One of the points where there is a significant, long-lasting intersection of the interests of many philosophers with the interests of many people of all kinds and conditions concerns the nature and significance of death. How should we understand the mortality of all living things and, closer to home, how should we understand our own mortality? Is it possible for persons to survive biological death? This is a topic that has occupied both analytic and continental philosophy in the twentieth century (e.g., Fred Feldman, Martin Heidegger). When the topic of death is ignored or denied in popular culture, some philosophers, theologians, social and political critics rail against the inauthentic complacency of ignoring one of the most important facts about our lives (see, for example, Søren Kierkegaard’s essay “At a Graveside” or Ernest Becker’s famous 1974 book, The Denial of Death). But what precisely are the facts of death? Is it true that a person is annihilated when she dies, or is there a possibility or even a likelihood that she may survive death? Are any of the religious conceptions of an afterlife promising from a philosophical point of view?
There are five sections in this entry. In the first, we propose that beliefs about death and the possibility of an afterlife are of enduring significance because of our care for persons here and now, and thus our concern for their future and our own. Just as it is reasonable to hope that those we love have a fulfilling future in this life, it is natural to consider whether this life is the only life there is and, if there is reason to believe that there is an afterlife (or a life beyond this life), it would be reasonable to hope that this might involve a new, valuable environment or at least one that is not Hellish in nature. In the first section we bring to the fore other reasons why the topic of an afterlife is philosophically interesting. In sections two and three we consider the concept and possibility that persons survive death in light of two substantial philosophies of mind: dualism (section two) and materialism (section three). Section four addresses the afterlife in terms of empirical evidence. In section five, reasons are advanced for thinking that the reasonability of beliefs about an afterlife depends on the reasonability of metaphysical convictions.
- 1. Survival and its Alternatives
- 2. The Possibility of Survival—Dualism
- 3. Objections to the Possibility of Survival—Materialism
- 4. Parapsychology and Near-Death Experiences
- 5. Metaphysical Considerations Concerning Survival
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
In ancient Western philosophy, Plato affirmed both a pre-natal life of the soul and the soul’s continued life after the death of the body. In Plato’s Phaedo, Socrates presents reasons why a philosopher should even welcome death (albeit not permitting or encouraging suicide), because of its emancipation of the souls of those who are good in this life to a great afterlife. In the work of Epictetus, on the other hand, death is conceived of as a person’s ceasing to be. Epictetus does not argue that we should welcome death but he holds that we should not fear death because we will not exist after death. The philosophical assessment of the truth of such matters continues on to the present, as does debate on the implications of whether we may survive death. Why?
There are many reasons why there should be ongoing attention as to whether Plato or Epictetus—or any other philosopher who offers a different account about the reality or illusion of an afterlife—is right. One reason is that the values we have in the here and now have a bearing on what we may or should hope for in terms of the future. While some philosophers believe that what happens in the future has enormous consequences for life’s meaning now, other philosophers have so focused on the importance of the present that questions about the future of humanity in this life, and the possible good or ill of an afterlife for individuals, is of little importance. Consider two philosophers who take the latter position, Peter Singer and Erik Wielenberg.
Singer asks us to consider a case when some good act is done and its goodness does not depend upon the future. Imagine a village where there is great need and that need is met with aid. Singer claims that the goodness of such an act should not depend on the long term; one can place to one side speculation about what might happen a thousand years later.
Suppose that we become involved in a project to help a small community in a developing country to become free of debt and self-sufficient in food. The project is an outstanding success, and the villagers are healthier, happier, better educated, and economically secure and have fewer children. Now someone might say “what good have you done? In a thousand years people will all be dead, and their children and grandchildren as well, and nothing that you have done will make any difference”. (Singer 1993: 274)
We should not, however, think of our efforts as wasted unless they endure forever, or even for a very long time. (1993: 274)
His solution is to think of the universe in four-dimensional terms; according to this philosophy of time, all times are equally real. On this view, it is always the case that in the year 2020, the lives of the villagers are made better; they are happy, healthy, and well educated in 2020.
Erik Wielenberg does not adopt Singer’s recourse to the philosophy of time but, like Singer, his counsel is that we should not think (or need not think) in terms of the big picture or the future in assessing the meaning and urgency of our current projects
Isn’t it better that the Nazi Holocaust ended when it did rather than in, say, 1970—regardless of what the world will be like a million years from now? I can remember occasions in junior high gym class when a basketball or volleyball game became particularly heated and adolescent tempers flared. Our gym teacher sometimes attempted to calm us down with such rhetorical questions as, “Ten years from now, will any of you care who won this game?” It always struck me that a reasonable response to such a query would be, “Does it really matter now whether any of us will care in ten years?” In much the same vein, Thomas Nagel suggests, “it does not matter now that in a million years nothing we do now will matter”. (2013: 345)
A possible response is that while there is some wisdom in Singer’s and Wielenberg’s positions, they should not dissuade us from appreciating that the natural trajectory of the love of people and wisdom (or philosophy) includes concern for “the big picture”. If Singer truly cares about the villagers, shouldn’t he hope that they survive to enjoy the fruits of the investments that have been made? Or, putting this in four-dimensional time terms; shouldn’t he wish that they are happy in 2030 and 2040…? Surely those providing aid are not (and should not be) indifferent about the future. Granted, if the investment was made and then a meteor struck the village, destroying all life (or if in 2030 the meteor is destroying the village), we might well think the investment was still wise, good and noble (especially if there were no predictions of a meteor strike). However, there would be something deeply disturbing if one of the aid-givers announced upon leaving the village:
No matter what happens, no matter whether you all are struck by a massive plague in an hour and all die a horrible death or whether a thousand years from now your society will be condemned as deserving of nothing but contempt, what we have done today is our only concern and the value of our act is not diminished regardless of what awaits you!
We suggest that this attitude would be bizarre. Returning to the question of the afterlife, if you think that some good afterlife is possible, one should hope for the long-term flourishing of the villagers in both this life and the next rather than focusing merely on the value of their present position. And if you do have such a hope, why hope that the lives of everyone will come to an end at a specific time, say in a thousand years? Similarly, if you believe that it is likely or even possible that there is an afterlife where there is great ongoing harm, should we not hope that this not be the case for the villagers?
