Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Medieval Theories of Relations

1. For the record, the other categories are action, passion, time, place, position, and habit.

2. Intuitively, a monadic (or one-place) property is one whose instances can belong to only one subject at a time, whereas a polyadic (or many-place) property is one whose instances can belong to more than one subject at a time. Questions can be raised about the adequacy of this intuitive characterization in connection with so-called reflexive relations such as identity. For now we can ignore these complications; but see the discussion in section 5.2, especially n. 39.

3. In medieval philosophy, ‘similar to’ (or similis followed by the dative case) just means same in quality as.

4. In Categories 7, Aristotle makes it clear that he thinks the relating properties must be accidents, for according to him no substance is a relation. See Categories 7, 8a14f.

5. Metaphysics V, 15, 1021a30. All translations of Aristotle are taken, with slight modification, from The Complete Works of Aristotle.

6. Augustine discusses both types of theological consideration in De Trinitate V, especially 208-215. This text exercises enormous influence on the subsequent medieval treatment of relational situations.

7. Boethius sets the precedent here. In his commentary on the Categories, which introduced medieval philosophers to all three terms, he not only moves freely among them but explicitly denies that there is any difference in meaning between two of them, namely, ‘toward something’ and ‘relative’: “Whether we say toward something or relatives makes no difference.” Boethius, In Categorias Aristotelis, 217.

8. For a helpful discussion of some of the terms used by medieval philosophers to signify relations, see Schmidt 1986, esp. 133-40.

9. Medievals typically rely on context to distinguish use and mention, and hence employ the same terms to refer both to relations and to the predicates by means of which they are introduced.

10. Cf. Tractatus de quantitate q 3 (in Opera Theologica x, 104). There is some debate about how exactly Ockham's ‘razor-type’ claims are to be interpreted. For relevant discussion, see Boler 1985 and the notes cited in his article; cf. also Spade 1999, 100-117.

11. Albert claims to find this objection in the writings of certain Muslim philosophers: “Some fairly recent philosophers such as Avicenna and Alfarabi … say that no form that is a being (ens) belongs to a thing unless it is absolute as far the being (esse) it has in itself is concerned—as is clear from looking at cases of what is hot, cold, white, black, and all other things.” Liber de praedicamentis, 222b. For further discussion, see Brower 2001.

12. Scriptum super Primum Sententiarum, fols. 318va-b. For useful discussion of Auriol's views, see Henninger 1989, 150-173.

13. In the early modern period, philosophers habitually speak of relations as the “products of comparison” or “results of thought”, while at the same time allowing for things to be related apart from the activity of any mind. See, e.g., Locke, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, bk. 2, chap. 2; Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, bk. 1, pt. 1, sec. 5; and Leibniz, Philosophische Schriften, vol. 2, 486. Cf. also Henninger 1989, 184-186; Olson 1987, pp.37-43; and Cover and O'Leary-Hawthorne 1999, 58-86.

14. In his commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics, Avicenna suggests that most of his contemporaries endorse a form of anti-realism. For a translation and discussion of the relevant texts, see Marmura 1975. On the Mutakallimūn, cf. Weinberg 1965, 89-91.

15. Part of Auriol's innovation consists in the way he tries to accommodate this intuition. See Henninger, 1989, 166-68.

16. This summary provides what I take to be the point of Albert's difficult discussion in Liber de praedicamentis, 224a-224b. For a detailed defense of this interpretation, and its contemporary relevance, see Brower 2001.

17. For discussion of Harclay's two views, and their relationship to Scotus's and Ockham's, see Henninger 1989, 98-118.,

18. For a good example of this approach, see Abelard's discussion of universals in his Logica ‘ingredientibus’, 7-32. For an English translation of this discussion, see Spade 1994, 26-56.

19. During the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries, this intuitive view of relational change was often discussed in a connection with an authoritative passage from the Physics: “There is no motion in respect of relation: for it may happen that when one correlative changes, the other can truly be said not to change at all, so that in these cases the motion is accidental” (V, 2, 225b11-13).

