y, \ldots)\) is then \(\phi(x,y, \ldots) = 1\).

The elective expression for “\(X\) or \(Y\)”, with “or” inclusive, is the sum of the elective expressions for the truth assignments to \(X\) and \(Y\) for which “\(X\) or \(Y\)” holds, that is, the sum of the first three elective expressions in the above table, namely \(xy + x(1 - y) + (1 - x)y\), which simplifies to \(x + y - xy\). The elective equation of the assertion “\(X\) or \(Y\)” is \(x + y - xy = 1\).

Boole did not have the modern view that a propositional formula can be considered a function on \(\{\rT, \rF\}\), taking values in \(\{\rT, \rF\}\). The function viewpoint gives us an algorithm to determine which constituents are to be summed to give the desired elective expression, namely those constituents associated with the cases for which the propositional formula has the value \(\rT\). Applying this to the propositional formula “\(X\) implies \(Y\)” gives the following:

Modern Version
\(Cases(X)\) \(Cases(Y)\) Value of
\(X \rightarrow Y\)
T T T \(xy\)
T F F –––
F T T \((1 - x)y\)
F F T \((1 - x)(1 - y)\)

Thus the elective expression for “\(X\) implies \(Y\)” is \(xy + (1 - x) y + (1 - x)(1 - y)\), which simplifies to \(1 - x + xy\).

By not viewing propositional formulas as functions on \(\{\)T, F\(\}\) Boole missed out on being the inventor of truth tables. His algebraic method of analyzing hypothetical syllogisms was to transform each of the hypothetical premises into an elective equation, and then apply his algebra of logic (which was developed for categorical propositions). For example, the premises “\(X\) or \(Y\)” and “not-\(X\)” are expressed by “\(x + y - xy = 1\)” and “\(x = 0\)”. From these it immediately follows that “\(y = 1\)”, giving the conclusion “\(Y\)”, that is, if “\(X\) or \(Y\)” and “not-\(X\)” are true, then “\(Y\) is true”.

Boole’s assumption that \(x\) selected the cases for which \(X\) is true leads to some confusion. In the above example, the premise “\(x = 0\)” apparently says that \(X\) is false in all cases, and the conclusion “\(y = 1\)” says that \(Y\) is true in all cases. But the meaning of the argument “\(X\) or \(Y\), not-\(X \therefore Y\)” is that any case which makes the premises true also makes the conclusion true.

The confusion is cleared up by adopting De Morgan’s 1847 concept of the universe of discourse (as Boole did in in LT). Namely, given premises \(\Phi , \Psi, \ldots\), the universe of discourse is chosen to be the collection of cases for which the premises hold. In LT Boole abandoned the use of cases specified by assignments of truth-values to the variables, and instead associated with a proposition the time during which it was true, noting that to use “cases” one needed to define the notion of a case, which he evidently was unable to do in a satisfactory manner.

Boole only considered rather simple hypothetical propositions on the grounds these were the only ones encountered in common usage (see LT, p. 172). His algebraic approach to propositional logic is easily extended to all propositional formulas as follows. For \(\Phi\) a propositional formula the associated elective function \(\Phi^*\) is defined recursively as follows:

  • \(0^* = 0\); \(1^* = 1\); \(X^* = x\);
  • \((\text{not-}\Phi)^* = 1 - \Phi^*\);
  • \((\Phi \text{ and } \Psi)^* = \Phi^* \cdot \Psi^*\);
  • \((\Phi \text{ or } \Psi)^* = \Phi^* + \Psi^* - \Phi^* \cdot \Psi^*\),  where “or” is inclusive;
  • \((\Phi \text{ or } \Psi)^* = \Phi^* + \Psi^* - 2\Phi^* \cdot \Psi^*\),  where “or” is exclusive;
  • \((\Phi \text{ implies } \Psi)^* = 1 - \Phi^* + \Phi^* \cdot \Psi^*\);
  • \((\Phi \text{ iff } \Psi)^* = \Phi^* \cdot \Psi^* + (1 - \Phi^*) \cdot(1 - \Psi^*)\).

Then one has:

  1. \(\Phi\) is a tautology iff \(\Phi^* = 1\) is valid in Boole’s algebra.
  2. \(\Phi_1\), ... , \(\Phi_k \therefore \Phi\) is valid in propositional logic iff
    \(\Phi_{1}^* = 1, \ldots , \Phi_{k}^* = 1 \therefore \Phi^* = 1\) is valid in Boole’s algebra.

This looks quite different from modern propositional logic where one takes a few tautologies, such as \(X \rightarrow(Y \rightarrow X)\), as axioms, and inference rules such as modus ponens to form a deductive system.

This translation, from \(\Phi\) to \(\Phi^*\), viewed as mapping expressions in modern Boolean algebra to polynomials, would be presented in a 1933 paper of Hassler Whitney (1907–1989), with the objective of showing that one does not need to learn the algebra of logic [modern Boolean algebra] to verify the equational laws and equational arguments of Boolean algebra—they can be translated into the ordinary algebra with which one is familiar. Howard Aiken (1900–1973), Director of the Harvard Computation Laboratory, would use such translations of logical functions into ordinary algebra in his 1951 book Synthesis of Electronic Computing and Control Circuits, specifically stating that he preferred Boole’s numerical function approach to that of Boolean algebra or propositional logic.

3.8 General Theorems of Boole’s Algebra in MAL

Beginning with the chapter “Properties of Elective Functions”, Boole developed general theorems for working with equations in his algebra of logic—the Expansion Theorem and the properties of constituents are discussed in this chapter. His proof of the one-variable case of the Expansion Theorem (MAL, p. 60) is rather strange—there is no need to take a power series expansion of a polynomial. Otherwise his proof is correct. From the Expansion Theorem and the properties of constituents he shows that the modulii of the sum/difference/product of two elective functions are the sums/differences/products of the corresponding modulii of the two functions.

