Modal Interpretations of Quantum Mechanics

First published Tue Nov 12, 2002; substantive revision Wed Dec 12, 2012

The original “modal interpretation” of non-relativistic quantum theory was born in the early 1970s, and at that time the phrase referred to a single interpretation. The phrase now encompasses a class of interpretations, and is better taken to refer to a general approach to the interpretation of quantum theory. We shall describe the history of modal interpretations, how the phrase has come to be used in this way, and the general program of (at least some of) those who advocate this approach.

1. The origin of the modal approach

In traditional approaches to quantum measurement theory a central role is played by the projection postulate, which asserts that upon measurement of a physical system its state will be projected (“collapses”) onto a state corresponding to the value found in the measurement. However, this postulate leads to many difficulties: What causes this discontinuous change in the physical state of a system? What exactly is a “measurement” as opposed to an ordinary physical interaction? The postulate is especially worrying when applied to entangled compound systems whose components are well-separated in space. For example, in the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen (EPR) experiment there are strict correlations between two systems that have interacted in the past, in spite of the fact that the correlated quantities are not sharply defined in the individual systems. The projection postulate in this case implies that the collapse resulting from a measurement on one of the systems instantaneously defines a sharp property in the distant other system.

A possible way clear of these problems was noticed by van Fraassen (1972, 1974, 1991), who proposed to eliminate the projection postulate from the theory. Others had made this proposal before, as Bohm (1952) in his theory (itself preceded by de Broglie's proposals from the 1920s), Everett (1957) in his relative-state interpretation and De Witt (1970) with the many-worlds interpretation. Van Fraassen's proposal was, however, different from these other approaches. It relied, in particular, on a distinction between what he called the “dynamical state” and the “value state” of a system at any instant:

  • The dynamical state determines what may be the case: which physical properties the system may possess, and which properties the system may have at later times.
  • The value state represents what actually is the case, that is, all the system's physical properties that are sharply defined at the instant in question.

The dynamical state is just the quantum state of the ordinary textbook approach (a vector or density matrix in Hilbert space). For an isolated system, it always evolves according to the Schrödinger equation (in non-relativistic quantum mechanics): so the dynamical state never collapses during its evolution.

The value state is (typically) different from the dynamical state. The general idea of this original proposal, and of modal interpretations in general, is that physical systems at all times possess a number of well-defined physical properties, i.e., definite values of physical quantities; these properties can be represented by the system's value state. Which physical quantities are sharply defined, and which values they take, may change in time. Empirical adequacy of course requires that the dynamical state generate the correct Born frequencies of observable quantities.

An essential feature of this approach is that a system may have a sharp value of an observable even if the dynamical state is not an eigenstate of that same observable. The proposal thus violates the so-called “eigenstate-eigenvalue link”, which says that a system can only have a sharp value of an observable (namely, one of its eigenvalues) if its quantum state is the corresponding eigenstate. In the value state terminology, the eigenstate-eigenvalue link would say that a system has the value state corresponding to a given eigenvalue of a given observable if and only if its dynamical state is an eigenstate of the observable corresponding to that eigenvalue. This original modal approach accepts the “if” part, but denies the “only if” part.

What are the possible “value states” for a given system at a given time? Van Fraassen stipulates the following restriction: propositions about a physical system cannot be jointly true, unless they are represented by commuting observables. In other words, the non-commutativity of observables imposes limits not on our knowledge about the properties of a system, but rather on the possibility of joint existence of properties, independently of our knowledge. Non-commuting quantities, like position and momentum, cannot jointly be well-defined quantities of a physical system.

Empirical adequacy requires that, in cases of measurement, the actual value state of the apparatus be one describing a definite measurement result. Therefore, in these cases the dynamical state must generate a probability measure over exactly the set of possible measurement results. However, this original modal approach is more liberal in its assignment of possible value states, and according to many this does not yield a satisfactory account of measurements (see Ruetsche 1996).

Van Fraassen's proposal is “modal” because it leads to a modal logic of quantum propositions. Indeed, the dynamical state in general only tells us what is possible. An important point is that one should not consider this modality as arising from an incompleteness of the description, which it is the aim of science to remove. The dynamical state provides us with possible physical properties of the system, and this is all the theory has to do.

It is easy to see how, along the same lines as van Fraassen's ideas, a program could come into being for providing a more elaborate “realist” interpretation of quantum theory, a program to which we now turn.

2. General features of modal interpretations

In the 1980s several authors presented realist interpretations which, in retrospect, can be regarded as elaborations or variations on the just-mentioned modal themes (for an overview and references, see Dieks and Vermaas 1998). In spite of the differences among them, all the modal interpretations agree on the following points:

  • The interpretation is based on the standard formalism of quantum mechanics, with one exception: the projection postulate is left out.
  • The interpretation is realist, in the sense that it assumes that quantum systems possess definite properties at all instants of time.
  • Quantum mechanics is taken to be fundamental: it applies both to microscopic and macroscopic systems.
  • The dynamical state of the system (pure or mixed) tells us what the possible properties of the system and their corresponding probabilities are. This is achieved by a precise mathematical rule that specifies a probabilistic relationship between the dynamical state and possible value states.
  • A quantum measurement is an ordinary physical interaction. There is no collapse of the dynamical state: the dynamical state always evolves unitarily according to the Schrödinger equation.

The Kochen-Specker theorem (1967) is a barrier to any realist classical-like interpretation of quantum mechanics, since it proves the impossibility of ascribing precise values to all physical quantities (observables) of a quantum system simultaneously, while preserving the functional relations between commuting observables. Therefore, realist non-collapse interpretations are committed to selecting a privileged set of definite-valued observables out of all observables. Each modal interpretation thus supplies a “rule of definite-value ascription” or “actualization rule”, which picks out, from the set of all observables of a quantum system, the subset of definite-valued properties.

