First published Thu Aug 30, 2007; substantive revision Thu Aug 2, 2012

The term ‘contractualism’ can be used in a broad sense—to indicate the view that morality is based on contract or agreement—or in a narrow sense—to refer to a particular view developed in recent years by the Harvard philosopher T. M. Scanlon, especially in his book What We Owe to Each Other. This essay takes ‘contractualism’ in the narrower sense. We begin with a brief summary of Scanlon's contractualism, and then situate his view in relation both to other social contract theories and to its main rival among impartial accounts of morality—namely, utilitarianism. Our discussion is then organised around a series of challenges to the contractualist account, including those raised in Derek Parfit's On What Matters.

There is already a huge literature surrounding Scanlon's contractualism. Our aim is not to summarise that literature—still less to contribute anything novel to it. Rather, we seek to explain the distinctive appeal of contractualism, as well as highlighting the challenges it faces from other theories.

1. What is contractualism?

Scanlon introduces contractualism as a distinctive account of moral reasoning. He summarises his account thus:

An act is wrong if its performance under the circumstances would be disallowed by any set of principles for the general regulation of behaviour that no one could reasonably reject as a basis for informed, unforced, general agreement. (Scanlon 1998, p. 153).

But Scanlon's version of contractualism is not just concerned with determining which acts are right and wrong. It is also concerned with what reasons and forms of reasoning are justifiable. Whether or not a principle is one that cannot be reasonably rejected is to be assessed by appeal to the implications of individuals or agents being either licensed or directed to reason in the way required by the principle. Scanlon's version offers an account both of (1) the authority of moral standards and of (2) what constitutes rightness and wrongness. As to the first, the substantive value that is realised by moral behaviour consists in a relation of “mutual recognition”. As to the second, wrongness consists in unjustifiability: wrongness is the property of being unjustifiable. The wrongness of an action is not to be equated with the properties that make it unjustifiable. Rather, it is to be equated with its being unjustifiable; the character of wrongness is captured by the higher order fact that wrong acts are unjustifiable. What wrong acts have in common is that they cannot be justified to others. Thus the various moral considerations that guide our substantive moral reflection are unified by a single normative subject matter. In this way, contractualism guides our substantive reflection about wrongness. Wrong is the primary moral predicate; right is defined as “not wrong”. One reason for focusing on wrong is to draw attention to the domain that contractualism is concerned to map, concerning what it is for one person to have been wronged by another.

Moral requirements determine what it is to respond properly to the value of persons as rational agents. The distinctive value of human life lies in the human capacity to assess reasons and justifications. Therefore, appreciating the value of a person involves recognising her capacity to appreciate and act on reasons. The way to value this capacity is to treat persons in accord with principles they could not reasonably reject. In doing so, the agent is guided by a principle that can rightly be characterised as one that the person herself authorised that agent to be guided by, in thinking about the appropriate way to relate to her. Contractualism illuminates the compelling Kantian insight that we ought to treat persons never as mere means but always as ends in themselves. It interprets this as treating them according to principles they could not reasonably reject.

2. How does contractualism differ from other social contract theories?

Contractualism appeals to the idea of a social contract. It attempts to derive the content of morality (and, in some versions, also the justification for holding that we are obligated to follow morality) from the notion of an agreement between all those in the moral domain. Contemporary moral philosophy offers several other interpretations of the social contract tradition. It is useful to distinguish contractualism from these alternatives.

Contractarianism has its roots in Hobbes, whose account is based on mutual self-interest. Morality consists in those forms of cooperative behaviour that it is mutually advantageous for self-interested agents to engage in. (The most prominent modern exponent is David Gauthier. See Gauthier 1986.)

By contrast, any form of contractualism is grounded on the equal moral status of persons. It interprets this moral status as based on their capacity for rational autonomous agency. According to contractualism, morality consists in what would result if we were to make binding agreements from a point of view that respects our equal moral importance as rational autonomous agents. Contractualism has its roots in Rousseau, rather than Hobbes: the general will is what we would jointly will if we adopted the perspective of free and equal citizens. Contractualism offers an alternative to contractarianism. Under contractarianism, I seek to maximise my own interests in a bargain with others. Under contractualism, I seek to pursue my interests in a way that I can justify to others who have their own interests to pursue.

We next distinguish contractualism from the specific moral theory of Kant. Kantian moral philosophers seek principles to which all rational agents would agree, under certain idealised conditions. In order to reach such an agreement, Kant notoriously needs to abstract away from many (some would say too many) concrete features of our moral lives. (See Onora O'Neill's gloss on the notion of agreement in Kantian ethics; O'Neill 2003.)

Contractualism departs from Kant in various respects. In particular, it offers a substantive account of the normative force of morality, based on the value of a relation of mutual respect. Reasonableness is not taken to be something that can be demonstrated outside the moral point of view. Another difference is that contractualism seeks principles that no one can reasonably reject, rather than principles all would agree to.

However, Scanlon's contractualism has Kantian elements, as it seeks a free agreement that elucidates both freedom and equality. We might say that contractualism gives expression to ideas latent in Kant's discussions of the Categorical Imperative (especially in the Formula of Humanity and the Formula of the Kingdom of Ends, rather than the more familiar Formula of Universal Law). Indeed, as we shall see in section 4, Derek Parfit argues that, despite their differences, contractualism does coincide with the best interpretation of Kant's moral theory.