The Expansion Theorem is used (MAL, p. 61) to prove an important result, that \(p(x)\) and \(q(x)\) are equivalent in Boole’s algebra if and only if corresponding modulii are the same, that is, \(p(1) = q(1)\) and \(p(0) = q(0)\). This result generalizes to functions of several variables. It will not be stated as such in LT, but will be absorbed in the much more general (if somewhat opaquely stated) result that will be called the Rule of 0 and 1.

An elective function \(p(x, y, \ldots)\) is interpretable in Boole’s algebra whenever it is defined. For example \(1+1 + x\) is not interpretable (for any class \(X\)), \(x + y\) is only interpretable for \(X\) and \(Y\) disjoint classes, and \(xy\) is totally (always) interpretable. An elective equation \(p = q\) is interpretable whenever both sides are interpretable. A constituent equation is an elective equation of the form \(r = 0\), where \(r\) is a constituent. Constituent equations are totally interpretable. Boole shows (MAL, p. 64) that every elective equation \(p = 0\) is equivalent to the collection of constituent equations \(r = 0\) where the modulus (coefficient) of \(r\) in the expansion of \(p\) is not zero, and thus every elective equation is interpretable. Furthermore this leads (MAL, p. 65) to the fact that \(p = 0\) is equivalent to the equation \(q = 0\) where \(q\) is the sum of the constituents in the expansion of \(p\) whose modulus is non-zero. As examples, consider the equations \(x + y = 0\) and \(x - y = 0\). The following table gives the constituents and modulii of their expansions:

\(x\) y constituents \(x + y\) \(x - y\)
1 1 \(xy\) 2 0
1 0 \(x(1 - y)\) 1 1
0 1 \((1 - x)y\) 1 \(-1\)
0 0 \((1 - x)(1 - y)\) 0 0

Thus \(x + y = 0\) is equivalent to the collection of constituent equations

\[ xy = 0,\ x(1 - y) = 0,\ (1 - x)y = 0 \]

as well as the single equation

\[ xy + x(1 - y) + (1 - x)y = 0, \]

and \(x - y = 0\) is equivalent to the collection of constituent equations

\[ x(1 - y) = 0,\ (1 - x)y = 0 \]

as well as the single equation

\[ x(1 - y) + (1 - x)y = 0. \]

It was natural for Boole to want to solve equations in his algebra of logic since this had been a main goal of ordinary algebra, and had led to many difficult questions (e.g., how to solve a 5th degree equation). Fortunately for Boole, the situation in his algebra of logic was much simpler—he could always solve an equation, and finding the solution was important to applications of his system, to derive conclusions in logic. An equation was solved in part by using formal expansion after performing formal division, and then decoding the fractional coefficients.

This Solution Theorem was the result of which he was the most proud—it described how to solve an elective equation for one of its symbols in terms of the others, often introducing constraint equations on the independent variables, and it is this that Boole claimed (in the Introduction chapter of MAL, p. 9) would offer “the means of a perfect analysis of any conceivable system of propositions, …”. In LT Boole would continue to regard this tool as the highlight of his work.

Boole’s final example (MAL, p. 78), solving three equations in three unknowns for one of the unknowns in terms of the other two, used a well known technique for handling side conditions in analysis called Lagrange Multipliers—this method (which reduced the three equations in the example to a single equation in five unknowns) reappears in LT (p. 117), but is only used in a single example. It is superseded by the sum of squares reduction (LT, p. 121) which does not introduce new variables. Power series had not been completely abandoned in LT—they appeared in LT, but only in a footnote (LT, p. 72). Using the Reduction and Elimination Theorems in LT one discovers that Boole’s constraint equations (3) (MAL, p. 80) for his three equation example are much too weak—each of the products should be 0, and there are additional constraint equations.

MAL shows more clearly than LT how closely Boole’s algebra of logic is based on the common algebra plus idempotent class symbols. The Elimination Theorem that he simply borrowed from algebra turned out to be weaker than what his algebra offered, and his method of reducing equations to a single equation was clumsier than the main one used in LT, but the Expansion Theorem and Solution Theorem were the same. One sees that MAL contained not only the basic outline for LT, but also some parts fully developed. Much of LT would be devoted to clarifying and correcting what was said in MAL, and providing more substantial applications, the main one being his considerable work in probability theory.

4. The Laws of Thought (1854)

Boole’s second logic book, An Investigation of The Laws of Thought on which are founded the Mathematical Theories of Logic and Probabilities, published in 1854, was an effort to correct and perfect his 1847 book on logic. The second half of this 424 page book presented probability theory as an excellent topic to illustrate the power of his algebra of logic. Boole discussed the theoretical possibility of using probability theory (enhanced by his algebra of logic) to uncover fundamental laws governing society by analyzing large quantities of social data by large numbers of (human) computers.

Boole said that he would use letters like \(x\) to represent classes, although later he would also use capital letters like \(V\). The universe was a class, denoted by 1; and there was a class described as having “no beings”, denoted by 0, which we call the empty class. The operation of multiplication was defined to be intersection, and this led to his first law, \(xy = yx\). Next (some pages later) he gave the idempotent law \(x^2 = x\). Addition was introduced as aggregation when the classes were disjoint. He stated the commutative law for addition, \(x + y = y + x\), and the distributive law \(z(x + y) = zx + zy\). Then followed \(x - y = - y + x\) and \(z(x - y) = zx - zy\). The associative laws for addition and multiplication were conspicuously absent. A possible reason for this omission was that he worked with the standard algebra of polynomials, where the parentheses involved in the associative laws are absent, instead of the terms which are fundamental to modern logic.

