Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Dec 19, 2005; substantive revision Wed Jun 20, 2012

The term ‘proposition’ has a broad use in contemporary philosophy. It is used to refer to some or all of the following: the primary bearers of truth-value, the objects of belief and other “propositional attitudes” (i.e., what is believed, doubted, etc.[1]), the referents of that-clauses, and the meanings of sentences.

One might wonder whether a single class of entities can play all these roles. If David Lewis (1986, p. 54) is right in saying that “the conception we associate with the word ‘proposition’ may be something of a jumble of conflicting desiderata,” then it will be impossible to capture our conception in a consistent definition.

The best way to proceed, when dealing with quasi-technical words like ‘proposition’, may be to stipulate a definition and proceed with caution, making sure not to close off any substantive issues by definitional fiat.

Propositions, we shall say, are the sharable objects of the attitudes and the primary bearers of truth and falsity. This stipulation rules out certain candidates for propositions, including thought- and utterance-tokens, which presumably are not sharable, and concrete events or facts, which presumably cannot be false. These consequences fit well with contemporary usage. Our definition leaves open many of the questions dividing propositionalists: which additional roles are propositions fit to play? would propositions have to be mind-independent or abstract? what individuation conditions would they have? how would they relate to facts? We examine these issues below, as well as the fundamental issue of whether there are propositions at all.

1. Brief History

We will attempt only the briefest history of the topic, focusing on key episodes rather than on a comprehensive survey.

It is difficult to find in the writings of Plato or Aristotle a clear endorsement of propositions in our sense. Plato's most challenging discussions of falsehood, in Theaetetus (187c-200d) and Sophist (260c-264d), focus on the puzzle (well-known to Plato's contemporaries) of how false belief could have an object at all. Thinking that Theaetetus flies would seem to require thinking the non-existent flying Theaetetus. Were Plato a propositionalist, we might expect to find Socrates or the Eleactic Stranger proposing that false belief certainly has an object, i.e., that there is something believed in a case of false belief — in fact, the same sort of thing as is believed in a case of true belief — and that this object is the primary bearer of truth-value. But it seems no such proposal is seriously considered. In both dialogues, it is suggested that thought is a kind of inward dialogue carried on in the mind itself (Theaetetus 189e-190a and Sophist263e), and that judgment results when the two inward voices affirm the same thing. Plato is standardly understood as explaining false belief (doxa) in terms of the assertion of a false statement (logos). But it is far from clear that he takes the objects of belief to be statements rather than simply the ordinary concrete objects (e.g., Theaetetus) and forms (e.g., flying) which the statement is about, and still less clear that he takes statements to be sharable between minds. Statements, for Plato, might simply be tokens of inner speech, as Nuchelmans (1973, p. 21) suggests.

Aristotle expends great energy in investigating what in reality makes true statements true, but less investigating the nature of truth-bearers themselves. In his most significant discussions of truth and falsehood, he seems not to take a clear stand on the question of propositions. In On Interpretation 1 16a, for instance, Aristotle remarks that falsity and truth require combination and separation, whether of names and verbs in speech, or of elements in thought. However, it is unclear whether the resulting combination of thought elements is anything other than a token thought, as opposed to something which is the content of the token thought and which could be thought by others, could be denied, asserted, etc.

Arguably, the first employment in the western philosophical tradition of the notion of proposition, in roughly our sense, is found in the writings of the Stoics. In the third century B.C., Zeno and his followers, including Chrysippus especially, distinguished the material aspects of words from that which is said, or lekta. Among lekta, they distinguished the complete from incomplete (or deficient), the latter corresponding roughly to the meanings of predicates, the former to the meanings of sentences. Among complete lekta they included axiomata, or the meanings of declarative sentences. For the Stoics, only axiomata, and not the words used to articulate them, were properly said to be true or false. Axiomata were therefore the proper subject matter of Stoic logic.