Wielenberg’s comments on the Holocaust are puzzling. Of course, no one except a murderous, psychopathic Nazi would hope the Holocaust lasted longer or that it involved the death of even one more individual. But what one hopes will take place a million years from now is not irrelevant ethically or in terms of values. Consider two futures: in one, the Jews survive a million years from now and are thriving. In another, imagine that a million years from now there is a revival of the Nazi party. The Jews have colonized Mars and Nazi genocidal units are dispatched to treat Jewish settlements the way the Nazis treated the Warsaw Ghetto in 1940. This time, the Nazis succeed in annihilating every last Jew. Surely, it would be deeply perverse to hope for the second future. It would also be perverse to be indifferent now about whether the second will occur. We cannot imagine that a person of integrity would say they are utterly indifferent about whether all Jews will be annihilated by Nazis in the future, be it a million years, ten million, twenty, or….
Nagel’s comment (cited by Wielenberg) is worthy of note. His comment suggests that what we do now will (or may) not matter a million years from now, but there is an important distinction between whether some event matters (in the sense that it is valuable; it is good that the event occurred) and whether persons who live in the future are aware of the event and care about it. Arguably, it will always be the case that the Holocaust should not have happened, regardless of whether any human being remembers it a hundred (or a thousand or a million) years from now. Moreover, those of us who are horrified about this genocide should hope that remembering it and passing on a record of it has no statute of limitation. In keeping with our earlier thought experiment, imagine two futures: a million years from now, persons recall the Holocaust and continue to lament this mass genocide; in a different future imagine persons are all Nazis and they only recall the Holocaust as a failure to succeed in killing all Jews, something they were only able to achieve in the year 1,002,014.
So, one reason why the topic of an afterlife is of historical and contemporary interest is because our values about present persons, things, and events have a bearing on the future, including the possibility of a future for individuals after their death. If we know that it is impossible for individual persons to survive biological death, speculation on an afterlife we might expect or hope for would be pointless (unless it serves some purpose in terms of fiction), but it would not be pointless to reflect on whether the impossibility of an afterlife should dominate our values in this life. What are the implications for our lives now if we take seriously the idea that at death we will pass into oblivion? Some philosophers adopt a strategy like Singer’s and Wielenberg’s about our individual lives. In Religion Without God Ronald Dworkin is candid about “what we desperately dread”, namely “the total, obliterating, itself unimaginable, snuffing out of everything” (2013: 150). While he thinks some kind of individual afterlife may be possible (even given atheistic naturalism) he does propose a “kind of immortality” which is “the only kind we have any business wanting” (Dworkin 2013: 159).
When you do something smaller well—play a tune or a part or a hand, throw a curve or a compliment, make a chair or a sonnet or love—your satisfaction is complete in itself. Those are achievements within life. Why can’t a life also be an achievement complete in itself, with its own value in the art in living it displays? (Dworkin 2013: 158)
Who would deny that such acts can be great achievements? If individual survival of death is impossible, then Dworkin is right to cast aside (as he does) the comedian Woody Allen’s aspiration to live on forever, not in his work, but in his apartment. But do we know that an individual afterlife is impossible? Later in this entry, we suggest that ruling out an afterlife as impossible is philosophically tenuous. Moreover, we suggest that the goods within the life that Dworkin describes invite us to consider whether human lives may be richer still if they do not end in oblivion and instead death marks a transition to a form of afterlife that some of the world religions envision.
So, we suggest that the topic of an afterlife is warranted for at least three reasons: it is important if you love persons in this life and hope for their enduring flourishing (or hope they are not annihilated or meet a worse fate); it is important to think about the implications of there not being an afterlife (or there being one) in terms of how to understand what is important to you now; and it is important to consider for historical reasons: speculation and beliefs about life after death have existed through much of human history.
In most cultures, there is evidence of a belief in some sort of personal afterlife, in which the same individual that lived and died nevertheless persists and continues to have new experiences. There are alternatives, however. The ancient Greeks are noted for having placed a high premium on “survival” in the memory and honor of the community—a practice reflected in our reference to deceased celebrities as (for example) “the immortal Babe Ruth”. (Strictly speaking, this for the Greeks was not a replacement for a personal afterlife, but rather a supplement to what was conceived as a rather colorless and unrewarding existence in Hades.) Such a hope, it would seem, provides a major consolation only if one is optimistic concerning the persistence and continued memory of the community, as well as the accuracy and justice of their judgments. An interesting variant of this form of immorality is found in process theology, with its promise of “objective immortality” in the mind of God, who of course neither forgets nor misjudges the lives he remembers (Hartshorne 1962: 262). Hindu and Buddhist traditions include a belief in reincarnation. Hindu philosophical tradition gives more credence to the enduring of individuals through successive rebirths and deaths than does Buddhist philosophical tradition. In Buddhist philosophy, the ongoing task is to produce a sufficient consciousness of the self for there to be reincarnation, while simultaneously securing the understanding that the individual self is not (in the end) a substantial, concrete thing, but a delusion that will dissolve or become liberated into Nirvana.
Other entries in the SEP address themes in Hindu and Buddhist philosophy (see, e.g., the entry on Mind in Indian Buddhist Philosophy), so we will forego a comparative study here of competing religious portraits of an afterlife. Our focus for much of the rest of this entry is on the possibility and the reasonability of believing there is an afterlife for individual persons, though we will offer some observations along the way about the kinds of afterlife that are possible, given different metaphysical assumptions. As for the philosophers like Kierkegaard and Becker, cited earlier, who castigate those of us who ignore our mortality, we suggest that sometimes the contemplation of mortality can be disabling and distract us from seeking immediate goods (such as those Dworkin highlights) or relieving suffering. It would not be admirable for the aid workers in Singer’s example to pause in their work in order to hold death-and-dying seminars. However, while there might be nothing wrong in living without wrestling with mortality, there are sufficient good reasons why the topics of the nature of death and the existence (or non-existence) of an afterlife are philosophically interesting and deserving of attention.
As we turn to the question of whether it is possible for persons to survive death, it is natural to pursue an answer in light of the philosophy of human persons. The next section considers survival from the standpoint of mind-body dualism.