The most influential recent social contract theorist is John Rawls. Rawls's contract differs from contractualism in two key ways. (1) Rawls's contract is more Kantian, as he seeks principles everyone would agree to, rather than principles no-one could reasonably reject. (This contrast is especially marked if we consider Rawls's Dewey Lectures (Rawls 1980), where his work is at its most Kantian.) (2) Rawls's contract is political—it aims to set the general social framework for a liberal society, rather than determining moral principles. As a result, Rawls places the parties to his agreement behind a veil of ignorance, where they do not know many key facts about their own identity. This is to ensure that the resulting principles of justice embody Rawls's commitment to liberal neutrality. For Rawls, we ought to follow the principles that it would be rational for everyone to choose, if they had to choose those principles without knowing anything about themselves or their circumstances. Because each person knows that they could end up being anyone, each must have concern for all. In essence, Rawls uses self-interest behind a veil of ignorance to represent a commitment to justice, construed as fairness to all.

Contractualism, by contrast, invokes no veil of ignorance. I know my own circumstances. It is not self-interest combined with ignorance of self that makes me take account of everyone's interests, but rather my concern to justify myself to everyone else. This motivation is a key feature of Scanlon's contractualism. All social contract theorists—even contractarians—agree that agents want to justify themselves to others. However, for the contractarian, such a desire is merely strategic—justification is instrumentally useful because it enables me to get others to do what serves my interests. For the contractualist, by contrast, agents are morally motivated by an intrinsic desire to justify themselves to others. Having this desire is part of what it is to be a moral agent.

Despite these differences, contractualism does have several points in common with other social contract theories. In particular, contractualism aspires to provide a non-utilitarian theory that grounds moral status on a universal trait of persons—rational moral agency—and thus provides general principles whose scope is global. It is to this contrast with utilitarianism that we now turn.

3. How does contractualism differ from utilitarianism?

Contractualism is an impartial moral theory. In contemporary moral philosophy, the main impartial moral theory outside the social contract tradition is utilitarianism. Utilitarianism takes persons' moral status to be grounded on their capacity for well-being and suffering, and takes well-being to be the sole moral value. It takes the appropriate response to this value to be to promote it. Utilitarianism is thus a consequentialist moral theory—morality is concerned with bringing about valuable outcomes.

There are three fundamental contrasts between contractualism and utilitarianism. The first difference is one of scope. (1) Utilitarianism applies to every area of morality, while contractualism covers only the realm of what we owe to one another. Scanlon himself acknowledges that this is not the whole of morality. We return to this difference in sections 9 and 10.

The remaining two differences between contractualism and utilitarianism relate to content. (2) Contractualism does not aggregate, but rather focuses on the standpoint of individual persons. (3) Contractualism does not regard well-being as a basic moral concept, but instead allows a variety of personal reasons.

The only reasons for and against a principle that count when we are judging whether or not it can be reasonably rejected are “various individuals' reasons for objecting to that principle and alternatives to it” (Scanlon 1998, p. 229). The acceptability of a principle depends on a one-by-one assessment of the strength of the reasons that individuals would have for rejecting the principle, compared to the alternatives to it. Since individuals must be objecting on their own behalf and not on behalf of a group, this restriction to single individuals' reasons bars the interpersonal aggregation of complaints; it does not allow a number of lesser complaints to outweigh one person's weightier complaint.

Unlike utilitarianism, therefore, contractualism rejects the interpersonal aggregation of burdens. (We discuss some important exceptions below.) This is one of the main respects in which it differs from utilitarianism. Contractualism thus captures a key feature of our moral life that, as Rawls famously argues, utilitarianism ignores: the feature he calls “the separateness of persons” (Rawls 1971). Instead of lumping everyone together and allowing one person's rights to be trampled to provide greater aggregate benefits to others, contractualism recognises that each of us has a unique life to live. The contractualist objection to utilitarianism is that it does not guarantee principles that benefit each individually, and that command each person's free assent.

Aggregation (in some form) is essential to utilitarianism. Situations frequently arise where one person's pleasure is in conflict with another's, or where the only way to secure one person's pleasure is to cause someone else pain, or where we must choose which person suffers which pain. We must find a way to balance the moral reasons generated by different people's pleasures and pains. If we retain a utilitarian perspective, then it is hard to see how we can do this without some kind of aggregation—adding different pleasures and pains together.

By contrast, contractualism seems able to avoid aggregation, because it begins, not with individual pleasure and pain, but with the more flexible concept of reasons. Unlike my pleasures and pains, my reasons can be responsive to the situation of others. To see this, we explore two features of Scanlon's use of reasons: rejection must be reasonable, and reasons are not limited to well-being.

3.1 Reasonable Rejection

In order to reasonably reject a principle, I must have some objection to it. This objection may begin with some direct harm I suffer as a result of the principle. So far, if the harm involved is pain or suffering, contractualism mirrors utilitarianism. However, the fact that a principle impacts negatively on me is not sufficient. To know whether I can reasonably reject the principle, I must also ask how it impacts on others. If a principle imposes a certain burden (b1) on me, but every alternative imposes a greater burden (b2) on someone else, then b1 does not give me a reason to reject the principle. If I am reasonable, then I withdraw my objection when I see that your reason is more pressing. (By contrast, it would make no sense to say that a utilitarian has ‘withdrawn her pain’ because she has noticed that someone else's pain is greater.) So we conclude that the principle imposing b1 on me cannot be reasonably rejected. And we reach this conclusion without having to aggregate anything.

In contractualism, individuals are motivated both by self-regard and by respect for others. Since each person is partly motivated by concern for her own interests, contractualism can ground consequentialist reasons. Part of what we owe others is to promote their interests. Contractualism can therefore accommodate important consequentialist aspects of the structure of moral thought.