Lekta posed a problem for Stoic materialism, according to which everything real is corporeal. For the Stoics, the real was limited to that which can act or be acted upon, and therefore to the bodily. Lekta, however, were thought to be incorporeal. Seneca explains:

For instance, I see Cato walking; the sense of sight reveals this to me and the mind believes it. What I see is a material object and it is to a material object that I direct my eyes and my mind. Then I say ‘Cato is walking’. It is not a material object that I now state, but a certain affirmation about him… (Epistulae morales, 117, 13)

The notion of a proposition can also be found in the works of Medieval philosophers, including especially Abelard (1079–1142) and his followers, but also among later scholastic philosophers in England, including Adam Wodeham (d. 1358) and Walter Burleigh (1275–1344).

Abelard distinguishes between dicta or what is said and acts of assertion (or thinking), the former being the fundamental bearers of truth-value. While Abelard himself seems to have had little to say about the nature or identity conditions of dicta, his successors took up the subject with vigor (Nuchelmans 1973, pp. 162–3). Are dicta particular acts of thinking, concrete events or facts, or entities having the same sort of being as universals? Each of these views is considered and evaluated in the treatise Ars Meliduna, of unknown authorship.

A similar debate raged among the English scholastics in the fourteenth century. Against Ockham's nominalistic account, under which the object of assent is a complex token mental sentence, Adam Wodeham, for example, maintained that the object of assent is not any sort of mental entity, nor even a thing at all, properly speaking, nor of course a nothing but rather a being the case (see Wood 2003, and Nuchelmans 1996, IV for further discussion of Wodeham and his contemporaries).

One complicating factor for the contemporary reader in examining Medieval (and later) work on the topic is that the term “propositio” was standardly used, following Boethius, to refer to sentences, mental as well as written or spoken (oratio verum falsumve significans, i.e., speech signifying what is true or false). Propositions in our sense were what was signified by these propositiones if they signified at all.[2]

When we turn to the early modern period, it is not easy to find, at least in the writings of major philosophers, an unabashed assertion of the reality of propositions. Unsurprisingly, one looks in vain in the writings of the British empiricists. As for Descartes, particular acts of judgments serve as the primary bearers of truth-value (although there is considerable debate about the status of his eternal truths). Leibniz's cogitato possibilis have some of the characteristics of propositions. These possible thoughts seem to play the role of thought-contents and the fundamental bearers of truth-value. However, it is a matter of debate whether they are accorded real ontological status.

Propositionalists were by no means rare in the 19th century, Gottlob Frege being the best known example. The Czech philosopher and mathematician Bernard Bolzano also deserves special mention. In his Wissenschaftslehre, or Theory of Science, published in 1837, he argued for the existence of what he called ‘Sätze an sich,’ or sentences in themselves, which he clearly distinguished from linguistic items or mental phenomena. They are the fundamental bearers of truth and falsity, and the objects of the attitudes. It is the goal of every science, including mathematics, is to state the fundamental true sentences in themselves pertaining that subject matter. (This marks a clear departure from the psychologizing approaches of many of Bolzano's contemporaries.) Like Frege after him, Bolzano conceived of propositions as complexes composed of wholly abstract mind-independent constituents (Vorstellungen an sich). Bolzano’s work has had a profound influence on Husserlian phenomenology and the development of modern logic.

Arguably, the three figures whose work has most shaped the framework for contemporary Anglophone work on propositions are Gottlob Frege, G.E. Moore, and Bertrand Russell. We will give short summaries of their thought on the matter.

In 1892, Frege published his classic paper “On Sense and Reference”. This paper contains his first formulation of the distinction between sense (Sinn) and reference (Bedeutung). Roughly speaking, the sense of an expression is the mode of presentation of its referent, or the cognitive value of its referent. Expressions were said to express their senses. Sentences, too, had both referents and senses, according to Frege. The referent of a sentence is its truth-value. Its sense is a thought (Beaney 1997, p. 156), not a token thought, but a thought in the sense of a proposition: a sharable content. Thus, in Fregean jargon, meaningful sentences express thoughts.