The question is: what should this actualization rule look like? Since the mid-1990's a series of approaches faced this question (Clifton 1995a,b; Dickson 1995a,b; Dieks 1995). Each one of them proposed a group of conditions that the set of definite-valued properties should obey, and characterized this set in terms of the dynamical state |φ⟩ of the system. The common result was that the possible value states of the components of a two-part composite system are given by the states occurring in the Schmidt (bi-orthogonal) decomposition of the dynamical state, or, equivalently, by the projectors occurring in the spectral decomposition of the density matrices representing partial systems (obtained by partial tracing)---see Section 4 for more details.

The definite-valued properties have also been characterized somewhat differently (Bub and Clifton 1996; for an improved version, see Bub, Clifton and Goldstein 2000), that is, in terms of the quantum state |φ⟩ plus a “privileged observable” R, which is privileged in the sense that it represents a property that is always definite-valued (see also Dieks 2005, 2007). On this basis, Bub (1992, 1994, 1997) suggests that with hindsight a number of traditional interpretations of quantum theory can be characterized as modal interpretations. Notable among them are the Dirac-von Neumann interpretation, (what Bub takes to be) Bohr's interpretation, and Bohm's theory. Bohm's theory is a modal interpretation in which the privileged observable R is the position observable.

3. Atomic modal interpretation

The Hilbert space of the universe Huniv, like any Hilbert space, can be factorized in countless ways. If one supposes that each factorization defines a legitimate set of subsystems of the universe, the multiple factorizability implies that there exists a multiplicity of ways of defining the building blocks of nature. If the properties (value states) of all these quantum systems are defined by means of the partial trace with respect to the rest of the universe (see later for more details), it turns out that a contradiction of the Kochen-Specker type arises (Bacciagaluppi 1995).

The Atomic Modal Interpretation (AMI, Bacciagaluppi and Dickson 1999) tries to overcome this obstacle by assuming that there is in nature a fixed set of mutually disjoint atomic quantum systems Sj that constitute the building blocks of all the other quantum systems. From the mathematical point of view, this means that the Hilbert space Huniv of the entire universe can only be meaningfully factorized in a single way, which defines a preferred factorization. If each atomic quantum system Sj is represented by its corresponding Hilbert space Hj, then the Hilbert space Huniv of the universe must be written as

Huniv = H1H2 ⊗ ... ⊗ Hj ⊗ ...

The main appeal of this idea is that it is in consonance with the standard model of particle physics, where the fundamental blocks of nature are the elemental particles, e.g., quarks, electrons, photons, etc., and their interactions. The property ascription to the atomic quantum systems in the AMI further follows the general idea of modal interpretations, that is, the ascription depends via a fixed rule on the dynamical state of the system.

The main challenge for the AMI is to justify the assumption that there is a preferred partition of the universe and to provide some idea about what this factorization should look like. AMI also faces a conceptual problem. In this interpretation, a non-atomic quantum system Sσ, defined as composite of atomic quantum systems, does not necessarily have properties that correspond to the outcomes of measurements. The reason is that the system Sσ might be in the quantum state ρσ with an eigenprojector ∏σ such that Trσσσ) = 1. This implies that if one measured the property represented by ∏σ, one would obtain a positive outcome with probability 1. But it may be the case that the projector ∏σ is not a composite of atomic properties and, therefore, according to the AMI, it is not a property possessed by the composite quantum system Sσ.

Two answers to this conceptual difficulty have been proposed. The first allows the existence of dispositional properties in addition to ordinary properties (Clifton 1996). According to the second answer, the projector ∏σ of the composite system Sσ shows that Sσ has a collective dynamical effect onto the measurement device, that is, an effect that cannot be explained by the action of the atomic components (Dieks 1998). In other words, the composite quantum system, when interacting with its environment, can behave as a collective entity, screening off the contribution of the atomic quantum systems. This means that sometimes a non-atomic quantum system Sσ may be taken as if it were an atomic quantum system within the framework of a coarse-grained description.

4. Biorthogonal-decomposition and spectral-decomposition modal interpretations

In the biorthogonal-decomposition interpretation (BDMI, sometimes known as “Kochen-Dieks modal interpretation”, Kochen 1985; Dieks 1988, 1989a,b, 1994a,b), the definite-valued observables are picked out by the biorthogonal (Schmidt) decomposition of the pure quantum state of the system:

  • Biorthogonal Decomposition Theorem: Given a vector |ψ⟩ in a tensor-product Hilbert space H1H2, there exist bases {|ai⟩} and {|pi⟩} for H1 and H2 respectively, such that |ψ⟩ can be written as a linear combination of terms of the form |ai⟩ ⊗ |pi⟩. If the absolute values (modulus) of the coefficients in this linear combination are all unequal, then the bases are unique (see, for example, Schrödinger 1935 for a proof).

In quantum mechanics the theorem means that, given a composite system consisting of two subsystems, its state picks out (in many cases, uniquely) a basis for each of the subsystems. According to the BDMI, those bases generate the definite-valued properties (the value states) of the corresponding subsystems.