Boole seems to justify his choice of laws on the basis that they are valid where defined. This does not guarantee the compatibility of the axioms with the algebraic structures since the equation \((x+y)^2 = x+y\) is certainly valid where defined, namely when \(xy = 0\), but adding this to Boole’s axioms leads to the theorem \(xy = 0\), that is, any two classes are disjoint, which is not the case. Working with partial algebras has its subtleties.

One might expect that Boole was building toward an axiomatic foundation for his algebra of logic, just as in MAL, evidently having realized that the three laws in MAL were not enough. Indeed he did discuss the rules of inference, that adding or subtracting equals from equals gives equals, and multiplying equals by equals gives equals. But then the development of an axiomatic approach came to an abrupt halt. There was no discussion as to whether the stated axioms (which he called laws) and rules (which he called axioms) were sufficient to construct his algebra of logic. (They were not.) Instead he simply and briefly, with remarkably little fanfare, presented a radically new foundation for his algebra of logic (LT pp. 37,38).

He said that since the only idempotent numbers were 0 and 1, this suggested that the correct algebra to use for logic would be the common algebra of the ordinary numbers modified by restricting the symbols to the values 0 and 1. He stated what, in this article, is called The Rule of 0 and 1, that a law or argument held in logic iff after being translated into equational form it held in common algebra with this 0,1-restriction on the possible interpretations (i.e., values) of the symbols. Boole would use this Rule to justify his main theorems (Expansion, Reduction, Elimination), and for no other purpose. The main theorems in turn yielded Boole’s General Method for discovering the strongest possible consequences of propositional premises under certain desired constraints (such as eliminating some of the variables).

In Chapter V he discussed the role of uninterpretables in his work; as a (partial) justification for the use of uninterpretable steps in symbolic algebra he pointed to the well known use of \(\sqrt{-1}\). Unfortunately his Principles of Symbolical Reasoning do not, in general apply to partial algebras, that is, where some of the operations are only partially defined, such as addition and subtraction in Boole’s algebra. Nonetheless it turns out that they do apply to his algebra of logic. In succeeding chapters he gave the Expansion Theorem, the new full-strength Elimination Theorem, an improved Reduction Theorem, and the use of division to solve an equation.

After many examples and results for special cases of solving equations, Boole turned to the topic of the interpretability of a logical function. Boole had already stated that every equation is interpretable (by converting an equation into a collection of constituent equations). However terms need not be interpretable, e.g., \(1+1\) is not interpretable. Working with the modern notion of terms, one can recursively define the domain of interpretability of a term. For example, \((x+y) - z\) has a different domain of interpretability than the equivalent term \(x + (y -z)\). The first is interpretable if and only if \(x\) and \(y\) are disjoint classes, and \(z\) is contained in the union of \(x\) and \(y\). The second is interpretable if and only if \(z\) is contained in \(y\), and \(x\) and \(y \smallsetminus z\) are disjoint. Both terms are equivalent to the same polynomial \(x + y - z\), leaving Boole with the problem of determining when a polynomial \(p\) is interpretable. Eventually he comes to the conclusion that the condition for a polynomial to be equivalent to a (totally) interpretable elective function is that it satisfy \(p^2 = p\), in which case it is equivalent to a sum of distinct constituents, namely those belonging to the non-vanishing modulii of \(p\). Of course a polynomial is idempotent if and only if all of its modulii are idempotent, that is, they are in \(\{0, 1\}\), in which case the expansion of the polynomial is a sum of distinct constituents (or it is 0).

Boole’s chapter on secondary propositions is essentially the same as in MAL except that he changed from using “the cases when \(X\) is true” to “the times when \(X\) is true”. In Chapter XIII Boole selected some well-known arguments of Clarke and Spinoza, on the nature of an eternal being, to put under the magnifying glass of his algebra of logic, starting with the comment (LT, p. 185):

2. The chief practical difficulty of this inquiry will consist, not in the application of the method to the premises once determined, but in ascertaining what the premises are.

One conclusion was (LT, p. 216):

“19. It is not possible, I think, to rise from the perusal of the arguments of Clarke and Spinoza without a deep conviction of the futility of all endeavours to establish, entirely a priori, the existence of an Infinite Being, His attributes, and His relation to the universe.”

In the final chapter on logic, chapter XV, Boole presented his analysis of the conversions and syllogisms of Aristotelian logic. He now considered this ancient logic to be a weak, fragmented attempt at a logical system. This much neglected chapter is quite interesting because it is the only chapter where he analyzed particular propositions, making essential use of additional letters like “\(v\)” to encode “some”. This is also the chapter where he detailed (unfortunately incompletely) the rules for working with “some”.

Briefly stated, Boole gave the reader a summary of traditional Aristotelian categorical logic, and analyzed some simple examples using ad hoc techniques with his algebra of logic. Then he launched into proving a comprehensive result by applying his General Method to the pair of equations:

\[\begin{align} vx &= v'y \\ wz &= w'y, \end{align}\]

noting that the premises of many categorical syllogisms can be put in this form. His goal was to eliminate \(y\) and find expressions for \(x, 1-x\) and \(vx\) in terms of \(z, v, v', w, w'\). This led to three equations involving large algebraic expressions. Boole omitted almost all details of his derivation, but summarized the results in terms of the established results of Aristotelian logic. Then he noted that the remaining categorical syllogisms are such that their premises can be put in the form:

\[\begin{align} vx &= v'y \\ wz &= w'(1-y), \end{align}\]

and this led to another triple of large equations.

5. Later Developments

5.1 Objections to Boole’s Algebra of Logic

Many objections to Boole’s system have been published over the years; three among the most important concern:

  • the use of uninterpretable expressions in derivations,
  • the treatment of particular propositions by equations, and
  • the method of dealing with division.

We look at a different objection, namely at the Boole/Jevons dispute over adding \(x + x = x\) as a law. In Laws of Thought, p. 66, Boole said:

The expression \(x + y\) seems indeed uninterpretable, unless it be assumed that the things represented by \(x\) and the things represented by \(y\) are entirely separate; that they embrace no individuals in common.