Frege conceived of thoughts as structured complexes of senses. The thought expressed by ‘The evening star is bright’ consists of the sense of ‘the evening star’ and the sense of ‘is bright’. (It should be noted that this claim about structure does not strictly follow from the fact that sense is compositional, i.e., that the sense of a whole expression is fixed by the senses of its constituent parts and their syntactic mode of arrangement.) In his late masterpiece, “The Thought” (1922), Frege is explicit about the nature of thoughts. They are not part of the outer realm, which consists of those entities perceivable by the senses. This Frege thinks is obvious. Nor are they part of the inner realm, which consists of ideas. Unlike ideas, thoughts do not require an owner (i.e., they exist even if not present in any mind), and can be present to more than one mind. A third realm must be recognized, he tells us — a realm of abstract eternal entities which we can grasp by virtue of our power of thinking. However, Frege is explicit that thoughts do act:

Thoughts are not wholly unactual but their actuality is quite different from the actuality of things. And their action is brought about by a performance of a thinker; without this they would be inactive, at least as far as we can see. And yet the thinker does not create them but must take them as they are. They can be true without being grasped by a thinker; and they are not wholly unactual even then, at least if they could be grasped and so brought into action (Beaney 1997, p. 345).

This is perhaps the locus classicus for platonism in the modern sense of that term, that is, for the doctrine that there exist mind-independent abstract entities.

In their early writings, Russell and Moore endorse propositionalism. In his 1903 book The Principles of Mathematics, Russell affirms the existence of propositions, taking them to be complexes of ordinary concrete objects (the referents of words) rather than of Fregean senses (p. 47). Propositions so conceived are now standardly called Russellian, and propositions conceived as complexes of senses or abstract entities are called Fregean. In his 1899 paper, “The Nature of Judgment,” Moore affirms the existence of propositions, taking them to be broadly Fregean in nature (in particular as being complexes of mind-independent Platonic universals which he calls concepts).

Russell and Moore later grow suspicious of propositions (although Russell seems to have accepted them later as a kind of derived or immanent entity). Interestingly, Moore's thinking on the matter seems to have changed dramatically during the winter of 1910–11, as his published lectures Some Main Problems of Philosophy reveal. Before Christmas, Moore claims:

In the one case what is apprehended is the meaning of the words: Twice two are four; in the other case what is apprehended is the meaning of the words: Twice four are eight… Now by a proposition, I mean the sort of thing which is apprehended in these two cases…. I hope it is plain that there certainly are such things as propositions in this sense. (p. 73)

After Christmas, Moore is more skeptical. While the theory of propositions is admittedly simple and natural (p. 286), there are good reasons to reject it. He specifies two problems, both having to do with facts, a topic he avoided in his earlier lectures. The first is that the theory of propositions suggests the “primitivist” theory of truth, previously held by Moore and also Russell, according to which truth is a simple unanalyzable property of propositions. Primitivism, Moore now claims, requires the claim that facts consist in the possession by a proposition of the simple property of truth. This Moore now finds unacceptable. The second problem is simply that the theory seems intuitively false:

…if you consider what happens when a man entertains a false belief, it doesn't seem as if his belief consisted merely in his having a relation to some object which certainly is. It seems rather as if the thing he was believing, the object of his belief, were just the fact which certainly is not — which certainly is not, because the belief is false. (p. 287)

Russell echoes similar sentiments in essays after Principles. In 1910 he writes that “we feel that there could be no falsehood if there were no minds to make mistakes” (Slater 1992, p. 119), and in the 1918 he remarks that a person with “a vivid instinct as to what is real” cannot “suppose that there is a whole set of false propositions about ” [Russell 1956, p. 223).

These doubts led Russell (1912) to propose a multiple relation theory of judgment, to replace the standard two-place relational theory (which is discussed at length in section 3.1). To use Russell's example, in judging that Desdemona loves Cassio, Othello stands, not in a binary relation to a proposition, but rather in a multiple or many-placed relation to Desdemona, loving, and Cassio. Othello's judgment is true when there is a fact of Desdemona loving Cassio and otherwise false. This theory, and its contemporary incarnations, is discussed in a supplementary document.

Moore's doubts led him to postulate what appear to be merely possible facts as the objects of the propositional attitudes. When a subject believes that x is F and x is not F, the object of belief is the non-existent but possible fact that x is F. See section below for further discussion of possible facts and their relations to propositions.