At first, it seems obvious that dualism is a “survival-friendly” perspective. If we are nothing more than our bodies, it seems that if death destroys our bodies, we are destroyed and there is nothing left of us as persons—though parts of our bodies and the particles that make it up will be scattered and perhaps (temporarily) come to be part of the bodies of other living organisms. If, however, we are nonphysical (or immaterial) minds or souls or persons who are embodied, then even the complete annihilation of our physical bodies does not entail our annihilation as persons. In fact, one of several arguments for dualism is based on the conceivability of our existing without our bodies. If dualism is true, however, it does not necessarily follow that persons will survive the death of their bodies. It may be that the functional dependence of ourselves on our bodies is so essential that we only come into existence as embodied persons when our bodies reach a certain formation and constitution and then we cease to be when that formation and constitution is destroyed. But dualism at least opens the door for claiming that our dependence on our bodies is contingent (not necessary) or is essential only given the present laws of nature (laws that may be violated by God). Dualist accounts of survival have been seriously questioned, however.
Some philosophers argue that dualist accounts of survival fail because we have no “criteria of identity” for disembodied persons. When we make judgments about the identity of persons we are not making judgments about the identity of souls. It has been argued that we cannot make judgments about the identity of souls, because souls are said to be imperceptible and non-spatial. And because of this, the identity of a person over time cannot consist of the identity of the person’s soul over time. What we are able to identify—and re-identify—is a person’s body. But once the person has died that body decomposes in a grave, and can’t be the basis for our identification of the person who is supposed to have survived disembodied (Perry 1978: 6–18).
Hasker claims that this objection is confused, conflating two quite distinct questions (Hasker 1989:208–09). One is a metaphysical question: What does it mean to say of a person at one time that she is numerically the same person at a later time? (Or, if you like, it is a metaphysical question to ask: Is x at t1 the same φ as y at t2?) The second is an epistemological question: How can we tell that a person at one time is numerically the same person at a later time? (Or how can we tell that x at t1 is the same φ as y at t2?) The failure to distinguish these questions (a failure which may be due in part to Wittgenstein) is the source of serious philosophical confusions. The short answer to the first question is that normally, when we know what a φ is, we know also what it is for a φ at t1 to be the same individual φ as a φ at t2. The abnormal cases are those in which the φ at t1 has undergone changes, and we are unsure whether those changes amount to the destruction of the φ, or its replacement by another object, so that the very same φ cannot possibly have persisted until t2. The classic example is the ship of Theseus, but there are many others. In such cases, our first recourse is to seek to understand more accurately the concept of a φ—does our concept of a ship, for example, allow for the progressive replacement of all of the ship’s parts, or not? But sometimes there may be no determinate answer to this question. Our concepts, after all, have been developed to deal with the sorts of contingencies that normally arise, and it may sometimes be possible to invent scenarios (or even to discover them empirically) that are not provided for in our ordinary usage of a concept. In that case, we must either provide for ourselves criteria to cover the novel situation (thus modifying our previous concept of a φ), or else admit that the question we were asking has no answer.
When we pose this question with regard to the persistence of immaterial souls, what we find is that there is no problem that needs a solution. We know what it is to be a subject of experience—to be a being that thinks, and believes, and desires various things, for example—and prima facie at least this does not entail being embodied, let alone being embodied in the very same body over time. If we think of the immaterial soul in Cartesian terms, there simply isn’t anything that can happen to such a soul (barring its being no longer sustained in existence by God) that could bring it about that the soul ceases to be; Cartesian souls are “naturally immortal”. Some other dualist views may not opt for natural immortality of the soul, and if so they will need to say something about the sorts of changes that a soul can and cannot sustain if it is to remain in existence as the individual it was. But there is no problem here for the general hypothesis of survival as an immaterial soul (Hasker 1999: 206–11).
The metaphysical question having been disposed of, it becomes apparent that the epistemological question is less significant than it may appear to be at first. How do we re-identify immaterial souls over time? Under normal circumstances, we do this by re-identifying the embodiment of the soul, but this is not always possible: prior at least to the advent of DNA testing, cases of disputed identity could not always be settled by re-identifying bodies. Sometimes the subject’s memory of events is an important clue, though not of course an infallible one. But can any tests establish the identity of a completely non-embodied subject? Evidently, the question of the identity of a non-embodied subject makes sense to some: those who consult spiritualist mediums certainly understand the question, whether they’re conversing with dear departed Aunt Susie, or merely with a manipulative practitioner. But again, once it is seen that there is no metaphysical problem here, the epistemological question becomes purely a practical one, requiring to be answered if and when we have the need in practice to make such identifications.
It is also worth noting that an objection against individual continuity in dualism can be deployed against individual continuity in materialism. One objection (that can be traced back to Kant) against dualism is that the dualist is unable to account for the possibility that the soul or immaterial self is constantly being replaced by different individual selves, (with complete updated “memories” and psychological qualities) thus creating the illusion of personal continuity of the self-same subject. If the self is immaterial, how would we notice the successive changes? This may be called the problem of undetected (and perhaps undetectable) soul-switching. This objection faces many obstacles, one being that we would be unable to properly account for our experience of successive states (we hear Big Ben ring three times by first hearing it ring twice) if we are not the self-same individuals over time. But more to the point, in terms of continuity, it is logically possible that material bodies are switched every nanosecond. If the switch (or annihilation and creation) were done in an instant (as opposed to an interval) there would be no duration, no event that could be measured by us that would reveal the switch. If undetectable material object-switching is not a problem, then undetectable soul-switching should not be a problem.
There may still be an objection to a dualist account of an afterlife which holds that the idea of disembodied survival, even if not logically incoherent, is one we don’t have a sufficient grasp of to allow it to count as a real possibility. What would such survival amount to, anyway? Of course, if the souls of the departed are assumed to be fitted out immediately with resurrection bodies, this difficulty is greatly alleviated. But if the notion of an immaterial soul is to do any philosophical work, we need to be able to think what it might be like for such a soul to exist on its own, disembodied.
This challenge has been met in an interesting article by H.H. Price (1953). Price spells out, in considerable detail, a notion of disembodied souls existing in a “world” of something like dream-images—images, however, that would be shared between a number of more or less like-minded, and telepathically interacting, souls. Included among these images would be images of one’s own body and of other people’s bodies, so that one might, at first, find it difficult to distinguish the image-world from the ordinary physical world we presently inhabit. The conception is similar to Berkeley’s, except that Price does not invoke God directly as the sustainer of regularities in the image-world. He does say, however, that
if we are theists, we shall hold that the laws of nature, in other worlds as in this one, are in the end dependent on the will of a Divine Creator. (1953: 390)
Someone who seriously considers Price’s development of this idea will be forced to admit that a sufficiently clear account of what disembodied existence might be like has been proposed. We need not follow Price in (what appears to be) his supposition that this is a plausible account of the actual state of persons who have died. It is enough if he has provided an account that makes plain the intelligibility of the notion of disembodied survival; the believer in an afterlife can then say, “If not in just this way, then in some other”.