[The following details are from “The development of the theories of mathematical logic and the principles of mathematics, William Stanley Jevons,” by Philip Jourdain, 1914.]

In an 1863 letter to Boole regarding a draft of a commentary on Boole’s system that Jevons was considering for his forthcoming book (Pure Logic, 1864), Jevons said:

It is surely obvious, however, that \(x+x\) is equivalent only to \(x,\ldots\)

Professor Boole’s notation [process of subtraction] is inconsistent with a self-evident law.

If my view be right, his system will come to be regarded as a most remarkable combination of truth and error.

Boole replied:

Thus the equation \(x + x = 0\) is equivalent to the equation \(x = 0\); but the expression \(x + x\) is not equivalent to the expression \(x\).

Jevons responded by asking if Boole could deny the truth of \(x + x = x\).

Boole, clearly exasperated, replies:

To be explicit, I now, however, reply that it is not true that in Logic \(x + x = x\), though it is true that \(x + x = 0\) is equivalent to \(x = 0\). If I do not write more it is not from any unwillingness to discuss the subject with you, but simply because if we differ on this fundamental point it is impossible that we should agree in others.

Jevons’s final effort to get Boole to understand the issue was:

I do not doubt that it is open to you to hold …[that \(x + x = x\) is not true] according to the laws of your system, and with this explanation your system probably is perfectly consistent with itself … But the question then becomes a wider one—does your system correspond to the Logic of common thought?

Jevons’s new law, \(x + x = x\), resulted from his conviction that “+” should denote what we now call union, where the membership of \(x + y\) is given by an inclusive “or”. Boole simply did not see any way to define \(x + y\) as a class unless \(x\) and \(y\) were disjoint, as already noted.

Various explanations have been given as to why Boole could not comprehend the possibility of Jevons’s suggestion. Boole clearly had the semantic concept of union—he expressed the union of \(x\) and \(y\) as \(x + y(1-x)\), a union of two disjoint classes, and pointed out that the elements of this class are the ones that belong to either \(x\) or \(y\) or both. So how could he so completely fail to see the possibility of taking union for his fundamental operation + instead of his curious partial union operation?

The answer is simple: the law \(x + x = x\) would have destroyed his ability to fully use ordinary algebra: from \(x + x = x\) one has, by ordinary algebra, \(x = 0\). This would force every class symbol to denote the empty class. Jevons’s proposed law \(x + x = x\) was simply not true if one was committed to constructing the algebra of logic on top of the laws and inference rules of ordinary algebra. (Boolean rings have all the laws of the integers, but not all of the inference rules, for example, \(2x = 0\) implies \(x = 0\) does not hold in Boolean rings. It seems quite possible that Boole found the simplest way to construct an algebra of logic for classes that allowed one to use all the equations and equational arguments that were valid for the integers.)

Perhaps it is interesting to note that the title of Jevon’s 1864 book started out with the words Pure Logic, referring to the fact that his version of the algebra of logic had been cleansed from connections to the algebra of numbers. The same point would be made in the introduction to Whitehead and Russell’s Principia Mathematica, that they had adopted the notation of Peano in part to free their work from such connections.

5.2 Modern Reconstruction of Boole’s System

Given the enormous degree of sophistication achieved in modern algebra in the 20th century, it is rather surprising that a law-preserving total algebra extension of Boole’s partial algebra of classes did not appear until Theodore Hailperin’s book of 1976—the delay was likely caused by readers not believing that Boole was using ordinary algebra. Hailperin’s extension was to look at labelings of the universe with integers, that is, each element of the universe is labeled with an integer. Each labeling of the universe creates a signed multi-set (perhaps one should say signed multi-class) consisting of those labeled elements where the label is non-zero. For multi-sets, whose labels are all non-negative, one can think of the label of an element as describing how many copies of the element are in the multi-set. Boole’s classes correspond to the signed multi-sets where all the labels are 0 or 1 (the elements not in the class have the label 0). The uninterpretable elements of Boole become interpretable when viewed as signed multi-sets—they are given by labelings of the universe where some label is not 0 or 1.

To add two signed multi-sets one simply adds the labels on each element of the universe. Likewise for subtraction and multiplication. (For the reader familiar with modern abstract algebra, one can take the extension of Boole’s partial algebra to be \(Z^U\) where \(Z\) is the ring of integers, and \(U\) is the universe of discourse.) The signed multi-sets corresponding to classes are precisely the idempotent signed multi-sets. It turns out that the laws and principles Boole was using in his algebra of logic hold for this system. By this means Boole’s methods are proved to be correct for the algebra of logic of universal propositions. Hailperin’s analysis did not apply to particular propositions. Frank W. Brown’s paper “ George Boole’s deductive system” (2009) proposes that one can avoid signed multi-sets by working with the ring of polynomials Z[X] modulo a certain ideal.

Boole could not find a translation that worked as cleanly for the particular propositions as for the universal propositions. In 1847 Boole used the following two translations, the second one being a consequence of the first:

Some \(X\)s are \(Y\)s …………. \(v = xy\) and \(vx = vy\).

He initially used the symbol \(v\) to capture the essence of “some”. Later he used other symbols as well, and also he used \(v\) with other meanings (such as for the coefficients in an expansion). One of the problems with his translation scheme with \(v\) was that at times one needed “margin notes,” to keep track of which class(es) the \(v\) was attached to when it was introduced. The rules for translating from equations with \(v\)’s back to particular statements were never clearly formulated. For example in Chapter XV one sees a derivation of \(x = vv'y\) which is then translated as Some \(X\) is \(Y\). But he had no rules for when a product of \(v\)’s carries the import of “some”. Such problems detract from Boole’s system; his explanations leave doubts as to which procedures are legitimate in his system when dealing with particular statements.