2. Roles for Propositions: Modality

If there are propositions, they would appear to be good candidates for being the bearers of alethic modal properties (necessary and possible truth), as well as the relata of entailment. And if propositions stand in entailment relations, then there would seem to be maximal consistent sets of them. Prima facie, such sets seem to be good candidates for possible worlds (Adams 1974; 1981). A proposition will be true in a possible world (at a maximal consistent set of propositions) iff it is a member of that world.

If possible worlds are understood in this way, however, it is important to distinguish two meanings for talk of ‘the actual world’. This may refer either to the totality of what exists, to what Lewis calls “I and all my surroundings”, or to the maximal consistent set which includes all the true propositions. The latter is part of I and all my surroundings, but only a proper part.

3. Roles for Propositions: Semantics

3.1. The Relational Analysis

By our stipulation, ‘proposition’ is used to pick out the objects of the attitudes and the bearers of truth and falsity. One would therefore expect that if there are propositions, they would figure importantly in the semantics of attitude- and truth-ascriptions. One would expect, in particular, that in ‘S believes that p’, and in ‘that p is true’, the that-clauses would refer to propositions.[3]

One might doubt whether that-clauses could really refer, if reference is understood on the model of proper names. For, that-clauses are not proper names, nor are they noun phrases.[4] Still, because propositions are the objects of the attitudes and the bearers of truth, mustn't they somehow be semantically associated with ascriptions of attitudes and of truth? Following Jeffrey King (2002), we will use the term ‘designate’ as a catch-all covering any sort of semantic association between a linguistic item and an entity. We follow standard terminology in using the word ‘express’ to pick out the relation between a predicate and the property which is its sense or semantic content.

More carefully, then, the propositionalist will find it natural to accept the following account of attitude-ascriptions:

The Relational Analysis of Attitude Ascriptions

An attitude ascription ‘S Vs that p’ is true iff ‘S’ designates a person who stands in the attitude relation expressed by ‘V’ to the proposition designated by ‘that p’ (and false iff ‘S’ designates a person who doesn't stand in such relation to such a proposition).

Analogously, there is the Property Analysis of truth-ascriptions:

‘That p is true’ or ‘it is true that p’ is true iff the proposition designated by ‘that p’ has the property expressed by ‘true’.

One of the great advantages of these analyses — the combination of which we will simply call The Relational Analysis — is the smooth explanation of the validity of certain inferences. Consider, for example:

Charles believes everything Thomas said.
Thomas said that cats purr.
So, Charles believes that cats purr.

Something Barbara asserted is true.
Nothing John denied is true.
So, something Barbara asserted John did not deny.

John believes that every even is the sum of two primes.
Goldbach's Conjecture is that every even is the sum of two primes.
So, John believes Goldbach's Conjecture.

These inferences are valid if they have the following simple logical forms:

For all x such that Thomas said x, Charlie believes x.
Thomas said A.
So, Charlie believes A.

Some x such that Barbara asserted x is true.
No x such that John denied x is true.
So, some x such that Barbara asserted x is such that John did not deny x.

John believes A.
Goldbach's Conjecture is A.
So, John believes Goldbach's Conjecture.

We will discuss problems for the Relational Analysis in Section 5.[5]

3.2. Meanings of Sentences

Propositions are also commonly treated as the meanings or, to use the more standard terminology, the semantic contents of sentences, and so are commonly taken to be central to semantics and the philosophy of language. However, there is room for doubt about whether propositions are the right sort of entity for the job (Lewis 1980). Here is why. Note that a sentence would appear to contribute the same content regardless of whether it occurs as a proper part of a larger sentence. So, a sentence such as ‘in the past, Reagan was president’ would seem to be true depending on whether the content of ‘Reagan is president’ is true at some past time. But this would seem to imply that this content must lack temporal qualification — that it can change in its truth-value over time. Similarly, it seems there are locative sentential operators ‘in Chicago, it is raining’. If so, then by a similar argument, it would seem that the content of ‘it is raining’ would have to lack spatial qualification. The problem is this: it seems propositions, being the objects of belief, cannot in general be spatially and temporally unqualified. Suppose that Smith, in London, looks out his window and forms the belief that it is raining. Suppose that Ramirez, in Madrid, relying on yesterday's weather report, awakens and forms the belief that it is raining, before looking out the window to see sunshine. What Smith believes is true, while what Ramirez believes is false. So they must not believe the same proposition. But if propositions were generally spatially unqualified, they would believe the same proposition. An analogous argument can be given to show that what is believed must not in general be temporally unqualified.