If there is reason to think that mind-body dualism is true, then there is reason to think that a person’s survival of death is logically possible. But dualism has come upon hard times lately, and is widely regarded as being discredited. Whether or not this is warranted, dualism is undoubtedly subject to a number of objections, though these are not necessarily more severe than the difficulties that attend materialism (see the entry on dualism, also Koons and Bealer (eds.) 2010). In view of this let us consider also the possibility of survival given some form of materialism.
What are the prospects for survival on a materialistic view of persons? One possible reason for thinking that materialism is not hostile to the prospects of an afterlife is that, historically, the standard view of the afterlife in the major theistic traditions is that it involves the resurrection of bodies. While there is a longstanding theological tradition that links belief in bodily resurrection with dualism, many theologians and some philosophers argue that dualism is a Platonic import into theistic traditions (Cullman 1955), and that it is more in keeping with the Hebrew, Christian, and Islamic stress on bodily life to understand the afterlife in materialist rather than dualist terms.
The central logical problem for materialist versions of the resurrection is personal identity. On dualist assumptions, personal identity is preserved by the persistence of the soul between death and resurrection. But for materialism, nothing bridges the spatio-temporal gap between the body that perishes and that body resurrected. Without such a bridge, how can the “resurrected” person be identical with the person who died? Considerable ingenuity has been expended in the search for an answer to this question.
Without doubt, the most popular materialist option here is the “re-creation” theory, according to which, at some time after a person’s death, God re-creates the person by creating a body with the identical characteristics of the body that perished (Hick 1983: 125–26). While this may seem rather ghastly in cases of violent death, there is no reason why God could not correct any injury and renew the body’s youthfulness, and so on. But can this re-creation preserve the necessity of the identity relation (the fact that your persistence over time as you is strict and not contingent)? If you are re-created, the “you” that comes into existence in the re-creation cannot just contingently happen to be you (as if someone else could do the job of being you). One reason to suspect that the identity relationship is not preserved (and this is not merely an epistemological matter) is that if God could create one body that is exactly similar to the body that died, why not two or more? It is not a satisfactory answer to this to say that God, being good, would not (and perhaps could not) do such a thing. On the view in question, what is necessary for resurrection is merely that material particles be arranged in the correct fashion, and it is hardly a necessary truth that only God could do this. (Perhaps a really smart rogue angel could pull it off!) Nor is it feasible to guarantee uniqueness by requiring that the identical particles present in the dead body make up the resurrected body. On the one hand, the body has no doubt shed, during its life, enough particles to make several bodies, and it is hardly credible that the replacement of one of the atoms present at the time of death with an atom shed by the body a few seconds before death would mean we have a different body (assuming other requirements to be satisfied). If, on the other hand, only particles from the body at the time of death may be used, there are the long-recognized problems about the availability of some of these particles, which within a few years may have made their ways into a large number of other human bodies. In any case there is a hard-to-quell intuition that reassembly, no matter how expertly completed, would at best produce a replica rather than the identical body that perished. Peter van Inwagen offers a compelling example:
Suppose a certain monastery claims to have in its possession a manuscript written in St. Augustine’s own hand. And suppose the monks of this monastery further claim that this manuscript was burned by Arians in the year 457. It would immediately occur to us to ask how this manuscript, the one we can touch, could be the very manuscript that was burned in 457. Suppose their answer to this question is that God miraculously recreated Augustine’s manuscript in 458. We should respond to this answer as follows: the deed it describes seems quite impossible, even as an accomplishment of omnipotence. God certainly might have created a perfect duplicate of the original manuscript, but it would not be that one; its earliest moment of existence would have been after Augustine’s death; it would never have known the impress of his hand; it would not have been a part of the furniture of the world when he was alive; and so on. Now suppose our monks were to reply by simply asserting that the manuscript now in their possession did know the impress of Augustine’s hand; that it was a part of the furniture of the world when the Saint was alive; that when God recreated or restored it, God (as an indispensable component of accomplishing this task) saw to it that the object God produced had all these properties. [para. break in 1978]
We confess we should not know what to make of this. We should have to tell the monks that we did not see how what they believed could possibly be true. (van Inwagen 1992: 242–43)
Given these difficulties with the re-creation view, attempts have been made to find other ways of accounting for resurrection in materialist terms. One of the more interesting of these is Lynne Rudder Baker’s invocation of a constitution view of persons (Baker 2000, 2001, 2005). On this view persons are not identical with, but are constituted by, their bodies. (She discusses the constitution relation at considerable length; the details of this are not relevant here.) What is distinctive of persons is a “first-person perspective”, roughly, the capacity to think of oneself as oneself. This ability, which humans possess but other animals seem to lack, is an essential component of moral responsibility as well as of our ability to plan for the future and to perform many other distinctively personal activities and functions. According to Baker, the constitution view opens the way for a doctrine of resurrection that avoids the difficulties of the re-creation theory. Since persons are not identical with their bodies, it need not be maintained that the resurrected body is the same identical body as the body that died. What is required, however, is that the first-person perspective of the resurrected body be the same: “if a person’s first-person perspective were extinguished, the person would go out of existence” (2005: 385). So the first-person perspective must somehow be transferred from the original body to the resurrection body:
person P1 at t1 is the same person as person P2 at t2 if and only if P1 and P2 have the same first-person perspective. (2000: 132)
Baker holds that there is indeed a fact of the matter as to whether a given future person has the same first-person perspective as I now have, though there is no “informative” way of specifying criteria of identity between the two.
Although Baker’s account is intriguing, it seems problematic when one takes a closer look at the idea of a first-person perspective. Arguably, to have a first-person perspective, one has to be a person. To have a first-person perspective is to have the capacity to experience things; to act, think, speak, and so on with intention. Such acts can in principle be qualitatively identical in different thinkers and speakers; what individuates them is the person who’s doing the thinking or speaking. In other words, intentional acts derive their identity from the person performing them. But if this is true of the acts themselves it is also true of the first-person perspectives, which are nothing but the capacities of various persons to perform such acts. So to say that P1 and P2 have the same first-person perspective is just to say that P1 and P2 are the same person, and the criterion reduces to a tautology. Regrettably, we have not yet been given any help in understanding how a person, with her first-person perspective, can occupy first one body and then another.