The BDMI is particularly appropriate to account for quantum measurement. Let us consider an ideal measurement under the standard von Neumann model, according to which a quantum measurement is an interaction between a system S and a measuring apparatus M. Before the interaction, M is prepared in a ready-to-measure state |p0⟩, eigenvector of the pointer observable P of M, and the state of S is a superposition of the eigenstates |ai⟩ of an observable A of S. The interaction introduces a correlation between the eigenstates |ai⟩ of A and the eigenstates |pi⟩ of P:

0⟩ = ∑i ci |ai⟩ ⊗ |p0⟩ → |ψ⟩ = ∑i ci |ai⟩ ⊗ |pi

In this case, according to the BDMI prescription, the preferred context of the measured system S is defined by the set {|ai⟩} and the preferred context of the measuring apparatus M is defined by the set {|pi⟩}. Therefore, the pointer position is a definite-valued property of the apparatus: it acquires one of its possible values (eigenvalues) pi. And analogously in the measured system: the measured observable is a definite-valued property of the measured system, and it acquires one of its possible values (eigenvalues) ai.

In spite of the fact that this modal interpretation is characterized by the central role played by biorthogonal decomposition, two different versions can be distinguished. One of them adopts a metaphysics in which all properties are relational and, as a consequence, the fact that the application of the interpretation is restricted to subsystems of a two-component compound system is not a problem (Kochen 1985). This relation has been called “witnessing”: properties are not possessed by the system absolutely, but only when it is “witnessed” by another system. Consider the measurement described above: the pointer “witnesses” the value acquired by the measured observable of the measured system.

By contrast, according to the other version (Dieks 1988, 1989a,b) the properties ascribed to the system do not have a relational character. This proposal therefore faces consistency questions about the assignments of definite values to observables according to different ways of splitting up the total system into components. Consider, for example, the three-component composite system αβχ. We could apply the biorthogonal decomposition theorem to the two-component system (i) α(βχ), or (ii) β(χα) or (iii) χ(αβ). Suppose that, as a result of this, in case (i) the system α has the definite-valued property P, in case (ii) the system β has the definite-valued property Q, and in case (iii) the system αβ has the definite-valued property R. How do the definite-valued properties of α and β relate to those of αβ? Are the definite-values properties of system αβ P&Q, or R, or both?

This problem has been addressed by different authors during the 1990's (see Vermaas 1999; Bacciagaluppi 1996). This work led to the spectral-decomposition modal interpretation (SDMI, sometimes known as “Vermaas-Dieks modal interpretation”, Vermaas and Dieks 1995) a generalization of the BDMI interpretation to mixed states. The SDMI is based on the spectral decomposition of the reduced density operator: the definite-valued properties ∏i of a system and their corresponding probabilities Pri are given by the non-zero diagonal elements of the spectral decomposition of the system's state,

ρ = ∑i αii     Pri = Tr(ρ∏i)

This new proposal matches the old one in cases where the old one applies, and generalizes it by fixing the definite-valued properties in terms of multi-dimensional projectors when the biorthogonal decomposition is degenerate: definite-valued properties need not always be represented by one-dimensional vectors—higher-dimensional subspaces of the Hilbert space can also occur.

The SDMI also has a direct application to the measurement situation. Consider quantum measurement as described above, where the reduced states of the measured system S and the measuring apparatus M are

ρrS  = Tr(M)|ψ⟩⟨ψ| = ∑i |ci|2 |ai⟩⟨ai| = ∑i |ci|2ia

ρrM  = Tr(S)|ψ⟩⟨ψ| = ∑i |ci|2 |pi⟩⟨pi| = ∑i |ci|2ip

According to the SDMI, the preferred context of S is defined by the projectors ∏ia  and the preferred context of M is defined by projectors ∏ip . Therefore, also in the SDMI, the observables A of S and P of M acquire actual definite values, whose probabilities are given by the diagonal elements of the diagonalized reduced states.

The SDMI faces the same difficulty as the non-relational version of the BDMI: the fact that a system can be decomposed in a variety of different ways. In particular, the factorization of a given Hilbert space H into two factors, H = H1H2, can be “rotated” to produce different factorizations H′ = H1′ ⊗ H2′. Are we to apply the SDMI to each such factorization? How are the results related, if at all? A theorem due to Bacciagaluppi (1995, see also Vermaas 1997) shows, in essence, that if one applies the SDMI to the “subsystems” obtained in every factorization and insists that the definite-valued properties so-obtained are not relational, then one will be led to a mathematical contradiction of the Kochen-Specker variety. In response, one could adopt the view that subsystems have their definite-valued properties “relative to a factorization”; we will come back to this issue below.

Healey (1989) was also among the first to make use of the biorthogonal decomposition theorem, developing these ideas in a somewhat different direction. His main concern was the apparent non-locality of quantum mechanics. Healey's intuition about the way a modal interpretation based on the biorthogonal decomposition theorem would be applied to, say, an EPR experiment is to implement the idea that an EPR pair possesses a “holistic” property; this can then explain why the apparatus on one side of the experiment acquires a property that is correlated to the result on the other side.

In Healey's proposal, the biorthogonal decomposition theorem is used, but the set of possible properties is subsequently modified in order to fulfill a variety of desiderata. The first is consistency: the aim is to avoid Kochen-Specker-type results. A second is to maintain a plausible theory of the relationship between composite systems and their subsystems. A third is to maintain a plausible account of the relations among definite-valued properties at a given time. A fourth is to maintain a plausible account of the relations among definite-valued properties at different times. The structure of definite-valued properties that emerges from these conditions is extremely complicated. Some progress has been made since Healey's book was published (see for example Reeder and Clifton 1995) but, in general, it remains difficult to see what the set of definite-valued properties is according to his approach.