If these worries are well-taken, then the meanings or contents of sentences are not in general propositions.

Appealing to recent work in linguistics, Jeffrey C. King (2003) presents evidence against one of the crucial assumptions of the above arguments, that there are no genuine locational or temporal operators in English. King claims that ‘somewhere’ and ‘sometimes’ are better regarded as quantifiers over locational and temporal entities (i.e., either locations and times themselves or locational or temporal properties of events). Thus, ‘somewhere, it is raining’ would have the logical form ‘there is some location L such that it is raining at L’. King further argues that tenses are best analyzed as quantifiers over times rather than temporal operators. ‘John flunked chemistry’, thus, would have the form ‘there is some time t within I* such that John flunks chemistry at t’, where the interval I* is contextually supplied. These analyses, of course, requires the controversial claim that predicates like ‘is raining’ and ‘flunks ’ include extra argument places for locations and times.

King emphasizes that his argument is thoroughly empirical. It relies on results from empirical linguistics. If King is right, however, the view that the contents of sentences are propositions can be maintained.

For other criticisms of Lewis's argument, see Richard (1982), Salmon (1989) and Cappelen and Hawthorne (2010).

4. Arguments for Propositions

4.1 One over Many

One familiar argument for propositions appeals to commonalties between beliefs, utterances, or sentences, and infers a common entity. Thus, it has been suggested, less in print perhaps than in conversation, that propositions are needed to play the role of being what synonymous sentences have in common, what a sentence and its translation into another language have in common, etc.

Arguments of this sort are typically met with the following reply: commonalties do not necessarily require common relations to a single entity. Two red things have something in common, in that they are both red, but it does not follow that they bear a common relation to a single entity, the universal of redness. Similarly, two sentences, in virtue of being synonymous, can be said to have something in common, but that fact alone does not entail they are commonly related to a proposition. When a relation R is symmetric and reflexive with respect to a certain domain, it may be useful to speak of the things in the domain which bear R to one another as “having something in common”, but nothing of ontological significance follows. Thus, the conclusion is drawn: we need an argument for thinking that commonalties require common relations to a single entity.

4.2 Metalinguistic Arguments

One standard sort of argument for propositions is metalinguistic. Thus, many argue that we think of that-clauses as designating expressions if we are to explain how certain argument patterns (such as those considered in Section 2) are valid and in fact have sound instances (Horwich 1990, Higginbotham 1991, Schiffer 1996, Bealer 1998). Since some of these sound argument instances contain as premises sentences attributing truth to the designata of that-clauses, those designata must be bearers of truth-values. Similarly, premises of some of these sound instances ascribe attitudes toward the designatum of a that-clauses, these designata would seem to be objects of attitudes. In brief, in order to explain these facts about validity and soundness, it seems that-clauses must not only designate but must designate entities fitting the propositional role.

Whether propositions are needed for the semantics of natural language is a matter of continuing dispute. For more on these matters, see the entry on theories of meaning.

4.3 The Metaphysics 101 Argument

Our focus here will be on a different sort of argument. Here is a speech the basic character of which should be familiar to undergraduate students of metaphysics:

When someone has a belief, we can distinguish what she believes from her believing it. I have a belief that Obama is the US president, for example. We can distinguish what I believe in believing that Obama is the US president — the content of my belief — from my believing that Obama is the US president. What I believe in believing this is something you believe, too. What we both believe is the proposition that Obama is the US president. This same proposition may be asserted, doubted, etc. And, in fact, this proposition is true: Obama is the US president. So, there are propositions, and they are the contents of beliefs and other attitudes and they are the bearers of truth and falsity.