There is one point on which even Hailperin was not faithful to Boole’s work, namely he used modern semantics, where the symbols \(x, y\), etc., can refer to the empty class as well as to a non-empty class. With modern semantics one cannot have the Conversion by Limitation which held in Aristotelian logic: from All \(X\) is \(Y\) follows Some \(Y\) is \(X\). In his Formal Logic of 1847, De Morgan pointed out that all writers on logic had assumed that the subject in a universal proposition was assumed to be non-empty. The simplest way to deal with this in an algebra of logic is to restrict class symbols to represent non-empty classes; and given the interest in liberating the role of contraries like not-\(x\), perhaps class symbols should also be restricted to representing non-universe classes. Such a convention will be called Aristotelian semantics. Boole had evidently followed this Aristotelian convention because he derived all the Aristotelian results, including Conversion by Limitation. A proper interpretation (faithful to Boole’s work) of Boole’s system requires Aristotelian semantics for the class symbols \(x, y, z,\ldots\) ; unfortunately it seems that the published literature on Boole’s system has failed to note this. Authors seem quite satisfied that Boole’s results, especially his general theorems, have been so compatible with the modern semantics of class symbols.

6. Boole’s Methods

While reading through this section, on the technical details of Boole’s methods, the reader may find it useful to consult the

supplement of examples from Boole’s two books.

These examples have been augmented with comments explaining, in each step of a derivation by Boole, which aspect of his methods is being employed.

6.1 The Three Methods of Argument Analysis Used by Boole in LT

Boole used three methods to analyze arguments in LT:

  1. The first was the purely ad hoc algebraic manipulations that were used (in conjunction with a weak version of the Elimination Theorem) on the Aristotelian arguments in MAL.
  2. Secondly, in section 15 of Chapter II of LT, one finds the method that, in this article, is called the Rule of 0 and 1.

The theorems of LT combine to yield the master result,

  1. Boole’s General Method (in this article it will always be referred to using capitalized first letters—Boole just called it “a method”).

When applying the ad hoc method, he used parts of ordinary algebra along with the idempotent law \(x^2 = x\) to manipulate equations. There was no pre-established procedure to follow—success with this method depended on intuitive skills developed through experience.

The second method, the Rule of 0 and 1, is very powerful, but it depends on being given a collection of premise equations and a conclusion equation. It is a truth-table like method (but Boole never drew a table when applying the method) to determine if the argument is correct. Boole only used this method to establish the theorems that justified his General Method, even though it is an excellent tool for verifying simple arguments like syllogisms. But Boole was more interested in finding the most general conclusion from given premises, modulo certain conditions, and aside from his general theorems, showed no interest in simply verifying logical arguments. The Rule of 0 and 1 is a somewhat shadowy figure in LT—it has no name, and is never referred to by section or page number. A precise version of Boole’s Rule of 0 and 1 that yields Boole’s results is given in Burris and Sankappanavar 2013.

The third method to analyze arguments was the highlight of Boole’s work in logic, his General Method (discussed immediately after this). This is the one he used for all but the simplest examples in LT; for the simplest examples he resorted to the first method of ad hoc algebraic techniques because, for one skilled in algebraic manipulations, using them is usually far more efficient than going through the General Method.

The final version (from LT) of his General Method for analyzing arguments is, briefly stated, to:

  1. convert (or translate) the propositions into equations,
  2. apply a prescribed sequence of algebraic processes to the equations, processes which yield desired conclusion equations, and then
  3. convert the equational conclusions into propositional conclusions, yielding the desired consequences of the original collection of propositions.

With this method Boole had replaced the art of reasoning from premise propositions to conclusion propositions by a routine mechanical algebraic procedure.

In LT Boole divided propositions into two kinds, primary and secondary. These correspond to, but are not exactly the same as, the Aristotelian division into categorical and hypothetical propositions. First we discuss his General Method applied to primary propositions.

6.2. Boole’s General Method for Primary Propositions

Boole recognized three forms of primary propositions:

  • All \(X\) is \(Y\)
  • All \(X\) is all \(Y\)
  • Some \(X\) is \(Y\)

These were his version of the Aristotelian categorical propositions, where \(X\) is the subject term and \(Y\) the predicate term. The terms \(X\) and \(Y\) could be complex names, for example, \(X\) could be \(X_1\) or \(X_2\).

STEP 1: Names are converted into algebraic terms as follows:

Terms MAL LT
universe 1 p.15 1 p.48
empty class ––– 0 p.47
not \(X\) \(1 - x\) p.20 \(1 - x\) p.48
\(X\) and \(Y\) \(xy\) p.16 \(xy\) p.28
\(X\) or \(Y\) (inclusive) ––– \(x + y(1 - x)\)
\(xy + x(1 - y) + y(1- x)\)
\(X\) or \(Y\) (exclusive) ––– \(x(1 - y) + y(1 - x)\) p.56

We will call the letters \(x, y,\ldots\) class symbols (as noted earlier, the algebra of the 1800s did not use the word variables).