5. Non-ideal measurements

Above we suggested that the BDMI and the SDMI solve the measurement problem in a particularly direct way. This is right in the case of the ideal von Neumann measurement, as explained in the previous section, where the eigenstates |ai⟩ of an observable A of the measured system S are perfectly correlated with the eigenstates |pi⟩ of the pointer P of the measuring apparatus M. However, ideal measurement is a situation that can never be achieved in practice: the interaction between S and M never introduces a completely perfect correlation. Two kinds of non-ideal measurements are usually distinguished in the literature:

  • Imperfect measurement (first kind)
    i ci |ai⟩ ⊗ |p0⟩ → ∑ij dij |ai⟩ ⊗ |pj⟩ (in general, dij ≠ 0 with ij)
  • Disturbing measurement (second kind)
    i ci |ai⟩ ⊗ |p0⟩ → ∑i ci |aid  ⟩ ⊗ |pi⟩ (in general, ⟨aid  | ajd  ⟩ ≠ δij)

Note, however, that disturbing measurement can be rewritten as imperfect measurements (and vice versa).

Imperfect measurements pose a challenge to the BDMI and the SDMI, since their rules for selecting the definite-valued properties do not pick out the right properties for the apparatus in the imperfect case (see Albert and Loewer 1990, 1991, 1993; also Ruetsche 1995). An example that clearly brings out the difficulties introduced by non-ideal measurements was formulated in the context of Stern-Gerlach experiments (Elby 1993). This argument uses the fact that the wavefunctions in the z-variable typically have infinite “tails” that introduce non-zero cross-terms; therefore, the “tail” of the wavefunction of the “down” beam may produce detection in the upper detector, and vice versa (see Dickson 1994 for a detailed discussion).

In fact, if the biorthogonal decomposition is applied to the non-perfectly correlated state ∑ij dij |ai⟩ ⊗ |pj⟩ = ∑i ci′ |ai′⟩ ⊗ |pi′⟩, according to the BDMI the result does not select the pointer P as a definite-valued property, but a different observable P′ with eigenstates |pi′⟩. In this case, in which the definite-valued properties selected by a modal interpretation are different from those expected, the question arises how different they are. In the case of an imperfect measurement, it may be assumed that the dij ≠ 0, with ij, be small; then, the difference might be also small. But in the case of a disturbing measurement, the dij ≠ 0, with ij, need not be small and, as a consequence, the disagreement between the modal interpretation assignment and the experimental result might be unacceptable (see a full discussion in Bacciagaluppi and Hemmo 1996). This fact has been considered as a “silver bullet” for killing the modal interpretations (Harvey Brown, cited in Bacciagaluppi and Hemmo 1996).

There is another important problem related to non-ideal measurements. When the final state of the composite system (measured system plus measuring device) is very nearly degenerate when written in the basis given by the measured observable and the apparatus's pointer (that is, when the probabilities for the various results are nearly equal), the spectral decomposition does not, in general, select as definite-valued properties close to those ideally expected. In fact, the observables so selected may be incompatible (non-commuting) with the observables that we expect on the basis of observation (Bacciagaluppi and Hemmo 1994, 1996).

In order to face the problems that non-ideal measurements pose to the BDMI and the SDMI, several authors have appealed to the phenomenon of decoherence; this will be discussed below.

6. Properties of composite systems

Let us take a composite system αβ, whose component subsystems α and β are represented by the Hilbert spaces Hα and Hβ, respectively, and consider a property represented by the projector ∏α defined on Hα. It is usual to assume that ∏α represents the same property as that represented by ∏αIβ defined on HαHβ, where Iβ is the identity operator on Hβ. This assumption is based on the observational indistinguishability of the magnitudes represented by ∏α and ∏αIβ: if the ∏α-measurement has a certain outcome, then the ∏αIβ-measurement has exactly the same outcome.

The question is then: If the rules of the BDMI and the SDMI applied to α assign a value to ∏α, do those rules applied to the composite system αβ assign the same value to ∏αIβ (condition known as Property Composition), and vice versa (Property Decomposition)? The answer to this question is negative: the BDMI and the SDMI violate Property Composition and Property Decomposition (for a proof, see Vermaas 1998).

Of course, if one maintains that the projectors ∏α and ∏αIβ represent the same property, the violation of Property Composition and Property Decomposition is a serious problem for any interpretation. This is the position adopted by Arntzenius (1990), who judges this violation to be bizarre, since it assigns different truth values to propositions like ‘the left-hand side of a table is green’ and ‘the table has a green left-hand side’, which are normally not distinguished; a similar argument is put forward by Clifton (1996, see also Clifton 1995c).

However, Vermaas (1998) argues that the observational indistinguishability of the magnitudes represented by ∏α and ∏αIβ does not force one to consider these two projectors as representing the same property: in fact, they are distinguishable from a theoretical viewpoint, since they are defined on different Hilbert spaces. Moreover, he argues that the examples developed by Arntzenius and Clifton sound bizarre precisely in the light of Property Composition and Property Decomposition. But in the quantum realm we must accept that the questions of which properties are possessed by a system and which by its subsystems are different questions: the properties of a composite system αβ don't reveal information about the properties of subsystem α, and vice versa. Vermaas concludes that the tenet that ∏α and ∏αIβ do represent the same property can be viewed as an addition to quantum mechanics, which can be denied as, for instance, van Fraassen (1991) did.

7. Dynamics of properties

As we have seen, modal interpretations intend to provide, for every instant, a set of definite-valued properties and their probabilities. Some advocates of modal interpretations may be willing to leave the matter, more or less, at that. Others take it to be crucial for any modal interpretation that it also answers questions of the form: Given that the property P of a system has the actual value α at time t0, what is the probability that its property P′ has the actual value β at time t1 > t0? In other words, they want a dynamics of actual properties.