One might attempt to regiment these remarks, somewhat artificially, to take the form of an argument, which we will dub the Metaphysics 101 argument:

  1. With respect to any belief, there is what is believed and the believing of it, and these are distinct.
  2. What is believed is something that may be rejected, denied, disbelieved, etc. by multiple subjects, and is something that may be true or false.
  3. There are beliefs.
  4. So, there are propositions (i.e, sharable objects of the attitudes and bearers of truth-values).

Further tinkering might improve the argument in certain ways. Our concern, however, is whether the argument goes seriously awry.

The Metaphysics 101 Argument is not metalinguistic. It does not rely on premises about English. This can be verified by noting that the argument looks just as good after it is translated into other languages. Nevertheless, it might be claimed that the argument derives its apparent force from a seductive mistake about how English (and other languages) function. Perhaps this is another case of what Wittgenstein called “language on holiday.”[6]

5. Linguistic Problems?

How might one reply to the arguments for propositions just discussed? One might reply, of course, by arguing for the opposite conclusion. Thus, many have argued, on broadly naturalistic grounds, that we ought not accept propositions. Any such argument will involve controversial claims about the nature and status of propositions. These issues are discussed in section 7. However, one increasingly popular reply to arguments for propositions is to argue, (1), that they presuppose the Relational Analysis, and (2), that the Relational Analysis does a poor job of accounting for certain linguistic data.

5.1 The Substitution Problem

The problem here is quite simple. If, as the Relational Analysis entails, attitude-ascriptions of the form ‘S Vs that p’ assert relations to propositions, then we should be able to replace ‘that p’ with ‘the proposition that p’ without affecting truth-value. But in general we can't do this. Therefore, the Relational Analysis is false. Here are some examples of failed substitutions:

1. I insist that it will snow this year. (TRUE)
*2. So, I insist the proposition that it will snow this year.

3. I imagine that it will snow this year. (TRUE)
4. So, I imagine the proposition that it will snow this year. (FALSE)

5. I remember that combustion produces phlogiston. (FALSE)
6. I remember the proposition that combustion produces phlogiston. (TRUE).

The class of attitude verbs for which substitution problems arise — the “problematic” attitude verbs — can be divided into two subclasses: one consisting of verbs which do not grammatically tolerate substitutions (e.g., intransitive verbs such as ‘insist’, ‘complain’, ‘say’, and VPs of the form ‘Aux Adj’, such as ‘is pleased’, ‘was surprised’); the other consisting of verbs which grammatically tolerate substitutions but for which truth-value is not necessarily preserved (e.g., ‘expect’, ‘anticipate’, ‘bet’, ‘gather’, ‘judge’, ‘claim’, ‘maintain’, ‘hold’, ‘judge’, ‘feel’, ‘remember’, ‘know’, ‘recognize’, ‘find’).

Friederike Moltmann (2003) dubs this problem the Substitution Problem. (See also Vendler 1967, Prior 1971, Parsons 1993, Bach 1997, McKinsey 1999, Recanati 2000, King 2002, Moffett 2003, Harman 2003.)

5.2 The Objectivization Effect

Closely related to the Substitution Problem is what Moltmann (2003, p. 87) calls the Objectivization Effect, or objectivization. Substitutions in some cases seem to force a new reading for the verb, an object reading rather than a content reading. Thus, in ‘I imagine that it will snow this year,’ ‘imagine’ has the content reading (this is, by stipulation, what the content reading is!), whereas in ‘I imagine the proposition that it will snow this year,’ ‘imagine’ takes an object reading — it expresses the same relation that holds between subjects and garden variety objects such as those designated by NPs like ‘19th-century Wessex’ and ‘my college roommate’.

The problem here can be described as follows. If the Relational Analysis is true, then propositional attitudes are relations to propositions; but then it seems very odd that we should be unable to retain the content meaning by substituting ‘the proposition that p’ for ‘that p’.

5.3 Defensive Responses

Defensive Response #1. The above arguments against the Relational Analysis prove too much. Similar problems arise for the appeal to facts (as distinct from true propositions), properties, and events in semantics. Here are several examples of substitution failures.