Unlike utilitarianism, however, the account of value underlying contractualism does not claim that there is only one rational attitude to have towards value. So contractualism can accommodate consequentialist aspects without being a completely consequentialist theory. (This represents an advantage of contractualism over naïve versions of Kantian ethics, which reject all consequentialist reasons and thus make it very difficult to explain why the consequences of our actions have any moral significance at all.) In contrast to an outcome ethics (such as utilitarianism), what is foundational for contractualism is not minimising what is undesirable, but considering what principles no-one could reasonably reject. Moral principles are grounded in the idea of living with others on terms of mutual respect. This means that as well as accommodating some consequentialist aspects, contractualism can also accommodate certain deontological intuitions: commonsense prohibitions against treating persons in certain ways even in circumstances in which the aggregate value of the consequences of doing so is very great. Which prohibitions are justified? This question “is best answered by considering what principles licensing others to take our lives could be reasonably rejected” (Scanlon 1998, p. 85). Among these principles might be ones that involve “accepting a certain view of the reasons one has: that the positive value of saving others does not justify killing someone” (Scanlon 1998, p. 84).

3.2 Reasons beyond well-being

A further resource available to contractualism that is not available to utilitarianism is that my reasons for rejecting a principle are not limited to my well-being—however broadly that notion is construed. For ease of exposition, let us for the moment follow the utilitarian, and think of ‘burdens’ solely in terms of negative impact on my well-being. My reason for rejecting a principle might be, not so much that it imposes a certain burden on me, but the way in which it imposes that burden—and what the principle thus says about me. For instance, consider a principle that allocates benefits and burdens on the basis of race, and contrast this with a principle that allocates the same benefits and burdens randomly. I cannot reject the racist principle simply because of the burden it imposes on me—after all, the random principle imposes an identical burden on someone else. Rather, I reject the racist principle because, by regarding my race as a relevant ground for the distribution of benefits, it imposes that burden in a way that constitutes a failure to respect my status as a person.

If we abandon the utilitarian link between burdens and well-being, then we might say that the method of distribution of burdens itself imposes an additional burden of a different kind—the burden of not being respected. Similarly, I might reject a principle that arbitrarily exempts some people from a burden borne by everyone else, on the grounds that such a principle treats me unfairly—even if the alternative is a principle that places that burden on everyone. For instance, imagine a situation where, in order to preserve the grass, we need at least 90% of the people to avoid walking on the grass, but it doesn't do any harm if 10% do walk on the grass. I might object to a principle that allows the members of a privileged racial minority to walk on the grass, even if my preferred principle is one where no-one gets to enjoy grass-walking. My rejection is not based on envy, but on the disrespect this principle shows by regarding race as a legitimate ground for distribution.

Contractualist reasons are more flexible than aggregation, as they allow us to respond directly to morally relevant considerations, rather than having to rely upon some complex utilitarian calculation. (Think of the artificial epicycles a utilitarian needs to go through to reject a principle that efficiently maximises happiness, but happens to be racist or arbitrary.) By moving straight to the moral heart of the matter, contractualism also seems to offer a more satisfying explanation of why certain behaviour is wrong.

Contractualism can thus produce principles that balance the interests of different people against one another, without explicit appeal to aggregation. This is a significant development in moral philosophy, as it enables us to separate arguments against utilitarianism into two classes: arguments against impartiality and arguments against aggregation. Objections in the first class also apply to contractualism, while those in the second class do not. We return to aggregation in section 7; and consider one common objection to impartiality in section 8. Once contractualism has entered the field, we cannot treat arguments for impartiality as if they were arguments for utilitarianism itself.

4. The convergence argument

Before turning to problems for contractualism, we first address a challenge to its distinctiveness. In On What Matters, Derek Parfit argues that rule consequentialism, contractualism, and the best interpretation of Kant's moral theory all coincide. The result is a triple theory, according to which “an act is wrong just when such acts are disallowed by some principle that is optimific, uniquely universally willable, and not reasonably rejectable” (Parfit 2011, volume 1, p. 413). As contractualism presents itself as an alternative to both consequentialism and Kant, this would be a very significant result.

The convergence argument explicitly deals, not with Scanlon's own theory, but with “what I believe to be the best version of Scanlonian contractualism” (Parfit 2011, volume 1, p. 412). Parfit defends two key ‘improvements’, by rejecting two restrictions that Scanlon places on the reasons that can be offered for rejecting a moral principle, namely:

  1. “Individualist Restriction: In rejecting some moral principle, we must appeal to this principle's implications only for ourselves and for other single people” (Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 193). Or, in Scanlon's own words: “the justifiability of a moral principle depends only on individuals' reasons for objecting to that principle and alternatives to it” (Scanlon 1999, p. 229).
  2. “Impersonalist Restriction: In rejecting some moral principle, we cannot appeal to claims about the impersonal goodness or badness of outcomes” (Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 214). Or, in Scanlon's own words: “impersonal values are not themselves grounds for reasonable rejection” (Scanlon 1999, p. 222).

In other words, the convergence argument replaces Scanlon's original formulation of contractualism, where all reasons for rejection must be the personal complaints of specific individuals, with a more impersonal version.

We first assess the striking claim that, despite the differences noted in section 2, contractualism coincides with the best interpretation of Kant. In a cumulative argument spread over several chapters, Parfit argues that the best interpretation of Kant's moral ideas yields the following claim:

Kantian rule consequentialism: Everyone ought to follow the optimific principles, because these are the only principles that everyone could rationally will to be universal laws. (Parfit 2011, volume 1, p. 411)

Even if we accept the convergence of Kant and rule consequentialism, it still remains to be shown that these optimific and uniquely universally willable principles are the only set of principles that no-one could reasonably reject. The key step in this second prong of the convergence argument is the claim that “when there is only one relevant principle that everyone could rationally choose, no one's objection to this principle could be as strong as the strongest objection to every alternative” (Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 245).

This key claim seems open to obvious counter-examples—cases where contractualism seems to diverge from rule consequentialism. Most striking are those cases where “we can either save one person from some great burden, or give much smaller benefits to many other people, who are all much better-off” (Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 246).

