Notes to Special Obligations

1. I have added the parentheticals because it is at least possible for some person to have made promises to every moral being on the planet, or to be friends with all moral being. Such a person would have to have lived a very long life, but such Methuselahs are not impossibilities.

2. It will not do to say that, for example, duties of mutual aid are such that we owe them to any person who is such that she is in need and we are able to provide her with that aid: for any person, if she needs aid and I can give it to her, then I have a duty to do so. After all, it is the case that we owe special obligations to any person who is such that, for example, we have made a promise to her: for any person, if I have made a promise to her, then I have a duty to keep the promise. These conditionals concerning the conditions under which we have certain duties seem exactly parallel in the cases of natural duties and of special obligations. Again, what we need is some characterization of what counts as a special relationship to a person, some characterization that excludes, for example, mere causal proximity.

3. Some philosophers restrict their use of the term ‘obligation’ to refer to those moral reasons that are voluntarily assumed, where ‘duties’ refers only to non-voluntarily assumed moral reasons. This restriction is overly restrictive, in that it would force those who both defend what are normally called special ‘obligations’ and reject the voluntarist thesis to refer instead to special ‘duties.’ In any case, nothing seems to ride on one's choice of terminology.

Copyright © 2014 by
Diane Jeske <>

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