Another proposal is offered by Kevin Corcoran (2005). Corcoran, like Baker, is a constitution theorist, but, unlike Baker, he does not believe persons can be transferred from one body to another. Corcoran proposes that the body of a resurrected person does need to be identical with the body of the person when he died. Corcoran advances several proposals about how this might be possible. The one to be noted here is what might be termed a “brute force” solution:
If God causes that body to exist once, why could God not cause it to exist a second time? … But what makes the first stage of the post-gap body a different stage of the same body that perished is just that God makes it so. (2005: 172)
This comes extremely close to making identity over time a matter of convention—divine convention, to be sure, but convention all the same. (It is reminiscent of Jonathan Edwards’ view that we are justly punished for Adam’s sin in the Garden of Eden because God has decreed that the segment of Adam’s life including the sin is a segment of our own lives also.) It is difficult to measure when an appeal to divine fiat is philosophically licit or illicit. The challenge facing Corcoran’s position may be similar to the one Hick faces: how would God distinguish between re-creating the same body that was destroyed earlier and creating an exact duplicate?
We have left until last van Inwagen’s own proposal for a materialist resurrection. For in spite of his criticisms of the common view, van Inwagen is himself a Christian and a believer in the resurrection. Here is his proposal:
Perhaps at the moment of each man’s death, God removes his corpse and replaces it with a simulacrum which is what is burned or rots. Or perhaps God is not quite so wholesale as this: perhaps He removes for “safekeeping” only the “core person”—the brain and central nervous system—or even some special part of it. These are details. (van Inwagen 1992: 245–46)
Continuity is maintained, then, through the preservation of the body (or crucial body-part, such as the brain), and when the time comes for resurrection to occur, God restores life to the body in question and one’s resurrected life can begin. In fairness, it should be pointed out that van Inwagen originally advanced this proposal only in order to demonstrate the logical possibility of a materialist resurrection. In this he may well have succeeded. But as a proposal that is supposed to represent the actual way in which God enables humans to live again, the account has very little to recommend it. In this view, God assumes the role of contemporary practitioners of cryonics, preserving the dead body until such time as it is revived and restored to health. But this is bad news for the actual practitioners, since the “bodies” they are preserving are mere simulacra and presumably incapable of being revived, even if all the technology functions flawlessly. Furthermore, the feature of the account that makes it unacceptable—that God “spirits away” the crucial part of the person’s body, leaving behind a simulacrum—is essential to the view’s success in depicting a possible way of resurrection. In the Author’s Note appended in 1992, van Inwagen writes:
If I were writing a paper on this topic today, I should not make the definite statement “I think this is the only way such a being could accomplish it”. I am now inclined to think that there may well be other ways, ways that I am unable even to form an idea of because I lack the conceptual resources to do so. (1992: 246)
A more recent, and extremely ingenious, account of an afterlife from a materialist point of view has been proposed by Dean Zimmerman. The proposal goes roughly like this: at the instant of death, each elementary particle in a person’s body undergoes “budding” in which it produces another particle of the same kind. The newly produced particle takes its place in a resurrection body, existing in a resurrection “space”; at the same time the original particle remains in place as part of the corpse. Since it is the resurrection body, and not the corpse, which continues the life of the subject, the resurrection body rather than the corpse is the “closest continuer” of the pre-death body. It is, then, the resurrection body and not the corpse that is the same body as the one that previously lived, and personal identity is preserved. This proposal abandons strict (Leibnizian) identity in favor of a "closest continuer" theory. It also shares an interesting feature with van Inwagen’s account: the remaining corpse is not the same body as the one that previously lived. (Zimmerman 1999 and 2010; Hasker 2011).
It has not been shown conclusively that an identity-preserving materialist resurrection is impossible, but the difficulties, as outlined above, are formidable (Hasker 1999: 211–31). Proponents of an afterlife, it seems, would be better served if they were able to espouse some variety of mind-body dualism. This entry cannot undertake an assessment of the comparative merits of dualism and materialism. It is worth noting, however, that recent philosophy has seen an increased recognition in some quarters of the difficulties resulting from materialist views, and a corresponding interest in different (not necessarily Cartesian) varieties of dualism. See Koons & Bealer (eds.) 2010, and Batthyany & Elitzur (eds.) 2009.
During the heyday of logical positivism in the twentieth century, it is interesting that while Moritz Schlick proposed that its demands for empirical verification would render propositions about God as meaningless, it would not rule out as meaningless propositions about life after death so long as they involved subjects having experiences. Interestingly, some of the most rigid materialists in the last century, such as Willard Van Orman Quine and Paul Churchland, allowed for the possibility of there being compelling empirical evidence of parapsychological powers and even ghosts. In this section, let us consider whether there is empirical support for belief in an afterlife.
Parapsychology investigates phenomena that are alleged to lie outside the boundaries of ordinary naturalistic explanation. These phenomena include telepathy, clairvoyance, precognition, mediumistic messages, possession-type cases, reincarnation-type cases, apparitions, and others. Not all of these phenomena are directly relevant to survival and the afterlife, but some of them, if accepted as veridical, do provide such evidence: for instance, messages received through a medium, allegedly from a deceased person, that contain information to which the medium has no other access.
The evaluation of this body of evidence is highly contentious. Clearly there exists both motive and opportunity for fraud and fabrication in many cases. It is questionable, though, whether a responsible inquirer can afford to dismiss out of hand all cases that seem to defy ordinary naturalistic explanation. It counts against a sweeping dismissive approach that the phenomena have been attested as probably veridical by some highly reputable investigators, including such philosophers as William James, Henry Sidgwick, C.D. Broad, H.H. Price and John Beloff. These men had little to gain personally by their investigations; indeed in undertaking them they endangered already well-established reputations. Investigating the subject with finely-honed critical instincts, they have applied stringent tests in selecting instances they consider to be credible, and have rejected many cases they held to be fraudulent or inadequately attested.