Proponents of the convergence argument, following Parfit, will divide these cases into two classes. In some cases, the optimific rule consequentialist principles instruct us to favour the individual. Consider Scanlon's own example where we must choose between electrifying an innocent person and disrupting millions of people's enjoyment of a televised sporting event. Here, many rule consequentialists will argue that the optimific rules do instruct us to save the innocent person. If so, the convergence between rule consequentialism and contractualism is straightforward. In its contest with rule consequentialism, contractualism cannot draw its intuitive appeal from such cases.

We must turn, then, to those cases where the optimific rule consequentialist principles do instruct us to provide the smaller benefits to many others. Here, the convergence argument must deny that the solitary individual can reasonably reject the optimific principles. This is where Parfit's ‘improvements’ on contractualism are vital to the convergence argument. As originally formulated, contractualism departs from utilitarianism by allowing the individual to reject the optimific principles whenever they place a greater burden on her than her favoured principle places on any other single individual. Proponents of the convergence argument will favour instead a more impersonal formulation. While the individual's own complaint is left undiminished, other people can now reject her principle on impersonal grounds—precisely because it fails to maximise everyone's well-being. Faced with these impersonal reasons, the single individual cannot reasonably reject the optimific principles.

Despite its provocative claims, the convergence argument is, in one respect, quite modest. It does not set out to prove that rule consequentialism, Kantian ethics and contractualism necessarily coincide. Rather, the conclusion is merely that plausible versions of the three theories do not necessarily conflict. For this modest purpose, it would be sufficient to construct one plausible version of contractualism on which the optimific principles cannot reasonably be rejected.

There is a methodological issue here. In his presentation of the convergence argument, Parfit tests competing versions of contractualism against intuitions regarding specific idealised cases. This is not a peculiarity of Parfit's own presentation. Without intuitions of this kind, the convergence argument cannot get off the ground. Proponents of individualist formulations of contractualism might reply that, in some key cases, Parfit's intuitions are not neutral benchmarks, but rather reflect the considered moral judgements of a consequentialist mind. This leaves it open to Contractualists to simply stick to their guns—and argue that their view is distinctive at the normative level, as well as the meta-ethical level.

Commenting on Parfit's earlier claim that the best interpretation of Kant coincides with the best form of rule consequentialism, Scanlon observes that “the degree to which Parfit's conclusion should seem surprising depends to a certain extent on how close the theories he is discussing are to Kant's” (Scanlon 2011, p. 117). Similar remarks apply to the convergence argument. The appeal of contractualism is that it presents a genuine alternative to both consequentialism and Kantian ethics. Those who are attracted to contractualism because, in certain key cases, it coheres with distinctively non-utilitarian intuitions, are likely to regard the impersonal contractualism deployed in the convergence argument as an abandonment of the core commitments of contractualism. The convergence argument would then be of limited relevance. We return to these issues below, when we consider the Individual and Impersonal Restrictions in more detail. (See sections 7, 8, and 10.)

5. Is contractualism circular or redundant?

We now turn to six problem cases for contractualism. The first two concern the logical structure of contractualism—asking whether its account of wrongness is either circular or incomplete. The next two are puzzle cases where the most obvious interpretation of contractualism seems to yield implausible results. The last two are groups who should be included in the scope of morality, but who seem to be left out by contractualism: animals and future people.

The appeal to reasons beyond well-being brings out a common objection to contractualism—that the whole apparatus of reasonable rejection is redundant. The objection is as follows. Contractualism says x is wrong if and only if x is forbidden by principles no-one can reasonably reject. Anyone can reasonably reject a principle on the grounds that it permits actions that are wrong. So a principle that no-one can reasonably reject is a principle that permits no actions that are wrong. If we don't already know which actions are wrong, then we cannot use the contractualist apparatus. But if we do already know which actions are wrong, then we don't need to use it.

There is a related objection using ‘unfair’ instead of ‘wrong’. Suppose, following our previous discussion in section 3, we agree that contractualism allows ‘because it treats me unfairly’ to count as a reason for rejecting a principle. We then face the challenge that our judgments of unfairness are doing all the real moral work, as contractualism now says that a principle is wrong if and only if it treats someone unfairly.

To respond to this objection, contractualists must explain why ‘x is wrong’ and ‘x is unfair’ are not the sort of claims that can feature as a reason for rejecting a principle. They must also demonstrate that admitting reasons not based directly on well-being does not commit us to admitting ‘x is wrong’ and ‘x is unfair’.

The Contractualist answer appeals to the conceptual link between wrongness and justification. Whether an act is wrong depends, not only on its direct impact on individuals, but also on whether a principle permitting it can be justified to all concerned. ‘Because it is wrong’ is not the kind of reason that can be fed into the contractualist apparatus, since it is not something that happens to individuals. Instead, wrongness is something that very apparatus constructs out of individuals' reasons. The same goes for ‘because it is unfair’. In the example of the racist principle, I reject the principle, not because it treats me unfairly overall, but because it illicitly places weight on an inappropriate moral distinction. My complaint concerns how a principle treats me. To know whether an action is wrong, we must compare different people's complaints, which we do by comparing one principle's treatment of me with the way alternative principles treat others.

6. Is contractualism too tidy? (The pluralist challenge)

An advantage of contractualism is that it can capture the wide range of considerations that are relevant to moral deliberation. All the considerations that provide individuals with reasonable grounds for objecting to a proposed principle are relevant. As we have seen above, these considerations include more than the direct (and even the indirect) impact of a proposed principle on individual well-being. This plurality of considerations is nevertheless unified by a single normative domain or subject matter: unjustifiability.

Some opponents of contractualism will object that contractualism is not pluralist enough. They will object to the unified account of wrongness. Is it plausible that all the considerations relevant to what we owe to each other are unified by their relevance to whether the principle permitting the conduct could be reasonably rejected? In our moral deliberation about right and wrong actions, are all moral considerations only relevant in virtue of how they affect whether or not a principle licensing the proposed action is justifiable?