STEP 2: Having converted names for the terms into algebraic terms, one then converts the propositions into equations using the following:

MAL (1847) LT (1854)
All \(X\) is \(Y\) \(x(1-y) = 0\) p.26 \(x = vy\) pp.64,152
No \(X\) is \(Y\) \(xy = 0\) (not primary) –––
All \(X\) is all \(Y\) (not primary) ––– \(x = y\)
Some \(X\) is \(Y\) \(v = xy\) \(vx = vy\)
Some \(X\) is not \(Y\) \(v = x(1-y)\) (not primary) –––

Prior to chapter XV, the one on Aristotelian logic, Boole’s examples only use universal propositions. (One can speculate that he had encountered difficulties with particular propositions and avoided them.) Those of the form “All X is Y” are first expressed as \(x = vy\), and then \(v\) is promptly eliminated, giving \(x = xy\). (Similarly if \(X\) is replaced by not-\(X\), etc.) Boole said this was merely a convenient but unnecessary step. For the examples in the first fourteen chapters he could simply have used the translation \(x = xy\), skipping the reference to \(v\). It seems that to simplify notation he used the same letter \(v\) when there were several universal premises, an incorrect step if one accepts Boole’s claim that it is not necessary to eliminate the \(v\)’s immediately. Distinct universal propositions require different \(v\)’s in their translation. Else one can run into the following situation. Consider the two premises “All \(X\) is \(Z\)” and “All \(Y\) is \(Z\)”. Using the same \(v\) for their equational expressions gives \(x = vz\) and \(y = vz\), leading to the equation \(x = y\), and then to the false conclusion \(X\) equals \(Y\). In chapter XV he was careful to use distinct \(v\)’s for the expressions of distinct premises.

Boole used the four categorical propositions as his primary forms in 1847, but in 1854 he eliminated the negative propositional forms, noting that one could change “not \(Y\)” to “not-\(Y\)”. Thus in 1854 he would express “No \(X\) is \(Y\)” by “All \(X\) is not-\(Y\)”, with the translation \(x = v(1-y)\), and then eliminating \(v\) to obtain

\[ x(1 - (1 - y)) = 0, \]

which simplifies to \(xy = 0\).

STEP 3: After converting the premises into algebraic form one has a collection of equations, say

\[ p_1 = q_1, \quad p_2 = q_2, \quad \ldots, \quad p_n = q_n. \]

Express these as equations with 0 on the right side, that is, as

\[ r_1 = 0, \quad r_2 = 0, \quad \ldots, \quad r_n = 0, \]


\[ r_1 := p_1 - q_1, \quad r_2 := p_2 - q_2, \quad \dots, \quad r_n := p_n - q_n. \]

STEP 4: (REDUCTION) [LT (p. 121) ]

Reduce the system of equations

\[ r_1 = 0, \quad r_2 = 0, \quad \ldots, \quad r_n = 0, \]

to a single equation \(r = 0\). Boole had three different methods for doing this—he seemed to have a preference for summing the squares:

\[ r := r_1^2 + \cdots + r_n^2 = 0. \]

Steps 1 through 4 are mandatory in Boole’s General Method. After executing these steps there are various options for continuing, depending on the goal.

STEP 5: (ELIMINATION) [LT (p. 101)]

Suppose one wants the most general equational conclusion derived from \(r = 0\) that involves some, but not all, of the class symbols in \(r\). Then one wants to eliminate certain symbols. Suppose \(r\) involves the class symbols

\[ x_1, \ldots, x_j \text{ and } y_1, \ldots, y_k. \]

Then one can write \(r\) as \(r(x_1, \ldots, x_j, y_1, \ldots ,y_k)\).

Boole’s procedure to eliminate the symbols \(x_1, \ldots ,x_j\) from

\[ r(x_1, \ldots, x_j, y_1, \ldots, y_k) = 0 \]

to obtain

\[ s(y_1, \ldots, y_k) = 0 \]

was as follows:

  1. form all possible expressions \(r(a_1, \ldots, a_j, y_1, \ldots, y_k)\) where \(a_1, \ldots, a_j\) are each either 0 or 1, then
  2. multiply all of these expressions together to obtain \(s(y_1, \ldots, y_k)\).

For example, eliminating \(x_1, x_2\) from

\[ r(x_1, x_2, y) = 0 \]


\[ s(y) = 0 \]


\[ s(y) := r(0, 0, y) \cdot r(0, 1, y) \cdot r(1, 0, y) \cdot r(1, 1, y). \]

STEP 6: (DEVELOPMENT, or EXPANSION) [MAL (p. 60), LT (pp. 72, 73)].

Given a term, say \(r(x_1, \ldots, x_j, y_1, \ldots, y_k)\), one can expand the term with respect to a subset of the class symbols. To expand with respect to \(x_1, \ldots, x_j\) gives

\[ r = \text{ sum of the terms } r(a_1, \ldots, a_j, y_1 ,\ldots, y_k) \cdot C(a_1, x_1) \cdots C(a_j, x_j), \]

where \(a_1 , \ldots ,a_j\) range over all sequences of 0s and 1s of length \(j\), and where the \(C(a_i, x_i)\) are defined by:

\[ C(1, x_i) := x_i, \text{ and } C(0, x_i) := 1- x_i. \]

Boole said the products:

\[ C(a_1, x_1) \cdots C(a_j, x_j) \]

were the constituents of \(x_1 , \ldots ,x_j\). There are \(2^j\) different constituents for \(j\) symbols. The regions of a Venn diagram give a popular way to visualize constituents.

STEP 7: (DIVISION: SOLVING FOR A CLASS SYMBOL) [MAL (p. 73), LT (pp. 86, 87)] ]

Given an equation \(r = 0\), suppose one wants to solve this equation for one of the class symbols, say \(x\), in terms of the other class symbols, say they are \(y_1 , \ldots ,y_k\). To solve:

\[ r(x, y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) = 0 \]

for \(x\), first let:

\[\begin{align} N(y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) &= - r(0, y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) \\ D(y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) &= r(1, y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) - r(0, y_1 , \ldots ,y_k). \end{align}\]


\[\tag{*} x = s(y_1 ,\ldots ,y_k) \]

where \(s(y_1 ,\ldots ,y_k)\) is:

  1. the sum of all constituents \(C(a_1, y_1) \cdots C(a_k, y_k)\) where \(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k\) range over all sequences of 0s and 1s for which:

    \[ N(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) = D(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) \ne 0, \]


  1. the sum of all the terms of the form \(V_{a_1 \ldots a_k} \cdot C(a_1, y_1) \cdots C(a_k, y_k)\) for which:

    \[ N(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) = D(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) = 0. \]

The \(V_{a_1 \ldots a_k}\) are parameters, denoting arbitrary classes (similar to what one sees in the study of linear differential equations, a subject in which Boole was an expert).