There are arguments on both sides. Those who argue for the necessity of such a dynamics maintain that we have to assure that the trajectories of actual properties really are, at least for macroscopic objects, like we see them to be, i.e., like the records contained in memories. For example, we should require not only that the book at rest on the desk possess a definite location, but also that, if undisturbed, its location relative to the desk does not change in time. Accordingly, one cannot get away with simply specifying the definite properties at each instant of time. We need also to show that this specification is at least compatible with a reasonable dynamics; better still, specify this dynamics explicitly.

Those who consider a dynamics of actual properties to be superfluous reply that such a dynamics is more than what an interpretation of quantum mechanics needs to provide. Memory contents for each instant are enough to make empirical adequacy possible.

As pointed out by Ruetsche (2003), in this debate about the need for a dynamics of actual properties it is important whether the modal interpretation is viewed as leading to a hidden-variables theory, in which value states are added as hidden variables to the original formalism in order to obtain a full description of the physical situation, or rather as only equipping the original formalism with a new semantics. In the first approach one would expect a full dynamics of actual properties, in the second this is not so clear.

Of course, modal interpretations do admit a trivial dynamics, namely, one in which there is no correlation from one time to the next. In this case, the probability of a transition from the property P having the actual value α at t0, to the property P′ having the actual value β at t1 > t0 is just the single-time probability for P′ having β at t1. However, this dynamics is unlikely to interest those who feel the need for a dynamics at all. Several researchers have contributed to the project of constructing a more interesting form of dynamics for modal interpretations (see Vermaas 1996, 1998). An important account is due to Bacciagaluppi and Dickson (1999, see also Bacciagaluppi 1998). That work shows the most significant challenges that the construction of a dynamics of actual properties must face.

The first challenge is posed by the fact that the set of definite-valued properties—let us call it ‘S’—may change over time. One therefore has to define a family of maps, each one being a 1–1 map from S0 at time t0 to a different St at time t, for any time. With such a family of maps, one can effectively define conditional probabilities within a single state space, and then translate them into “transition” probabilities. For this technique to work, St must have the same cardinality at any time. However, in general this is not the case: for instance, in the SDMI, the number of different projectors appearing in the spectral decomposition of the density matrix may vary with time.

A way out of this is to augment S at each time so that its cardinality matches the highest cardinality that S ever achieves. Of course, one hopes to do so in a way that is not completely ad hoc. For example, in the context of the SDMI, Bacciagaluppi, Donald and Vermaas (1995) show that the “trajectory” through Hilbert space of the spectral components of the reduced state of a physical system will, under reasonable conditions, be continuous, or have only isolated discontinuities, so that the trajectory can be naturally extended to a continuous trajectory (see also Donald 1998). This result suggests a natural family of maps as discussed above: map each spectral component at one time to its unique continuous evolved component at later times.

The second challenge to the construction of a dynamics arises from the fact that one wants to define transition probabilities over infinitesimal units of time, and then derive the finite-time transition probabilities from them. Bacciagaluppi and Dickson (1999) argue that, adapting results from the theory of stochastic processes, one can show that the procedure may, more or less, be carried out for modal interpretations of at least some varieties.

Finally, one must actually define infinitesimal transition probabilities that will give rise to the proper quantum-mechanical probabilities at each time. Following earlier papers by Bell (1984), Vink (1993) and others, Bacciagaluppi and Dickson (1999) define an infinite class of such infinitesimal transition probabilities, such that all of them generate the correct single-time probabilities, which arguably are all we can really test. However, Sudbery (2002) has contended that the form of the transition probabilities would be relevant to the precise form of spontaneous decay or the “Dehmelt quantum jumps”; he independently developed the dynamics of Bacciagaluppi and Dickson and applied it in such a way that it leads to the correct predictions for these experiments. Gambetta and Wiseman (2003, 2004) developed a dynamical modal account in the form of a non-Markovian process with noise, also extending their approach to positive operator-valued measures (POVMs).

8. Perspectival modal interpretation

As we have seen, both the SDMI and the non-relational version of the BDMI have to face the problem of the multiple factorizability of a given Hilbert space: if the definite-valued properties are monadic (i.e., non-relational), both interpretations led to a Kochen-Specker-type contradiction (Bacciagaluppi 1995). This points to the direction of an interpretation that makes properties relational, in this case relative to a factorization.

Extending this idea, a perspectival modal interpretation (PMI, Bene and Dieks 2002) was developed, in which the properties of a physical system have a relational character and are defined with respect to another physical system that serves as a “reference system” (see Bene 1997). This interpretation is similar in spirit to the idea that systems have properties as “witnessed” by the rest of the universe (Kochen 1985). However, the PMI goes further by defining states of a system not only with respect to the universe, but also with respect to arbitrary larger systems. The PMI is closely related to the SDMI since similar rules are used to assign properties to quantum systems.

In the PMI, the state of any system S needs the specification of a “reference system” R with respect to which the state is defined: this state of S with respect to R is denoted by ρRS  . In the special case in which R coincides with S, the state ρSS   is called “the state of S with respect to itself”. If the system S is contained in a system A, the state ρAS   is defined as the density operator that can be derived from ρAA   by taking the partial trace over the degrees of freedom in A that do not pertain to S:

ρAS   = Tr(A\S)ρAA

With these definitions, the point of departure of the PMI is the quantum state of the whole universe with respect to itself, which it is assumed to be a pure state ρUU   = |ψ⟩⟨ψ| which evolves unitarily according to the Schrödinger equation. For any system S contained in the universe, its state with respect to itself ρSS   is postulated to be one of the projectors of the spectral resolution of

ρUS   = Tr(U\S) ρUU   = Tr(U\S) |ψ⟩⟨ψ|

In particular, if there is no degeneracy among the eigenvalues of ρUS  , these projectors are one-dimensional and ρSS   is the one-dimensional projector |ψS⟩⟨ψS|.