Take for example, the claim that it is wrong to inflict gratuitous suffering on persons, and sentient beings in general. Imagine someone torturing someone else. A utilitarian will object that, in our grasp of the wrongness of the action, the most salient fact is that the behaviour would inflict gratuitous suffering. This is much more salient than the fact that the person could reasonably reject a principle permitting such conduct. The utilitarian concludes that morality is fundamentally about the avoidance of suffering. A pluralist will conclude instead that morality is irreducibly plural—some moral reasons are grounded on justifiability, but others are grounded directly on suffering or pleasure.

The contractualist replies that what is most morally relevant in the case of torture is that suffering is brought about through the agency of another—not just that suffering occurs. This is why being tortured is morally much worse than suffering similar injuries through a lightning strike—the former is an affront to my human dignity in a way that the latter is not. If we agree that this is the really significant fact, then the advantage now lies with the contractualist, whose moral theory explicitly gives a central place to the notion of agency. (As ever, the dialectic can continue, as utilitarians can reply that torture is morally worse than a lightning strike because it involves a gross failure of benevolence). For a foundational consequentialist account of morality (such as utilitarianism), the wrongness of the action is based solely and directly on the suffering it would cause. Against such an account, the contractualist argues that the moral importance of promoting well-being is always mediated via its effect on the justifiability of the relevant principle: if an action fails to show sufficient concern for someone's well-being then that person has strong grounds for objecting to the principle.

It is, furthermore, important to recall that contractualism deals in ‘could reasonably reject’ not in ‘does reject’. Contractualism does not say that gratuitously causing suffering is not wrong until someone objects to it, or that gratuitously causing suffering would not be wrong at all if no-one happened to object to it. There is nothing accidental about the fact that a particular act of gratuitously causing suffering is wrong. Rather, gratuitously causing suffering is always intrinsically wrong—because it is (always and everywhere) the kind of thing that provides grounds for reasonable rejection.

Contractualism and consequentialism thus gloss what is objectionable about the same conduct in different ways. Instead of a decisive intuition that counts against contractualism, we have a case of distinct intuitions, where different theorists, beginning from different intuitive starting points, end up with different theoretical priorities.

7. Can contractualism really avoid aggregation?

We saw earlier that, unlike utilitarianism, contractualism rejects aggregation. However, there are some cases where contractualism's aversion to aggregation seems to lead to undesirable results. Consider the following situation, drawn from a famous article by John Taurek (Taurek 1977).

The Rocks. Six innocent swimmers have become trapped on two rocks by the incoming tide. Five of the swimmers are on one rock, while the last swimmer is on the second rock. Each swimmer will drown unless they are rescued. You are the sole life-guard on duty. You have time to get to one rock in your patrol-boat and save everyone on it. Because of the distance between the rocks, and the speed of the tide, you cannot get to both rocks in time. What should you do?

Suppose you decide to save the lone swimmer on the second rock. Intuitively, this seems wrong. Surely you should have saved five people instead of one. The challenge for contractualism is to explain why what you did is wrong. Utilitarians have a straightforward answer, based on aggregation. You should save the five people instead of the one simply because five deaths is a worse result than one death. This case is tricky for contractualism because it rejects aggregation. The five people will each want to reject the principle that allows you to save the one, by appealing to the fact that such a principle leaves them to die. But the lone person on the second rock will want to reject any principle that allows you to save the five. And the reason for objecting to the principle is exactly the same in each case—this principle leaves that person to die. The five people cannot appeal to the fact that there are more of them—because this is not an individual reason. (Suppose you are one of the five. The fact that four other people will die is not something you can object to, as it is not something that happens to you.) It therefore looks as if we have reached a stalemate—and perhaps the best solution (the principle that no-one can reasonably reject) is to toss a coin. That way, each of the six people gets a fifty-fifty chance of survival. No-one can reasonably reject this principle on the grounds that it only gives them a fifty-fifty chance of survival, because any alternative gives someone even less chance. Tossing a coin is the only principle that guarantees everyone at least a fifty-fifty chance. So it is the only principle that no-one can reasonably reject.

One contractualist response is to bite the bullet, and accept that coin tossing is the right answer. Many contractualists, however, wish to capture the intuition that we ought to save the five. Recall that an agent's reason for rejecting a principle can be based, not on its effect on her well-being, but on what that principle says about her or how it treats her. Imagine one of the five swimmers on the first rock arguing as follows: “Coin tossing is clearly the right principle if there is one person on each rock, as it balances their competing reasons. If you apply the same principle when there are five on this rock, you are saying it makes no difference that there are five rather than one. So you are acting exactly as if I wasn't here, facing this life and death situation. A principle that allows you—in effect—to ignore my plight in this way doesn't show respect for me. If there were one person on each rock, their claims to be rescued would cancel out. So we then look to see whether there are other people on either rock. There are several such people, and I am one of them. My claim to be rescued remains un-trumped. So you should rescue the five.” (For a critique of this argument, see Otsuka 2001.)

A further difficult kind of case for contractualism is where the burdens that different persons stand to suffer are unequal—and so cannot balance each other and cancel each other out—but are still very severe in each case. The following example is suggested by Derek Parfit's discussion of contractualism and aggregation (Parfit 2003). Consider a choice between two scenarios. In the first, one person suffers agony for a hundred years; while in the second a million people suffer agony for a hundred years minus a day. An additional day of agony is a considerable burden. Therefore if we consider the situation from the perspective of the single individuals involved, it would seem that the first person's complaint (‘I will suffer for a hundred years’) outweighs the complaint of any other single individual (‘I will suffer for a hundred years minus a day’). However, a utilitarian would argue that, in this case, the second scenario is worse.