To the equation (*) for \(x\) adjoin the side-conditions (that we will call constituent equations)

\[ C(a_1, y_1) \cdots C(a_k, y_k) = 0 \]


\[ D(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) \ne N(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) \ne 0. \]

Note that one is to evaluate the terms:

\[ D(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) \text{ and } N(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) \]

using ordinary arithmetic. Thus solving an equation \(r = 0\) for a class symbol \(x\) gives an equation

\[ x = s(y_1 ,\ldots ,y_k), \]

perhaps with side-condition constituent equations.

STEP 8: (INTERPRETATION) [MAL pp. 64–65, LT (Chap. VI, esp. pp. 82–83)]

Suppose the equation \(r(y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) = 0\) has been obtained by Boole’s method from a given collection of premise equations. Then this equation is equivalent to the collection of constituent equations

\[ C(a_1, y_1) \cdots C(a_k, y_k) = 0 \]

for which \(r(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k)\) is not 0. A constituent equation merely asserts that a certain intersection of the original classes and their complements is empty. For example,

\[ y_1 (1-y_2)(1-y_3) = 0 \]

expresses the proposition “All \(Y_1\) is \(Y_2\) or \(Y_3\),” or equivalently, “All \(Y_1\) and not \(Y_2\) is \(Y_3\).” It is routine to convert constituent equations into propositions.

6.3. Boole’s General Method for Secondary Propositions

Secondary propositions were Boole’s version of the propositions that one encounters in the study of hypothetical syllogisms in Aristotelian logic, statements like “If \(X\) or \(Y\) then \(Z\).” The symbols \(X, Y, Z\), etc. of secondary propositions did not refer to classes, but rather they referred to (primary) propositions. In keeping with the incomplete nature of the Aristotelian treatment of hypothetical propositions, Boole did not give a precise description of possible forms for his secondary propositions.

The key (but not original) observation that Boole used was simply that one can convert secondary propositions into primary propositions. In MAL he adopted the convention found in Whately (1826), that given a propositional symbol \(X\), the symbol \(x\) will denote “the cases in which \(X\) is true”, whereas in LT Boole let \(x\) denote “the times for which \(X\) is true”. With this the secondary proposition “If \(X\) or \(Y\) then \(Z\)” becomes simply “All \(x\) or \(y\) is \(z\)”. The equation \(x = 1\) is the equational translation of “\(X\) is true” (in all cases, or for all times), and \(x = 0\) says “\(X\) is false” (in all cases, or for all times). The concepts of all cases and all times depend on the choice of the universe of discourse.

With this translation scheme it is clear that Boole’s treatment of secondary propositions can be analyzed by the methods he had developed for primary propositions. This was Boole’s propositional logic.

Boole worked mainly with Aristotelian propositions in MAL, using the traditional division into categoricals and hypotheticals. One does not consider “\(X\) and \(Y\),” “\(X\) or \(Y\),” etc., in categorial propositions, only in hypothetical propositions. In LT this division was replaced by the similar but more general primary versus secondary classification, where the subject and predicate were allowed to become complex names, and the number of propositions in an argument became unrestricted. With this the parallels between the logic of primary propositions and that of secondary propositions became clear, with one notable difference, namely it seems that the secondary propositions that Boole considered always translated into universal primary propositions.

MAL (1847) LT (1854)
\(X\) is true \(x = 1\) p.51 \(x = 1\) p.172
\(X\) is false \(x = 0\) p.51 \(x = 0\) p.172
\(X\) and \(Y\) \(xy = 1\) p.51 \(xy = 1\) p.172
\(X\) or \(Y\) (inclusive) \(x + y -xy = 1\) p.52 –––
\(X\) or \(Y\) (exclusive) \(x -2xy+ y = 1\) p.53 \(x(1 - y) + y(1 - x) = 1\) p.173
If \(X\) then \(Y\) \(x(1-y) = 0\) p.54 \(x = vy\) p.173