Within this PMI conceptual framework it can be shown that a system may be localized from the perspective of one observer and, nevertheless, may be delocalized from a different perspective. But it also follows that observers who look at the same macroscopic object, at the same time and under identical circumstances, will see it (practically) at the same spot.

The core idea of this interpretation is that all different relational descriptions, given from different perspectives, are equally objective and all correspond to physical reality (which has a relational character itself). We cannot explain the relational states by appealing to a definition in terms of more basic non-relational states. Further analysis shows that in this interpretation EPR-type situations can be understood in a basically local manner. Indeed, the change in the relational state of particle 2 with respect to the 2-particle system can be understood as a consequence of the change in the reference system brought about by the local measurement interaction between particle 1 and the measuring device. This local measurement is responsible for the creation of a new perspective, and from this new perspective there is a new relational state of particle 2 (see also Dieks 2009).

The PMI agrees with Bohr's qualitative argument that any reasonable definition of physical reality in the quantum realm should include the experimental setup. However, the PMI is more general in the sense that the state of a system is defined with respect to any larger physical system, not necessarily an instrument. This removes the threat of subjectivism, since the relational states follow unambiguously from the quantum formalism and the physics of the situation.

It is interesting to consider the connections between the PMI and other relational proposals. For instance, Berkovitz and Hemmo (2006) propose the prospects of a relational modal interpretation in the relativistic case (we will come back to this point below). In turn, Rovelli and coworkers propose an explicit ‘relational quantum mechanics’ that emphasizes the possibility of different descriptions of a physical system depending on the perspective (Rovelli 1996; Rovelli and Smerlak 2007; Laudisa and Rovelli 2008; see also van Fraassen 2010). In spite of the points of contact between the PMI and Rovelli's relational interpretation, there are significant differences. In Rovelli's proposal, the concepts of measurement interaction and of definite outcomes of measurements are primary; moreover, the state has to be updated every time that a measurement event occurs and, as a consequence, it changes discontinuously with every new event. On the contrary, the PMI is a realist interpretation where a measurement is nothing else than a quantum interaction, and where unitary evolution is the main dynamical principle, also when systems interact (see Dieks 2009).

9. Modal-Hamiltonian interpretation

As Bub (1997) points out, in most modal interpretations the preferred context of definite-valued observables depends on the state of the system. An exception is Bohmian mechanics, in which the preferred context is a priori defined by the position observable; in this case, property composition and property decomposition hold. But this is not the only reasonable possibility for a modal interpretation with a fixed preferred observable. In fact, the modal-Hamiltonian interpretation (MHI, Lombardi and Castagnino 2008; Ardenghi, Castagnino, and Lombardi 2009; Lombardi, Castagnino, and Ardenghi 2010; Ardenghi and Lombardi 2011) endows the Hamiltonian of a system with a determining role, both in the definition of systems and subsystems and in the selection of the preferred context.

The MHI is based on the following postulates:

  • Systems postulate (SP): A quantum system S is represented by a pair (O, H) such that (i) O is a space of self-adjoint operators on a Hilbert space, representing the observables of the system, (ii) HO is the time-independent Hamiltonian of the system S, and (iii) if ρ0O′ (where O′ is the dual space of O) is the initial state of S, it evolves according to the Schrödinger equation.

Although any quantum system can be decomposed in parts in many ways, according to the MHI a decomposition leads to parts which are also quantum systems only when the components' behaviors are dynamically independent of each other, that is, when there is no interaction among the subsystems:

  • Composite systems postulate (CSP): A quantum system represented by S: (O, H), with initial state ρ0O′, is composite when it can be partitioned into two quantum systems S1: (O1, H1) and S2: (O2, H2) such that (i) O = O1O2, and (ii) H = H1I2 + I1H2 (where I1 and I2 are the identity operators in the corresponding tensor product spaces). In this case, we say that S1 and S2 are subsystems of the composite system S = S1S2. If the system is not composite, it is elemental.

With respect to the preferred context, the basic idea of the MHI is that the Hamiltonian of the system defines actualization. Any observable that does not have the symmetries of the Hamiltonian cannot acquire a definite actual value, since this actualization would break the symmetry of the system in an arbitrary way.

  • Actualization rule (AR): Given an elemental quantum system represented by S: (O, H), the actual-valued observables of S are H and all the observables commuting with H and having, at least, the same symmetries as H.

The selection of the preferred context exclusively on the basis of a preferred observable has been criticized by arguing that in the Hilbert space formalism all observables are on an equal footing. However, quantum mechanics is not just Hilbert space mathematics: it is a physical theory that includes a dynamical law in which the Hamiltonian is singled out to play a central role.

The justification for selecting the Hamiltonian as the preferred observable ultimately lies in the success of the MHI and its ability to solve interpretive difficulties. With respect to the first point: the scheme has been applied to several well-known physical situations (free particle with spin, harmonic oscillator, free hydrogen atom, Zeeman effect, fine structure, the Born-Oppenheimer approximation), leading to results consistent with empirical evidence (Lombardi and Castagnino 2008, Section 5). With respect to interpretation, the MHI confronts quantum contextuality by selecting a preferred context, and has proved to be able to supply an account of the measurement problem, both in its ideal and its non-ideal versions; moreover, in the non-ideal case it gives a criterion to distinguish between reliable and non-reliable measurements (Lombardi and Castagnino 2008, Section 6).