A utilitarian might conclude that, while this ideal of choosing a scenario that is acceptable to each person from his or her personal point of view is extremely appealing, it is not always attainable. In particular, this ideal is not practical when we cannot avoid placing a severe burden on at least one person. Contractualism focuses each person's mind on the burdens imposed on himself or herself, and on other individuals—and invites us to withdraw our burdens if we see other individuals suffering much more under a competing principle. However, in our present example, each of the individuals in the second scenario would find the situation unacceptable from their personal point of view, simply because of the magnitude of the suffering it involves. It is not plausible that they would withdraw their complaint because the person in the first scenario stands to suffer a slightly greater burden. It can be argued that in such cases we should give intrinsic moral weight to the number of persons who suffer a severe burden and so minimise the number of persons for whom the situation is unacceptable.

The contractualist has several possible replies. They could simply deny the utilitarian's intuition. Perhaps it is wrong to impose a greater burden on a single person, even to save many others from a slightly worse burden. Contractualists who want to capture the utilitarian's intuition might argue that, just as complaints are not always tied to well-being, the strength of an individual's complaint need not be proportional to the loss of well-being. Perhaps a principle that allows me to suffer for a century minus a day is just as objectionable to me as one that allows me to suffer for a century. Once the complaints are on a par, we can then appeal to our earlier tie-breaking method, and conclude that it is wrong to favour the one over the many. (A utilitarian will reply that in any context a day of agony is an enormous moral burden—it is no less bad if the person has already suffered for almost a century—so that the complaint of the individual in the first scenario has to be seen as significantly greater than that of any individual in the second scenario.)

In chapter 21 of On What Matters, Parfit presents further arguments that can be deployed against the individualist restriction—which limits the grounds for rejecting a principle to its implications for single people. First, Parfit presents a series of cases where, he argues, “any contractualism that incorporates the individualist restriction must conflict with all plausible views about the distribution of benefits and burdens” (Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 198). One representative case is the following (Parfit 2011, volume 2, pp. 199–200):

Case Six: The only possible alternatives are these:
Blue will live to the age of: Each of some number of other people will live to:
We do nothing 30 30
We do A 70 30
We do B 35 35

Following Parfit, utilitarians will object that, if we endorse the individualist restriction, then “we ought to give Blue her 40 more years of life rather than giving 5 more years to Blue and to as many as a million of these other people. … this is clearly false” (Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 200).

Second, Parfit offers a new argument that, when the individualist restriction does enable the contractualist to reach the right conclusions, it cannot do so for the right reasons. Consider the following case (Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 196):

Case Three: The only possible alternatives are these:
Future days of pain
for Blue: for each of some number of other people:
We do nothing 100 10
We treat Blue 0 10
We treat the others 100 0

Here, the utilitarian says that, if the number of other people exceeds ten, then we should treat the others, as this maximises total well-being. Parfit argues that “most of us would reject this utilitarian claim, believing instead that we ought to save Blue from her great ordeal. We might even believe that we ought to save Blue from her 100 days of pain rather than saving any number of such other people from their much smaller burden of 10 days of pain” (Parfit 2011, volume 2, pp. 196–7).

The individualist restriction enables contractualism to diverge from utilitarianism in this case. Because the other people's reasons cannot be aggregated, they cannot ever outweigh Blue's reason. But opponents of the individualist restriction will object that this is a coincidence. The real reason we should treat Blue is not because Blue's burden would otherwise be greater, but because Blue would otherwise be so much worse-off. For instance, suppose instead that, if we do nothing, everyone (Blue included) will suffer 100 days of pain [This is Parfit's Case Four]. We must now choose between relieving Blue of all of her 100 days, or relieving everyone (Blue included) of 10 of their 100 days of pain. Those who favour a more impersonal formulation of contractualism will object that the individualist restriction must instruct us to do the former. “And [this conclusion] is clearly false” (Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 202).

In Cases Four and Six, opponents of the individualist restriction will argue that we can only get the right result by allowing the other people to pool their individual complaints—otherwise, they cannot hope to overrule Blue. Those who find this intuition compelling may conclude that contractualists must drop the individualist restriction, and instead accommodate Case Three by saying that “people have stronger moral claims, and stronger grounds to reject some principle, the worse off these people are” (Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 202). Other contractualists may be prepared to bite the bullet here, or to seek alternative ways to accommodate these intuitions, on the grounds that the individualist restriction is an essential feature of contractualism, without which contractualism cannot hope to escape the extreme and alienating demands of utilitarianism—the topic of the next section.

8. What does contractualism demand?

Impartial theories are often accused of being unreasonably demanding. For instance, consider the fact that there are very many very needy people in the world. A variety of aid agencies, which currently rely on donations from private individuals, can alleviate these needs. No doubt governments, multinationals, and others could do far more than they do. But the question still remains: faced with such urgent needs, at least some of which I could meet at comparatively little cost to myself, how should I as an individual act?

Impartial moral theories often seem to give very demanding answers to this question. This is easiest to see for utilitarianism. Utilitarianism tells me to put my dollars wherever they will do the most good. In the hands of a reputable aid agency, my dollar could save a child from a crippling illness, and so I am obligated to donate it to the aid agency. I should give my next dollar to an aid agency, and I must keep donating till I reach the point where my own basic needs, or my ability to keep earning dollars, are in jeopardy. Most of my current activities will have to go. Nor will my sacrifice be only financial. According to utilitarianism, I should also spend my time where it will do most good. I should devote all my energies to aid work, as well as all my money.

Perhaps we would admire someone who behaved in this way. But is it plausible to claim that those of us who do not are guilty of wrongdoing; or that we have a moral obligation to devote all our resources to charity? Such conclusions strike many people as absurd. This leads to the common objection that utilitarianism is unreasonably demanding, as it leaves the agent too little room (time, resources, energy) for her own projects or interests.