20. It is worth noting in passing, however, two other sorts of considerations. First, reductive realists often appealed to various forms of an infinite regress argument to support their position. This sort of argument is now typically associated with the absolute idealist, F. H. Bradley, but it was known to philosophers during the Middle Ages and taken by many (including, Ockham and the later Harclay) to show that relations cannot be really distinct from their foundations. Cf. Henninger 1989, 110-112, 121-122 and Adams 1987, vol. 1, 215-250. Second, reductive realists also relied on various forms of what is sometimes called ‘the separation argument’. After certain events in the late thirteenth century, including the condemnations of 1277, it was generally agreed that a real distinction between two or more items implies that either can exist in separation from the other—at least by God's power. As the reductive realists were quick to point out, however, this tells against non-reductive realism. For if relations are really distinct from their foundations, then it follows that God can create the foundations without the corresponding relations—and hence absurdly that, say, two white things could exist without being similar, or two quantified things without being either equal or unequal. Cf. Harclay, “Utrum Dei ad creaturam sit relatio realis” (herafter abbreviated “Utrum Dei”), n. 18f. For further references and discussion, cf. also Menn 1997. For a variation of the separation argument, sometimes used against reductive realism, see Klima's discussion of Psueudo-Campsall vs. Ockham in Spade 1999, esp. 123-127.

21. Ockham, however, leans toward this sort of view in several of his Quodlibetal questions, where he entertains the idea that abstract relative terms, such as ‘similitude’, function as collective names, and hence like other such terms (‘people’, ‘army’, ‘crowd’, ‘company’) refer to several things taken jointly (conjunctim). Cf. Quodl. VI, q. 8 (in Opera Theolgica ix, 616-617) and q. 25 (681-682).

22.All translations of Harclay are adopted, with slight modification, from MacDonald forthcoming.

23. Harclay's discussion is complicated and my interpretation is by no means uncontroversial. For an alternative interpretation of this discussion, see Henninger 1989, 112-117.

24. Again, the idea here is that, by itself, Simmias's height is merely potentially relative-making, and it only becomes actually relative-making in the presence of another height, including Socrates's.

25. For a formal reconstruction of this sort of view, see Klima 1991.

26. Harclay uses the term ‘toward-ness’ (aditas) in his question on relations (see “Utrum Dei,” n. 50), whereas Aquinas often uses ‘disposition’ (habitudo) or ‘relative disposition’ (relativa habitudo), and eventually comes to prefer ‘order’ (ordinatio). Cf. n. 7 above.

27. Especially worth mentioning in this context is Addis 1989 and Fumerton 2002. Addis (see esp. 27-46) identifies several other contemporary or near-contemporary philosophers who hold this sort of view (including Meinong, Husserl, Bergmann, and Searle), but anyone holding a form of the so-called adverbial theory of consciousness would also appear to be a candidate. See also Brower and Brower-Toland 2008.

28. Harclay explicitly addresses this sort of non-reductivist line in “Utrum Dei,” n. 10f.

29. For this interpretation of Aquinas, see Henninger 1989, 13-28.

30. Thus, according to Henninger, the proper description of Aquinas's view about relations and their foundations will vary depending on which criteria one uses for identity and real distinction. See Henninger 1989, 29-31.

31. De Trinitate, 226. (“…quamvis temporaliter incipiat dici, non tamen ipsi substantiae dei accidisse intelligatur sed illi creaturae ad quam dicitur”)

32. De Trinitate, 226. Augustine introduces the example of the coin in the course of defending his views about of creation. Thus, he says, if a coin can change its relations solely in virtue of changes in the properties of something else, “how much easier ought we to accept this of the unchangeable substance of God?” (ibid).

33. For Boethius's own statement of the example, see De Trinitate 5. Although Boethius's example involves two human beings, the variation involving an immobile column comes quickly to replace it, and over time even to be attributed to Boethius himself. Thus, as Harclay says at one point: “Boethius offers the example of a column's being to the right at the end of De Trinitate.” See “Utrum Dei,” n. 72.

34. Peter Lombard (c. 1095-1160) discusses the relationship between God and creatures in the first book of his Sentences, an influential summary of Christian doctrine. From the mid-thirteenth through the mid-fourteenth century, every student who earned a baccalaureate in theology was required to lecture and comment on Peter's text. As a result, commentaries on the first book of this text (around distinction 30) become the locus classicus for medieval discussions of relations. Cf. Henninger 1989, 8.

35. This way of thinking about relations derives from a late 12th-century work of unknown authorship (but traditionally ascribed to Gilbert of Poitiers) called Liber sex principiorum. This work distinguishes the first four Aristotelian categories (substance, quantity, quality, and relation) as intrinsic and the last six categories as extrinsic. For a representative treatment of the categories which follows this division, see Aquinas's discussion in In V Met., lect. 9, n. 892 and the commentary in Wippel 1987 and 2000. Even Aquinas, however, sometimes allows for extrinsic denomination in the case of relations. Cf. In Sent. I, d. 40, q. 1, a. 1.