If we are willing to give an initial hearing to this evidence, what conclusions can reasonably be reached? A conclusion that many (but not all) of these investigators would accept is that the evidence provides some, but not conclusive, evidence for personal survival after death (Steinkamp 2002). However, the reason why the evidence is deemed inconclusive will give little comfort to many afterlife skeptics. The reason it is not conclusive is that the experiences are susceptible of a different explanation if we accept the existence of some rather spectacular forms of extra-sensory perception, also known as “super psi” (see Braude 2002). An example is a case in which a medium received information that apparently was known in its entirety to no living person. In order to avoid the conclusion that the information was communicated from the deceased person, the medium must be credited with clairvoyance as well as the ability to integrate information received telepathically from several different persons. C.D. Broad (1953: 114) summarized the situation well: the possibility of extra-sensory perception weakens the direct force of the evidence for survival by making possible alternative explanations of that evidence. But ESP strengthens the overall case by raising the antecedent probability of survival, insofar as it renders problematic the naturalistic view of the human person, which for most contemporaries constitutes the greatest obstacle to belief in survival.
More recently, it has been claimed that a superior source of evidence lies in so-called “near-death experiences” (Bailey and Yates (eds.) 1996). These are experiences of persons who were, or perceived themselves to be, close to death; indeed many such persons met the criteria for clinical death. While in this state, they undergo remarkable experiences, often taken to be experiences of the world that awaits them after death. Returning to life, they testify to their experiences, claiming in many cases to have had their subsequent lives transformed as a result of the near-death experience. This testimony may seem especially compelling in that (a) large numbers of persons report having had such experiences; (b) the experiences come spontaneously to those near death, they are not sought out or deliberately induced; and (c) normally no one stands to benefit financially from either the experiences or the reports.
These experiences, furthermore, are not random in their contents. There are recurring elements that show up in many of these accounts, forming a general (but far from invariable) pattern. Typical elements include a sense of being dead, peacefulness and absence of pain; “out-of-body experiences” in which the subject views his or her own body “from outside” and witnesses various events, sometimes at a considerable distance from the location of the person’s body; passing through a dark tunnel towards intense light; meeting “beings of light” (sometimes including friends and relatives who have died previously); and a “life review” in which the events of one’s life pass before one and are subjected to evaluation. The subject may be initially disappointed or reluctant to return to the body, and (as already noted) many testify that the experience has been life-changing, leading to a lessened—or even a complete absence of—fear of death and other beneficial results.
These experiences are surprisingly common. A Gallup poll taken in 1982 found that eight million Americans (about five percent of the adult population at that time) had survived a near-death experience (NDE). The experiences occur regardless of age, social class, race, or marital status. Probably the improvements in medical technology, which enable many to return from a state of “clinical death”, have increased the numbers in recent times. But NDEs have been reported throughout recorded history and from all corners of the earth. Since the publication in 1975 of Raymond Moody’s book, Life After Life (1975), there have been numerous studies of the phenomenon, some of them carried out with careful attention to scientific objectivity (e.g., Ring 1980; Sabom 1982; van Lommel et al. 2001).
As one might expect, there is a wide variety of interpretations of NDEs, from those that interpret the experiences as literally revealing a state that lies beyond death to interpretations that attempt to debunk the experiences by classifying them as mere reflections of abnormal brain states. Clearly, there is no one medical or physiological cause; the experiences occur for persons in a great variety of medical conditions. An interesting counterexample to explanations in terms of the “dying brain” is found in the NDEs experienced by mountain climbers in the midst of what they expected to be fatal falls (Heim 1892); it is hardly credible that these experiences can be reduced to either drugs or oxygen deprivation.
On the other hand, interpretations of NDEs as literally revelatory of the life to come, though common in the popular literature, are extremely questionable. Carol Zaleski has shown, through her comparative studies of medieval and modern NDEs, that many features of these experiences vary in ways that correspond to cultural expectations (Zaleski 1987). A striking instance of this is the minimal role played by judgment and damnation in modern NDEs; unlike the medieval cases, the modern life-review tends to be therapeutic rather than judgmental in emphasis. In view of this, Zaleski ascribes the experiences to the religious imagination, insisting that to do so enhances rather than diminishes their significance. Claims of cross-cultural invariance in modern NDEs are also questionable. The majority of the research has been done in cultures where Christianity is the predominant religious influence, but research done in other cultures reveals significantly different patterns. One amusing difference occurs in the episodes in which it is decided that the experiencer will return to embodied life rather than remaining in the afterworld. In Western NDEs there is often a “spirit guide” who counsels the experiencer that it is better that he or she should return to life. In India, on the other hand, the person is often turned back with the information that there has been a clerical error in the paperwork, so that it was by mistake that he or she came to this point! (K. Augustine 2008, Other Internet Resources, see the section on “Cultural Differences”).
The causation of these experiences is problematic. Some aspects of the experience have been deliberately induced by the administration of drugs (see Jansen 1997); this demonstrates that such phenomena can be produced by chemical alterations to the brain, but in most NDE cases no such chemical causes can be identified. Several researchers have concluded that the triggering cause of the NDE is simply the perceived nearness of death. (NDEs have also been experienced by persons who believed they were close to death but were not in fact in any life-threatening situation (K. Augustine 2008, Other Internet Resources, see the section on Pam Reynolds).) The specific content of NDEs can be divided into mundane content, in which what is experienced is or resembles typical features of the ordinary world, and transcendental content, portraying “another realm” quite unlike the world of ordinary experience. The source of the transcendental content is problematic, though the cultural variations suggest that a significant role must be assigned to cultural expectations concerning the afterlife.
Finally, there is what Gary Habermas has termed the evidential aspect of NDEs. These are phenomena that, provided they can be verified, would indicate strongly that something is occurring that is not susceptible of an ordinary naturalistic explanation. This might seem to be the most helpful direction to look if the aim is to arrive at an objectively compelling assessment of NDEs. If it should turn out to be possible to verify objectively certain paranormal aspects of NDEs, fully naturalistic explanations could be ruled out and the way would be open for further exploration concerning the meaning of the experiences. On the other hand, if all such evidential aspects could be fully explained in terms of ordinary natural processes, the claim of NDEs to be revelatory of anything metaphysically significant would be greatly weakened.