This is a serious objection to utilitarianism. If contractualism can avoid a similar fate, then this will be a significant advantage. But is contractualism less demanding than utilitarianism? It certainly seems possible that contractualism will generate very demanding principles, as it seems reasonable for those who are starving to reject any principle permitting me to retain inessential resources rather than meeting their most basic needs. I would then be doing something wrong unless I do all that I can to save other people's lives—at least until I reach the level below which I would be giving up necessary components of my own well-being.

A similar problem for contractualism is presented by Thomas Nagel, who argues that, in the present state of the world, it may be impossible to construct any set of principles which no-one can reasonably reject. Any possible principle of aid will either make unreasonable demands on the affluent (from their point of view), or pay inadequate attention to the basic needs of the destitute (from their point of view). If the notion of reasonable rejection is at least partly determined by the agent's own perspective, then any principle will be reasonably rejected by someone. (Nagel 1991 and 1999).

Contractualists might reply that principles of aid presuppose some background set of entitlements, guaranteeing me the free use of my own resources. This raises two problems. The first is that, from the fact that I own something, it does not follow that I do not have an obligation to give it away. The most that might follow is that others may not force me to do so. The second problem is that, if our overall theory is Contractualist, then the property rights themselves must be given a Contractualist justification. We need a system of property rights no-one can reasonably reject. Any system where property rights are very unequally distributed will be rejected by those who miss out.

How might contractualism reply to this demandingness objection? Like any impartial moral theory, contractualism can bite the bullet, and argue that morality is very demanding. The contractualist apparatus explains why morality is demanding—if we seek to act in a way that we could justify to others, then we must adopt principles that no-one can reasonably reject. Given the state of the world, these principles will seem very demanding to those who are affluent—but the alternative would be principles that place an even greater burden on those who are worst-off.

For instance, Scanlon himself reaches the following principle through contractualist reasoning:

The Rescue Principle:
If we can prevent something very bad from happening to someone by making a slight or even moderate sacrifice, it would be wrong not to do so (Scanlon 1998, p. 224).

This principle could make very significant demands, especially if we were continually facing situations where a slight sacrifice would save someone's life. If my sacrifice is much less than the very bad thing I prevent, it is hard to see how I can reasonably reject this principle.

More controversially, one of us has argued previously that analogous reasoning leads to an even more demanding principle.

The Stringent Principle:
If we can prevent something very bad from happening to someone by making a great sacrifice (e.g., giving most of our income to aid agencies and spending a lot of our spare time on campaigning and fund-raising), it would be wrong not to do so (Ashford 2003, p. 287).

If the ‘great sacrifice’ is nevertheless significantly less bad than the ‘very bad thing’ that might happen, it is hard to see how I can reasonably reject this principle. If the ‘very bad thing’ is an agonising death, this principle can be very demanding indeed.

It may be argued that even if this stringent principle follows from contractualism, that is not a problem for the theory. Perhaps, in the current state of the world, we should expect any moral theory grounded on each person's equal moral status to be extremely demanding, given the drastic and irrevocable impact on those in need if they are not helped, and the fact that there are constantly so many in this position (Ashford 2003, p. 292–2).

However, many moral philosophers—contractualists included—seek a more moderate moral theory. If contractualism is to avoid being extremely demanding, the challenge is to stop short of the stringent principle. We need to find a principle that allows me to choose my own lesser good over a (significantly) greater good for someone else—and then to show that this principle cannot be reasonably rejected. For instance, suppose I spend my spare evening (and spare income) going to the movies rather than donating the time and money to a charity which could thus have saved someone's life. We need an explanation of why those who die as a result cannot reasonably reject the principle that permits this behaviour.

The most promising answer lies, once again, in the possibility that my grounds for rejecting a principle are not necessarily confined to its direct impact on my well-being. I might reject a principle requiring me to devote all my time and energy to charity, not simply because of the burdens it imposes on me but because, in leaving me no room for my own personal projects, it fails to respect me as a person. (The destitute person will reply that a principle allowing me to leave her to starve fails to respect her as a person. The challenge for the contractualist is to distinguish these two complaints. For one attempt, see Kumar 2000.)

Responding to Parfit's presentation of the convergence argument, and his critique of the individualist and impersonal restrictions, Scanlon notes that, because it rejects those restrictions, any impersonal reformulation of contractualism, is much more demanding than the original formulation of contractualism (Scanlon 2011). This charge has a particular dialectical significance, as rule consequentialists often present their theory as a more moderate alternative to the extreme demands of act consequentialism. If it retains those restrictions, contractualism will always be less demanding than these alternative theories—even if its demands are greater than commonsense morality might normally expect.

9. Can contractualism protect animals?

Social contract theories notoriously leave out non-human animals. If all moral obligations are between parties to the social contract, then we have no obligations regarding animals who cannot be parties to the contract. So (for instance) torturing non-rational animals cannot be wrong. By contrast, utilitarians have no difficulty explaining why it is wrong to torture animals. This seems to place contractualism at a comparative disadvantage. Can contractualism provide an adequate account of our moral obligations to animals? Does it need to?

Scanlon offers two solutions. The first is to limit the scope of his account. Contractualism is not an account of the whole of morality, but only an account of the morality of what we owe to other persons. This leaves open the possibility that our obligations to animals fall outside this part of morality. Scanlon also explicitly puts aside any moral obligations we might have in regard to the natural environment (Scanlon 1998, p. 179).

Scanlon also suggests a possible way that obligations to animals could be accommodated within contractualism. This is via the notion of trustees, to whom justifications of proposed principles can be offered, on behalf of the animals they represent (Scanlon 1998, p. 183).