In the MHI property composition and property decomposition hold because the actualization rule only applies to elemental systems: the definite-valued properties of composite systems are selected on the basis of those of the elemental components, and following the usual quantum assumption according to which the observable A1 of a subsystem S1 and the observable A = A1I2 of the composite system S = S1S2 represent the same property (Ardenghi and Lombardi 2011).

The preferred context of the MHI does not change with time: the definite-valued observables always commute with the Hamiltonian and, therefore, they are constants of motion of the system. This means that they are the same during the whole “life” of the quantum system as a closed system, since its initial “birth”, when it arises as a result of an interaction, up to its final “death”, when it disappears by interacting with another system. As a consequence, there is no need of accounting for the dynamics of the actual properties as in the BDMI and the SDMI.

10. The interpretation of probability

One of the leading ideas of the modal interpretations is probabilism: quantum mechanics does not correspond in a one-to-one way to actual reality, but rather provides us with a list of possibilities and their probabilities. Therefore, the notions of possibility and probability are central in this interpretive framework. This raises two issues: the formal treatment of probabilities, and the interpretation of probability.

Since the set of events corresponding to all projector operators on a given Hilbert space does not have a Boolean structure, the Born probability (which is defined over these projectors) does not satisfy the definition of probability of Kolmogorov (which applies to a Boolean algebra of events). For this reason, some authors define a generalized non-Kolmogorovian probability function over the ortho-algebra of quantum events (Hughes 1989; Cohen 1989). Modal interpretations do not follow this path: they conceive probabilities as represented by a Kolmogorovian measure on the Boolean algebra representing the definite-valued quantities, generated by mutually commuting projectors. The various modal interpretations differ from each other in their definitions of the preferred context on which the Kolmogorovian probability is defined.

As we have seen, the definite-valued properties of a system are usually characterized in terms of the quantum state |φ⟩ and a privileged observable R (Bub and Clifton 1996; Bub, Clifton, and Goldstein 2000; Dieks 2005). Dieks (2007) derives a uniqueness result, namely that given the splitting of a total Hilbert space into two factors spaces, representing the system and its environment, respectively, the Boolean lattice of definite-valued observables is fixed by the state of the system alone. Furthermore, it follows that the Born measure is the only one that is definable from just the product structure of Hilbert space, the state in the Hilbert space, and the definite-valued observables selected by the state.

The MHI defines a context as a complete set of orthogonal projectors {∏α}, such that ∑ii = I and ∏ij = δiji, where I is the identity operator in HH. Since each context generates a Boolean structure, the state of the system defines a Kolmogorovian probability function on each individual context (Lombardi and Castagnino 2008). However, only the probabilities defined on the context determined by the eigenprojectors of the Hamiltonian of an elemental closed system correspond to the possible values one of which becomes actual.

In modal interpretations the event space on which the (preferred) probability measure is defined is a space of possible events, among which only one becomes actual. The fact that the actual event is not singled out by these interpretations is what makes them fundamentally probabilistic. This aspect distinguishes modal interpretations from many-worlds interpretations, where the probability measure is defined on a space of events that are all actual. Nevertheless, this does not mean that all modal interpretations agree about the interpretation of probability.

In the context of the BDMI, the SDMI and the PMI, it is usually claimed that, given the space of possible events, the state generates an ignorance-interpretable probability measure over this set: quantum probabilities quantify the ignorance of the observer about the actual values acquired by the system's observables (see, e.g., Dieks 1988; Clifton 1995a; Vermaas 1999; Bene and Dieks 2002).

By contrast to actualism—the conception that reduces possibility to actuality (see Dieks 2010)—some modal interpretations, in particular the MHI, adopt a possibilist conception, according to which possible events—possibilia—constitute a basic ontological category (see Menzel 2007). The probability measure is in this case seen as a representation of an ontological propensity of a possible quantum event to become actual (Lombardi and Castagnino 2008; see also Suárez 2004).

These views do not all exclude each other. If probabilities quantify ignorance about the actual values of the observables, this need not mean that this ignorance can be removed by the addition of further information. If quantum probabilities are ontological propensities, our ignorance about the possible event that becomes actual is a necessary consequence of the indeterministic nature of the system because there simply is no additional information about a more accurate state of the system.

11. The role of decoherence

According to the environment-induced approach to decoherence (Zurek 1981, 2003; see also Schlosshauer 2007), the measuring apparatus is an open system in continuous interaction with its environment; as a consequence of this interaction, the reduced state of the apparatus and the measured system becomes, almost instantaneously, indistinguishable from a state that would represent an ignorance mixture (“proper mixture”) over unknown values of the apparatus' pointer. The idea that decoherence might play a role in modal interpretations was proposed by several authors early on (Dieks 1989b; Healey 1995). But the phenomenon has acquired a central relevance in the modal context in relation to the discussion of non-ideal measurements.

As we have seen, in the BDMI and the SDMI, the biorthogonal or the spectral decomposition does not pick out the right properties for the apparatus in non-ideal measurements. Bacciagaluppi and Hemmo (1996) show that, when the apparatus is a finite-dimensional system in interaction with an environment with a huge number of degrees of freedom, decoherence guarantees that the spectral decomposition of the apparatus' reduced state will be very close to the ideally expected result and, as a consequence, the apparatus' pointer is—approximately—selected as an actual definite-valued observable. Alternatively, Bub (1997) proposes that it is not decoherence—with the “tracing out” of the environment and the diagonalization of the reduced state of the apparatus—that is relevant for the definite value of the pointer, but the triorthogonal or n-orthogonal decomposition theorem, since it singles out a unique pointer basis for the apparatus.