Evidential aspects of NDEs fall into several categories. First, there are out-of-body sensory experiences, in which patients, often while comatose, observe accurately features to which they have no access through normal sensory channels. In one case, an eight-year-old girl who nearly drowned required 45 minutes of CPR to restore her heartbeat:
In the meantime, she said that she floated out of her body and visited heaven. Additionally … she was able to totally and correctly recount the details from the time the paramedics arrived in her yard through the work performed later in the hospital emergency room. (Moreland and Habermas 1998: 159)
Second, there are accounts of sensory experiences which accurately report events that occurred during periods in which the subject’s heart had stopped, and even during “flat EEG” periods in which there was no detectable brain activity. Finally, there are “surprise encounters” during the NDE with friends and relatives who had in fact recently died, but where the subject had no knowledge of this prior to the time of the experience. Here the crucial question would be, Where did the subject obtain knowledge of the other person’s death? If ordinary channels of communication can be ruled out, the most natural conclusion would seem to be that this knowledge was obtained from the deceased person, who is somehow still alive.
All of these claims concerning the evidential value of NDEs have been called into question. One of the most thorough discussions is by Keith Augustine (Other Internet Resources, 2008), who draws on work by a large number of other researchers. As noted already, there is overwhelming evidence that NDEs do not provide a literal experience of conditions in the afterlife; this is attested, among other things, by the considerable variations in these experiences in different times and different cultures. Also relevant here is the fact that similar experiences sometimes happen to persons who mistakenly believe themselves to be in life-threatening circumstances. Apparently it is the perceived nearness to death, rather than the actual proximity of the afterworld, that triggers the experiences. The encounters with persons recently deceased, but whose deaths were previously unknown to the experiencer, become somewhat less impressive once it is recognized that still-living persons may also be encountered in NDEs (“Living Persons”). These still-living persons were otherwise occupied at the time of the NDEs; they cannot have been literally present in the other-worldly realm in which they were encountered. And given that still-living persons can appear in NDEs, it becomes statistically probable that on occasion there will also be encounters with persons who have recently died but whose death was unknown to the experiencer.
Claims that NDEs occurred during periods with no brain activity are countered by the rejoinder that an EEG may not reveal all activity within the brain. Functional magnetic resonance imaging, for example, can reveal activity that is missed by an EEG. In cases where brain activity has indeed ceased for a given patient, the NDE may have occurred either before the cessation or after normal brain activity has resumed; it is not necessary to assume that the NDE and the brain’s non-activity were simultaneous (“Living Persons”). With respect to the claim of information that was learned during the NDE that was not otherwise available, various answers are possible. It is noted, first of all, that inaccurate “information” is often reported (“Out-of-Body Discrepancies”). In some cases where the information is confirmed, we may be dealing with subsequent enhancement as a result of the repeated recital of the story. (This need not involve deliberate deception; it is a common experience that stories often repeated tend to gain new features of interest in the telling.) In other cases, it is argued that the information was in fact available through ordinary sensory channels, often through the experiencer’s hearing of things said during a medical procedure when they were apparently unconscious and unresponsive. (There is considerable evidence that “unconscious” persons do hear and register things said when they are apparently oblivious to their surroundings.) (“Veridical Paranormal Perception During OBEs?”) However, it is worth noting that Augustine makes little effort to establish that the factors cited in his naturalistic explanations were actually operative in the various NDE cases. It would appear to be his view that the burden of proof lies almost entirely on the shoulders of those who make claims on behalf of the evidential value of NDEs.
With regard to this entire body of evidence, both from parapsychology and from NDEs, we may be close to an impasse. Those who support the evidential value of the experiences will argue that the naturalistic explanations that have been offered are not adequate, that they display excessive skepticism towards well-confirmed accounts, and are in many instances highly speculative. Those who reject the evidential value of these phenomena (including some believers in the afterlife) will argue that the evidence is insufficient to warrant the extraordinary claims that are made, that the naturalistic explanations work well overall, and that a full explanation of the most puzzling cases would require a detailed knowledge of the events and surrounding circumstances that in many cases is not available to us. Further careful research on individual cases may offer some hope of progress, but it seems unlikely that the fundamental disagreements can be resolved, especially when the different viewpoints are supported by diverse worldviews.
Leaving aside such empirical evidence, what general metaphysical considerations are relevant to belief in survival? We have already seen that a materialist account of persons creates some serious obstacles. As van Inwagen and others have argued, God could bring about an afterlife for persons in a way consistent with a materialist philosophy of mind. But in the absence of God, a materialist, naturalist worldview seems not at all promising for survival. As noted earlier, mind-body dualism would offer some support for the possibility of survival but dualism by no means guarantees survival; the old arguments from the simplicity and alleged indestructibility of souls are out of favor. As Kant observed, a “simple” soul, which cannot be dissolved into its constituent parts, might still fade away gradually until it has completely disappeared. What often is not sufficiently appreciated, however, is the close tie between theism and belief in an afterlife. The point is not merely that theistic religions incorporate belief in an afterlife which many persons accept because of this religious context. The tie is closer than that, and it has considerable force in both directions.
Suppose, on the one hand, that the God of theism does in fact exist. According to theism, God is both all-powerful and perfectly good, and this goodness is supposed to be of a sort that is relevant to the welfare of human beings (and other rational creatures, if there are any). Indeed, this is not merely a speculative assumption; there are Biblical texts proclaiming that God is a God of love. If there is reason to believe that God loves created persons, then it is highly plausible to believe that God desires to provide creatures with the opportunity for a greater, and longer-lasting, fulfillment than is possible within the brief scope of earthly existence. This is especially true, one would think, for those who, through no fault of their own, find their lives blighted by disease, or accident, or war, or any of the other natural or anthropogenic disasters to which we are vulnerable. And yet even those of us who enjoy relatively good and satisfying lives are conscious of far, far more that could be accomplished and enjoyed, given more time and the vigor and energy to use it well.
This argument can also be reversed to telling effect. If there is no afterlife, no realm in which the sorrows of this life can be assuaged and its injustices remedied, then it may be argued that the problem of evil becomes impossible to solve in any rationally intelligible way. Arguably, a perfectly good and all-powerful God would not make a cosmos in which all or most created persons have lives that are full of misery and then are annihilated; nor would an all-loving good God create a cosmos in which there is no opportunity for transformation beyond this life. That is not to say, of course, that allowing for an afterlife makes the problem of evil easy for theists—that is far from being the case. But it does provide a way in which this life’s injustices can be seen as not having had the last word—victims in this life do not have to be eternally victims and those who’ve done evil won’t get away with it. For these reasons, one would be hard pressed to find very many theists (as opposed to deists) who do not also affirm belief in an afterlife.