Utilitarians will object that this second solution provides too indirect an account of what ultimately grounds our obligations to animals. The fact that it is wrong to inflict unnecessary pain on animals is not most plausibly explained via the notion of whether this behaviour could be justified to a trustee of the animals. Rather, it is wrong simply because of the suffering the animal feels. A utilitarian will add that, once we realise that this is what is wrong in the case of animal suffering, we should draw the same conclusion about human suffering. It is their capacity for suffering rather than their capacity for rational agency that plays the most salient role in explaining the wrongness of torturing humans.

A contractualist can reply as follows. Contractualism captures the central sense of wrongness, one that plays a role in how individuals understand what they are accountable to one another for. The case of animals shows that this is not the only notion of wrongness. But, once we reflect on the differences between the two cases, we see why our obligations to one another are so different from any obligations we might have to animals—precisely because we cannot meaningfully justify ourselves to them. Animals are not a special problem for the contractualist, but rather an opportunity to explore what is distinctive about the contractualist approach.

10. Can contractualism protect future people?

Another problem facing any social contract theory concerns our obligations to future people. It is hard to see how we can have any obligations to such people, as they cannot be parties to our contract. This is principally because of the absence of any possibility of mutually advantageous interaction between distant generations. The quality of life of future generations depends to a very large extent on the decisions of the present generation. By contrast, our quality of life is not affected at all by their decisions. We can do a great deal to (or for) posterity but posterity cannot do anything to (or for) us. This power imbalance is often characterised in terms of the absence of Hume's “circumstances of justice”. (The phrase is borrowed from Rawls 1971, pp. 126–130.)

For contractarians, for whom morality is an agreement for mutual advantage, it follows that we have no obligations to future people with whom we cannot interact. A similar problem arises for those like Rawls who seek to base the social contract on some modification of self-interested behaviour—such as self-interest behind the veil of ignorance.

Contractualism, by contrast, easily avoids this particular problem, as it begins by assuming that moral agents are motivated by a desire to justify themselves to others. There is no reason why those others must be currently existing people. When deciding how to act, I can ask myself whether future people who are affected by my actions might reasonably reject a principle permitting those actions. For instance, if I want to construct a power plant that will leak radiation in the future, it makes perfect sense to ask whether those who will suffer as a result might reasonably object to my behaviour. Because it works with the possibility of reasonable rejection—rather than actual bargaining—contractualism can accommodate obligations to future people. This is a significant advantage over other social contract theories.

However, there is a second problem regarding future people—one that does seem to apply to contractualism. This problem owes its prominence in recent philosophical debate to the work of Derek Parfit, to whom we owe the following example (Parfit 1984, pp. 351–379):

The Summer or Winter Child. Mary is deciding when to have a child. She could have one in summer or in winter. Mary suffers from a rare condition which means that, if she has her child in winter, it will suffer serious ailments which will reduce the quality of its life. However, a child born in winter would still have a life worth living, and, if Mary decides to have a child in summer, then an altogether different child will be born. It is mildly inconvenient for Mary to have a child in summer. (Perhaps she doesn't fancy being heavily pregnant during hot weather.) Therefore, she opts for a winter birth.

Mary's behaviour seems morally wrong. Utilitarians have a simple account of why Mary's behaviour is wrong, as she brings about less human happiness than she could have done. Yet it seems that contractualism cannot capture this intuition. Consider a principle permitting Mary's behaviour. If Mary's behaviour is wrong, then this principle must be one that someone can reasonably reject. But who? Not the Winter Child—because he would otherwise never have existed at all. And not the Summer Child—because he doesn't exist.

Perhaps the most promising contractualist defence lies, once again, in the possibility that my grounds for rejecting a principle are not necessarily confined to its direct impact on my well-being. We might separate two moves the contractualist can make here. They might argue (1) that the grounds for rejecting a principle need not be its impact on my well-being; or (2) that it need not be its impact on my well-being. Intuitively, what is objectionable about Mary's behaviour is not anything to do with well-being, or with the identity of future individuals. What is wrong is rather that Mary fails to show adequate respect for ‘her future child’—whoever that child may turn out to be. Even though there is no particular individual who can be said to have been harmed, there is still legitimate ground for a complaint that a principle permitting Mary's behaviour shows inadequate respect to future people. The challenge for the Contractualist is to translate this complaint into one that can be made on behalf of the Winter Child. (For one recent attempt at such a translation, see Kumar 2003a. For a critique, see Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 235)

In chapter 22 of On What Matters, Parfit argues that the impersonalist restriction—which rules out appeals to the impersonal goodness or badness of outcomes—leaves any form of contractualism that incorporates the individualist restriction unable to respond to the non-identity problem.

Instead, Parfit argues that contractualists should permit both personal and impartial reasons as grounds for reasonable rejection. Impartial reasons, here, are grounded in the moral claims or the well-being of individuals. “We have such impartial reasons to care about the well-being of every individual or person” (Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 238). The crucial feature of impartial reasons is that they are not narrowly person-affecting. In a different people choice, we have an impartial reason to maximise the well-being of future people—even though different possible futures include different groups of possible people. “Since [because of the non-identity problem] we cannot appeal to the personal reasons that are had by people who never exist, we should appeal to the impartial reasons that are had by people who do exist” (Parfit 2011, volume 2, p. 240).

As with the individualist restriction, we might wonder whether the admission of impartial reasons effectively abandons the spirit of contractualism. If every present person has the same impartial reasons, and if those reasons cannot outweigh any individual's personal reasons, then the resulting more impartial formulation of contractualism will converge with rule consequentialism. But does this result tell us anything interesting about Scanlon's contractualism? More generally, will the resulting theory retain the distinctive features of contractualism that appeal to those who are unsatisfied with familiar alternatives such as Kantian ethics or rule consequentialism?


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