S found that the room was a mess.
So, S found the fact that the room was a mess.

Freedom is on the march.
So, the property of freedom is on the march.

I jumped a jump.
So, I jumped an event (of jumping).

A difficulty for Defensive Response #1 is that it seems to spread a problem around rather than solve it. One might argue that relational analyses invoking propositions, facts, properties, and events all make the same mistake of reading too much ontology into English.

Defensive Response #2. From ‘S believes that p’ we can infer ‘S believes the proposition that p’ and ‘S believes a proposition.’ And the same goes for ‘reject’, ‘assert’, ‘deny’, and many other attitude verbs. If we concede that these sentences assert relations to propositions, then we are conceding that there are propositions. Against this, it might be argued that the many substitution failures give us reason to rethink the cases in which the substitutions go through.

Apart from such defensive replies, though, the relationalist might attempt to solve the problems. We will discuss two approaches.

5.4 The Ambiguity Response

The relationalist might claim that-clauses are ambiguous, and in particular that they pick out different kinds of entities depending on which attitude verb they complement. How do we tell what kinds of entities are picked out? We look at substitution failures. Thus, it might be argued the truth of ‘S remembers that p’ requires that the subject bear the remembering relation to a fact, rather than a proposition. After all, ‘remember’ shows substitution failures for ‘the (true) proposition that p’ but not for ‘the fact that p’.

However, there are obstacles to this response. For one thing, some attitude verbs seem not to permit substitutions no matter which nominal complement is chosen. King (2002) gives the example of ‘feel’. What sorts of entities, then, do that-clauses designate when they complement ‘feel’? No answer is possible. Is the Relational Analysis therefore false of such verbs? Perhaps even more damaging, there are verbs which are near synonyms of ‘believes’, at least in attitude ascriptions, and which grammatically take NP complements, but which exhibit substitution failures and objectivization. ‘Feel’ is one example, as are ‘maintain’, ‘hold’, ‘judge’, ‘expect’, and ‘suspect’. How could ‘believes’ designate a relation to propositions in attitude ascriptions but these verbs not? (Consider also the near-synonyms ‘assert’ and ‘claim’.)

Even if the ambiguity hypothesis cannot provide the propositionalist with a general solution to the Substitution Problem and the Objectivization Effect, it may help in explaining other linguistic phenomena, such as the distributional differences between various nominal complements (‘the fact that p’, ‘the proposition that p’, ‘the possibility that p’, etc.). (See Vendler 1967 and Moffett 2003.)

5.5 The Syntax Response

Next, following Jeffrey King (2002), the propositionalist might give a purely syntactic answer to the problems. King (pp. 345–6) claims, first, that there is a very simple syntactic explanation for the substitution failures that produce ungrammaticalities: such verbs don't take NP complements at all, and so don't take nominal complements, which are NP complements. (A verb can take that-clause complements without taking NP complements, because that-clauses are not NPs.) One might say something similar, for example, about why we cannot substitute descriptions for names in apposition (e.g., ‘The philosopher Plato believed in universals’ is true but ‘the philosopher the teacher of Aristotle believed in universals’ is not true.) King claims, second, that the other class of failures are explained by shifts in verb meanings (i.e., because of objectivization). These shifts are due to syntactical matters, in particular the syntactic category of the verb complement. If the complement is an NP, the verb has an object meaning. If it is a that-clause, it has the content meaning. King recognizes the need for qualifications: verbs in the problematic class can have the content reading with certain special NPs, e.g., quantifiers (‘everything Bill holds, Bob holds’), and anaphoric pronouns (‘I hold that, too’.). In the final analysis, King claims only that all the syntactic properties of the complement (and not just its general syntactic category) determine the verb's meaning when taking that complement.[7]

5.6 Substitution and Objectivization Problems for Everyone?

Although the dominant view in the literature is that the Substitution Problem and the Objectivization Effect are problems principally for defenders of the Relational Analysis (e.g., Prior 1971, Bach 1997, Recanati 2000, Moltmann 2003; 2004), it is intriguing to ask whether some version of these problems arise for everyone — friend or foe of the Relational Analysis, friend or foe of propositions.