The close connection between theism and an afterlife is affirmed in Kant’s arguments for the “postulates of practical reason”. To be sure, Kant gives different reasons for postulating God and for postulating an afterlife, and the ends to be served by these postulations are ostensibly different. In actuality, however, it is highly plausible that the two postulates are inseparable. We ought to postulate God, because only in this way is it possible that in the end happiness should be enjoyed by persons in proportion to their moral worthiness. Given the actual conditions of the present life, it is evident that this end can be secured, if at all, only in a future existence. We are told to postulate immortality, because only an endless life makes possible continued progress towards the goal of a coincidence of one’s will with the requirements of the moral law. But for such continued progress to be at all likely to occur would seem to require some kind of morally benign conditions in the afterlife, and Kant implicitly assumes that such conditions will obtain.
What about an argument in the opposite direction: if it is reasonable to believe in an afterlife, is it more reasonable to believe in theism? Given the reasonability of believing in an afterlife, it would be more reasonable to believe that theism is true rather than materialistic naturalism, but the reasonability of theism would have to be weighed in the context of non-theistic philosophies and religions that include belief in an afterlife. Nontheistic Hinduism and Buddhism include beliefs about an afterlife; in these religious traditions, belief in an afterlife is part of their understanding of cosmic justice, a system in which one’s reincarnation (and, ultimately, one’s enlightenment and liberation) depends on one’s Karma. These, and other traditions such as Jainism, involve matters that are addressed in other entries in the SEP, but we offer here a modest observation on how the evidence for a good afterlife (an afterlife that is in accord with some morally sound order) might lend more support for one religion or philosophy than another.
Imagine that we have good reason to believe (or we possess Kantian justification for faith) that the cosmos is ultimately ordered in a just and moral manner (felicity and virtue will be in concord, and the wicked will not flourish indefinitely and so on). Imagine further that we can limit the most plausible accounts of such a moral order on the basis of either traditional theistic accounts of the afterlife or a system of reincarnation in which Karma is at work determining successive re-births until enlightenment—liberation. Robin Collins has argued that the second alternative faces what he calls the “karma management problem”. He writes,
Traditionally Buddhists have believed that by and large the circumstances of one’s rebirth are determined by one’s karma—that is, one’s deeds, whether good or bad in this and previous lives. This, however, seems to require that there exist something like a “program” that arranges your genes, the family conditions you are born into, and the like to correspond to the moral worth of your past deeds (Collins 1999: 206).
For theists, such as many (but not all) Hindus, this minute arrangement of one’s life circumstances to match one’s karma can be viewed as the work of God. So long as we recognize the intelligibility of divine agency, the “management” of reincarnation should in principle be no more difficult to accept than any other theistic explanations. But in the absence of theistic, intentional explanations, how would a “karma program” work, and how was it initiated? We know today, by means that were not available to the ancient Hindus and Buddhists, that “nature”—the nature that is known and studied in the natural sciences—simply doesn’t work this way. The laws of nature are subtle and marvelously complex (though also, in their own way, “simple”), but it is abundantly clear that they do not work in such a way as to determine physical situations in accordance with the moral worth of persons, or in accordance with any moral considerations whatsoever. The laws of nature, we might say, are no respecters of persons—or of morality. Rather, they are impersonal in character, and in many cases are expressible in mathematical formulae that are far removed from the teleology that permeates human existence. So if there is a “karmic moral order” of the sort postulated by the Indian traditions, it must be something radically different from the order of nature that (so far as science can discern) governs the physical processes of the world. And yet the two orders must be intimately related, for it is precisely these physical processes which, in the end, are said to be disposed in accordance with one’s karma. It is wholly implausible that two diverse systems of cosmic order such as this should arise from unrelated sources and come together accidentally; they must, then, have a common source. If the common source of the natural order and the karmic order is impersonal, we are still in need of some account of how and why it would be such as to produce these two quite different sorts of order in the cosmos. These questions, it would seem, are much more readily answered if we postulate a personal source of both the natural and the moral order—that is to say, a God who desired that there be created persons, and who wished to provide a stable natural order within which they could live and exercise their varied powers.
This is of course a mere sketch of an argument that would require much more space for its full development. We offer the above line of reasoning as an example of how one might compare the merits of alternative accounts of an afterlife. It is also offered to make the point that the case for or against an afterlife is best understood in light of one’s overall metaphysics. To see further how philosophical reflection on an afterlife might be guided by metaphysical considerations, consider briefly what has been called the argument from desire. Without question, many persons strongly desire that there should be an afterlife and believe in one largely if not entirely for that reason. It is also beyond question that most philosophers would regard this as a classic case of wishful thinking. But this conclusion is too hasty; indeed, it commits the fallacy of begging the question. To be sure, if the universe is naturalistic, then the desire that many persons have for an afterlife does not constitute any kind of evidence that an afterlife exists. One might inquire about the causes of such a desire and, given its widespread occurrence, might wonder about its possible Darwinian survival value. But no evidential weight would attach to the desire on the assumption of naturalism.
Suppose, on the other hand, that theism (or some view close to theism) is true. On this supposition, human life is not the accidental product of mindless forces that have operated with no thought to it or to anything else. On the contrary, human life (and the life of other rational creatures, if there are any) is the product of an evolutionary process, which was itself designed to produce such beings, by a God who loves them and cares for them. If this is so, then there is a strong case to be made that desires which are universal, or near-universal, among human beings are desires for which satisfaction is possible. The inference does not amount to a certainty; it is possible that humans have distorted God’s purpose for them, and certainly human conceptions of the way in which certain desires could be satisfied may be wide of the mark. But the presumption must be that desires that are widespread or universal are aimed at some genuine and attainable good, however inadequate the conceptions of that good held by many individuals may be. And if this is so, persons who take the desire for an afterlife as a reason to believe in one are on the side of right reason in doing so. Only if one assumes from the outset that the universe is not human-friendly can the charge of wishful thinking be sustained.
A great many persons who believe in life after death do so because of reasons that are internal to their own religious traditions. Hindus and Buddhists have their accounts of persons who remember in detail events of their previous lives. Jews will rely on the visions of Ezekiel and the traditions of the rabbis; Muslims on the prophecies of the Koran. Christians will think of the resurrection of Jesus. Whether any of these appeals has serious evidentiary force is a question that cannot be pursued within the scope of this article; they must all the same be included in any overall assessment of the rationality of belief in an afterlife.
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The authors thank Meredith Varie and Samuel Benson for their assisting us in editing this entry.