36. Ordinatio I, d. 30, q. 5 (in Opera Theologica iv, 385-86). For a discussion of Ockham's distinction between real relations and relations of reason, see Henninger 1989, 136-40.

37. In one of his early works, Super Dionysium De divines nominibus, Albert the Great identifies all relations acquired as a result of mere Cambridge changes as relations of reason—apparently overlooking the possibility of acquiring real relations in the same way (as in the case of Socrates's becoming shorter than Simmias as result of Simmias's growth). For the relevant texts of Albert, and helpful discussion, see MacDonald 1991, 31-55 (esp. 42-47). No other medieval philosopher I know of makes this sort of identification, and Albert himself comes to reject it in some of his later works. Thus, as I indicated in section 4b above, in his Metaphysica Albert explicitly allows for cases in which a substance can acquire real relations without undergoing any real change, and uses the distinction between relations and relational accidents to explain how this is possible.

38. In Monologion c. 25, Anselm distinguishes those accidents which require a change in their subject from those that do not, and suggests that even God may have accidents of the latter sort (though as he goes on to explain, ‘accidents’ of this latter sort are accidents only according to an improper way of speaking). In “Utrum Dei,” Harclay develops this distinction between two types of accident at greater length, and attempts to connect it not only with Anselm but also with Augustine and Boethius (cf. esp. nn. 110-120).

39. Interestingly, this same line of reasoning leads some philosophers to deny that self-identity is a relation at all. Consider, for example, the following passage from Harclay's “Utrum Dei,” n. 32: “real identity is not a real relation, because it lacks one condition that is necessary for being a relation (and which it is impossible for something that is identical and that to which it is identical to satisfy), namely, real distinctness of relata. This condition is satisfied in the case of distinct things but not in the case of something that is one and the same [as itself]. For that reason, distinctness is a relation but identity is not.”

40. What Aquinas here refers to as ‘cause’ he elsewhere refers to as the ‘foundation in reality (fundamentum in re)’ of a being of reason (cf., e.g., In Sent. I, d. 19, q. 5, a. 1). In the case at hand, therefore, the relevant causes are just the extramental foundations of the relations.

41. Medieval philosophers often apply this consequence to cases involving privations (such as blindness), since they involve negation, which is typically regarded as a being of reason. Thus, it is commonly said that Homer would be blind (that is, lack sight), even if Homer's blindness did not exist. And the reason is that the truth of the latter claim depends for its existence on the activity of the mind, whereas the former does not. For further discussion and references, see Klima 1993.

42. Ockham does, however, want to maintain (with Aristotle) that relation is a real category or genus generalissimum. He does this by identifying a loose sense in which relations can be said to exist outside the mind, and indeed interprets Aristotle's own way of speaking along these lines: “according to the Philosopher's view, ‘relation’ is a category of the real not in the sense that it signifies things outside [the mind] … but rather in the sense that its species [i.e., specific relational concepts] signify such things [outside the mind].” See Quodl. VI, q. 22 (in Opera Theologica ix, 669); cf. Freddoso and Kelly 1991, 564 and Henninger 1989, 133.

43. Summa heologiae I, q. 28, a. 1, sed contra. Although this passage occurs in the sed contra, it is clear from other works that it represents Aquinas's own views. Cf. De potentia, q. 8, a. 1.

44. The Commentaries on Boethius by Gilbert of Poitiers, 79. Gilbert's division of the intellectual disciplines follows Boethius's discussion in De Trinitate 2.

45. Cf. The Commentaries on Boethius by Gilbert of Poitiers, 193, 223, and 227. For an excellent discussion of the relevant texts, to which my own discussion is indebted, see MacDonald 1999.

46. One of Ockham's most influential followers, John Buridan (d. 1358/61) even goes so far as to say that everything is a relation (relativum, though not relatio, since like Ockham he construes the latter as a second intention). For everything can be conceived of in terms of a relative concept, since everything is identical with itself and distinct from everything else. Cf. Summulae de Dialectica 3.4.1.

47. I say ‘harmless’ because, like other medieval realists, Ockham and his followers think many judgments of the form ‘aRb’ are true independently of the mind. Nonetheless, because they deny that the term ‘relation’ refers to anything in extramental reality, and hence that strictly speaking relations are concepts or beings of reason, there is a sense in which their view qualifies as anti-realist.

48. For an excellent account of these broader historical developments, see Ashworth 1974; cf. also Klima 2000, and the exchange between Zupko and Klima (in Klima 1998).