In either case, the interaction of the environment seems to be a great help to the BDMI and the SDMI for handling non-ideal measurements with finite-dimensional apparatuses. However, the case of infinitely many distinct states for the apparatus is perhaps more realistic. Bacciagaluppi (2000) has analyzed this situation, using a continuous model of the apparatus' interaction with the environment. He concludes that in this case the spectral decomposition of the reduced state of the apparatus does not pick out states that are close enough to the ideally expected state. This result applies more generally to other cases where a macroscopic system (not idealized as finite-dimensional) experiences decoherence due to interaction with its environment (see Donald 1998).

As said above, in the case of the MHI decoherence is not explicitly appealed to in order to account for the definite reading of the apparatus' pointer (neither in ideal nor in non-ideal measurements). However, there still is a relation with the decoherence program. In fact, the measuring apparatus is always a macroscopic system with a huge number of degrees of freedom, and the pointer must be a “collective” and empirically accessible observable; as a consequence, the many degrees of freedom corresponding to the degeneracies of the pointer play the role of a decohering “internal environment” (for details, see Lombardi 2010; Lombardi et al. 2011). The compatibility between the MHI and decoherence becomes clearer when the phenomenon of decoherence is understood from a closed-system perspective (Castagnino, Laura, and Lombardi 2007; Castagnino, Fortin, and Lombardi 2010; Lombardi, Fortin, and Castagnino 2012).

12. Open problems and perspectives

There are a number of open problems and perspectives in the modal program. Here we will consider some of them.

Modal interpretations are based on the standard formalism of quantum mechanics (in the Hilbert space version or in the algebraic version). However, Brown, Suárez and Bacciagaluppi (1998) argue that there is more to quantum reality than what is described by operators and quantum states: they claim that gauges and coordinate systems are important to our description of physical reality as well, while modal interpretations (AM, BDMI and SDMI) have standardly not taken such things into consideration. In a similar vein, it has been argued that the Galilean space-time symmetries endow the formal skeleton of quantum mechanics with the physical flesh and blood that identify the fundamental physical magnitudes and that allow the theory to be applied to concrete physical situations (Lombardi and Castagnino 2008). The set of definite-valued observables of a system should be left invariant by the Galilean transformations: it would be unacceptable that this set changed as a mere result of a change in the perspective from which the system is described. On the basis of this idea, the MHI rule of actualization has been reformulated in an explicitly invariant form, in terms of the Casimir operators of the Galilean group (Ardenghi, Castagnino, and Lombardi 2009; Lombardi, Castagnino, and Ardenghi 2010).

Another fundamental question is the relativistic extension of the modal approach. Dickson and Clifton (1998) have shown that a large class of modal interpretations of ordinary quantum mechanics cannot be made Lorentz-invariant in a straightforward way (see also Myrvold 2002). With respect to the extension to algebraic quantum field theory (see Dieks 2002; Kitajima 2004), Clifton (2000) proposed a natural generalization of the non-relativistic modal scheme, but Earman and Ruetsche (2005) showed that it is not yet clear whether it will be able to deal with measurement situations and whether it is empirically adequate. The problems revealed by these investigations are due to the non-relativistic nature of the formalism of quantum mechanics that is employed, in particular to the fact that the concept of a state of an extended system at one instant is central. In a local field-theoretic context this becomes different, and this may avoid conflicts with relativity (Earman and Ruetsche 2005). Berkovitz and Hemmo (2005) and Hemmo and Berkovitz (2005) propose a different way out: they argue that perspectivalism can come to the rescue here (see also Berkovitz and Hemmo 2006). In turn, in the context of the MHI, it has been argued that the actualization rule, expressed in terms of the Casimir operators of the Galilean group in non-relativistic quantum mechanics, can be transferred to the relativistic domain by changing the symmetry group accordingly: the definite-valued observables of a system would be those represented by the Casimir operators of the Poincaré group. Since the mass operator and the squared spin operator are the only Casimir operators of the Poincaré group, they would always be definite-valued observables. This conclusion would be in agreement with a usual assumption in quantum field theory: elemental particles always have definite values of mass and spin, and those values are precisely what define the different kinds of elemental particles of the theory (Ardenghi, Castagnino, and Lombardi 2009; Lombardi, Castagnino, and Ardenghi 2010).

There are also specifically philosophical issues concerning ontological matters: about the nature of the items referred to by quantum mechanics, that is, about the basic categories of the quantum ontology. As we have seen, in general the properties of quantum systems are considered to be monadic, with the exception of the relational version of the BDMI and the PMI where these properties are relational. In any case, it might be asked whether a quantum system has to be conceived as an individual substratum supporting properties or as a mere “bundle” of properties. Lombardi and Castagnino (2008), and da Costa, Lombardi and Lastiri (2013) have suggested that, in the modal context, the bundle view might be appropriate to supply an answer to the problem of indistinguishability (see also French and Krause 2006).

These and similar problems, and their proposed solutions, have arisen in the context of detailed technical investigations. This illustrates one of the advantages of the modal approach: it makes use of a precise set of rules that determine the set of definite-valued observables, and this makes it possible to derive rigorous results. It may well be that several of these results, e.g., no-go theorems, can be applied to other interpretations as well (e.g., to the many-worlds interpretation, see Dieks 2007). Whatever the merit of the modal ideas in the end, one can at least say that they have given rise to a serious and fruitful series of investigations into the nature of quantum theory.


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As of the December 2012 update, the credited authors for this entry are Olympia Lombardi and Dennis Dieks. The original version of this entry (published in 2002, last archived in Fall 2007) was authored solely by Michael Dickson and we acknowledge that some sentences (particularly in Section 7 of the current entry) may remain.

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