Primary Literature

  • Boole, G., 1841, “Researches on the Theory of Analytical Transformations, with a special application to the Reduction of the General Equation of the Second Order,” The Cambridge Mathematical Journal, 2: 64–73.
  • –––, 1841, “On Certain Theorems in the Calculus of Variations,” The Cambridge Mathematical Journal, 2: 97–102.
  • –––, 1841, “On the Integration of Linear Differential Equations with Constant Coefficients,” The Cambridge Mathematical Journal, 2: 114–119.
  • –––, 1847, The Mathematical Analysis of Logic, Being an Essay Towards a Calculus of Deductive Reasoning, Originally published in Cambridge by Macmillan, Barclay, & Macmillan. Reprinted in Oxford by Basil Blackwell, 1951.
  • –––, 1848, “The Calculus of Logic,” The Cambridge and Dublin Mathematical Journal, 3: 183–198.
  • –––, 1854, An Investigation of The Laws of Thought on Which are Founded the Mathematical Theories of Logic and Probabilities, Originally published by Macmillan, London. Reprint by Dover, 1958.
  • –––, 1859, A Treatise on Differential Equations, Cambridge: Macmillan.
  • –––, 1860, A Treatise on the Calculus of Finite Differences, Cambridge: Macmillan.
  • De Morgan, A., 1839, “On the foundation of algebra,” Transactions of the Cambridge Philosophical Society, VII, 174–187.
  • –––, 1841, “On the foundation of algebra, No. II,” Transactions of the Cambridge Philosophical Society VII, 287–300.
  • –––, 1847, Formal Logic: or, the Calculus of Inference, Necessary and Probable, Originally published in London by Taylor and Walton. Reprinted in London by The Open Court Company, 1926.
  • –––, On the Syllogism, and Other Logical Writings, P. Heath (ed.), New Haven: Yale University Press, 1966. (A posthumous collection of De Morgan’s papers on logic.)
  • Gregory, D.F., 1839, “Demonstrations in the differential calculus and the calculus of finite differences,” The Cambridge Mathematical Journal, Vol. I, 212–222.
  • –––, 1839, “I.–On the elementary principles of the application of algebraical symbols to geometry,” The Cambridge Mathematical Journal, Vol. II, No. VII, 1–9.
  • –––, 1840, “On the real nature of symbolical algebra.” Transactions of the Royal Society of Edinburgh, 14: 208–216. Also in [Gregory 1865, pp. 1–13].
  • –––, 1865, The Mathematical Writings of Duncan Farquharson Gregory, M.A., W. Walton (ed.), Cambridge, UK: Deighton, Bell.
  • Jevons, W.S., 1864, Pure Logic, or the Logic of Quality apart from Quantity: with Remarks on Boole’s System and on the Relation of Logic and Mathematics, London: Edward Stanford. Reprinted 1971 in Pure Logic and Other Minor Works, R. Adamson and H.A. Jevons (eds.), New York: Lennox Hill Pub. & Dist. Co.
  • Lacroix, S.F, 1797/1798, Traité du calcul différentiel et du calcul integral, Paris: Chez Courcier.
  • Lagrange, J.L., 1797, Théorie des fonctions analytique, Paris: Imprimerie de la Republique.
  • –––, 1788, Méchanique Analytique, Paris: Desaint.
  • Peacock, G., 1830, Treatise on Algebra, 2nd ed., 2 vols., Cambridge: J.&J.J. Deighton, 1842/1845.
  • –––, 1833, “Report on the Recent Progress and Present State of certain Branches of Analysis”, In Report of the Third Meeting of the British Association for the Advancement of Science held at Cambridge in 1833, pp. 185–352. London: John Murray.
  • Schröder, E., 1890–1910, Algebra der Logik, Vols. I–III. Leipzig, B.G. Teubner; reprint Chelsea 1966.
  • Whately, R., 1826, Elements of Logic, London: J. Mawman.

Secondary Literature

Cited Works

  • Boole, G., 1997, Selected Manuscripts on Logic and its Philosophy (Science Networks Historical Studies: Volume 20), edited by Ivor Grattan-Guinness and Gérard Bornet. Basel, Boston, and Berlin: Birkhäuser Verlag.
  • Brown, F.W, 2009, “ George Boole’s deductive system”, Notre Dame Journal of Logic, 50: 303–330.
  • Burris, S. and Sankappanavar, H.P., 2013, “The Horn theory of Boole’s partial algebras”, The Bulletin of Symbolic Logic, 19: 97–105.
  • Ewald, W. (ed.), 1996, From Kant to Hilbert. A Source Book in the History of Mathematics, 2 volumes, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Grattan-Guiness, I., 2001, The Search for Mathematical Roots, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Hailperin, T., 1976, Boole’s Logic and Probability, (Series: Studies in Logic and the Foundations of Mathematics, 85), Amsterdam, New York, Oxford: Elsevier North-Holland. 2nd edition, Revised and enlarged, 1986.
  • –––, 1981, “Boole’s algebra isn’t Boolean algebra”, Mathematics Magazine, 54: 172–184.
  • Jourdain, P.E.B., 1914, “The development of the theories of mathematical logic and the principles of mathematics. William Stanley Jevons”, Quarterly Journal of Pure and Applied Mathematics, 44: 113–128.
  • MacHale, D., 1985, George Boole, His Life and Work, Dublin: Boole Press. 2nd ed. 2014, Cork University Press.

Other Important Literature

  • Aiken, H.A., 1951, Synthesis of Electronic Computing and Control Circuits, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass.
  • Burris, S.N., 2015, “George Boole and Boolean Algebra”, European Mathematical Society Newsletter, 98: 27–31.
  • Couturat, L., 1905, L’algèbre de la Logique, 2d edition, Librairie Scientifique et Technique Albert Blanchard, Paris. English translation by Lydia G. Robinson: Open Court Publishing Co., Chicago & London, 1914. Reprinted by Dover Publications, Mineola, 2006.
  • Dummett, M., 1959, “Review of Studies in Logic and Probability by George Boole”, Watts & Co., London, 1952, edited by R. Rhees. The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 24: 203–209.
  • Frege, G., 1880, “Boole’s logical calculus and the concept-script”, in Gottlob Frege: Posthumous Writings, Basil Blackwell, Oxford, 1979. English translation of Nachgelassene Schriften, vol. 1, edited by H. Hermes, F. Kambartel, and F. Kaulbach, Felix Meiner, Hamburg, 1969.
  • Kneale, W., and M. Kneale, 1962, The Development of Logic, The Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Lewis, C. I., 1918, A Survey of Symbolic Logic, University of California Press, Berkeley. Reprinted by Dover Publications, Inc., New York, 1960. Chap. II, “The Classic, or Boole-Schröder Algebra of Logic.”
  • Peirce, C. S., 1880, “On the Algebra of Logic”, American Journal of Mathematics, 3: 15–57.
  • Smith, G. C., 1983, “Boole’s annotations on The Mathematical Analysis of Logic”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 4: 27–39.
  • Styazhkin, N. I., 1969, Concise History of Mathematical Logic from Leibniz to Peano, Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • van Evra, J. W., 1977, “A reassessment of George Boole’s theory of logic”, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 18: 363–77.
  • Venn, J., 1894, Symbolic Logic, 2d edition, Macmillan, London. Reprinted, revised and rewritten. Bronx: Chelsea Publishing Co., 1971.
  • Whitney, H., 1933, “Characteristic functions and the algebra of logic”, Annals of Mathematics, Second Series, 34: 405–414.

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