As noted above, there are near-synonyms which are alike in taking nominal complements but which differ with respect to substitutions. This seems to be a fact that everyone must explain. It is hard to think that the very slight differences in meaning between ‘hold’ and ‘believe’ as they occur in ‘S Vs that p’, could explain the substitutional differences. Nor, as we saw above, does the ambiguity hypothesis seem helpful here. It seems likely that the substitutional differences must be explained in terms of shifts in verb meaning. Because substitution does not affect the meaning of ‘believe’, it must affect the meaning of ‘hold’, and, intuitively, it does. This does leave the question of how the Objectivization Effect itself is to be explained. But one might hope that a broadly syntactic solution — perhaps like King's — would be available to anyone, regardless of one's stance on propositions.

If these problems are problems everyone faces, some heat is taken off the relationalist, and the propositionalist generally.

That said, the relationalist may have to take account of other linguistic puzzles. She will need to explain why it sounds so peculiar, e.g., to talk of “my believing what you desire, or my dreading what the thermometer indicated.” And, even with purely cognitive attitude verbs, similar puzzles arise: the mild peculiarity of “I doubt/assert what you contemplate/entertain,” for example, will require explanation. (For more on these matters, see Vendler 1967 and Harman 2003.)

5.7 Modifying/Replacing the Relational Analysis

Let us suppose, for the sake of argument, the linguistic problems discussed above undermine the Relational Analysis. Can a propositionalist dissociate herself from that analysis, and its linguistic difficulties, while still endorsing the arguments we discussed for propositions in section 5.1?

Some modifications of the Relational Analysis do not avoid the linguistic problems. For instance, it is not enough to claim that attitude verbs designate three-place relations between subjects, propositions, and modes of presentation.

One possibility is to deny that attitude verbs designate relations when complemented by that-clauses, and to claim that they rather make a syncategorematic semantic contribution. Under one approach, that-clauses in attitude ascriptions designate propositions which serve to “measure” attitudes conceived of as mental particulars (Matthews 1994). It is not clear that this view will be immune to substitution and objectivization problems. See Moltmann (2003) for further discussion.

Another possibility is to abandon the Relational Analysis altogether, in favor of a version of Bertrand Russell's “multiple relation” theory. Following Russell (1911; 1913; 1918), Newman (2002) and Moltmann (2003; 2004), have recently argued that that-clauses in attitude ascriptions do not designate propositions but rather provide a number of entities as terms of a “multiple” attitude relation. These philosophers nonetheless do accept propositions, and use them to explain sentences in which ‘proposition’ explicitly occurs, e.g., (‘Some proposition that John believes is true’, ‘John believes the proposition that snow is white’). The basic idea is that there are propositions, but they have the status of “derived objects” — derived from our attitudes, which themselves are not relations to propositions. It is an interesting question whether a Russellian is positioned to endorse the arguments for propositions given in section 4. (For more on the Russellian theory, see the supplementary document:

The Multiple Relation Theory

6. The Metaphysics 101 Argument: Deep or Shallow?

We have suggested that the most promising arguments for propositions are the metalinguistic arguments and the Metaphysics 101 argument. The former arguments are plainly theoretical: they appeal to the explanatory power of semantical theories invoking propositions. To resist them, there is no need to explain away their intuitive appeal, because they do not and are not intended to have intuitive appeal. This is not true of the Metaphysics 101 argument. It is thoroughly intuitive, and so resisting the argument requires giving a story about how and why intuition goes wrong. In this section, we will consider one general strategy for doing this.

The Metaphysics 101 argument can seem Janus-faced: its premises seem utterly shallow, and yet its conclusion seems to resolve a deep ontological debate. One is apt to think, “Sure, what I believe is different from my believing it. And so we can distinguish the content of a belief from the attitude of belief. These contents are propositions. Fine, but now it seems there must be a domain of entities here, whose nature remains to be investigated. How could that be?” One might suspect some sort of equivocation or ambiguity is at work, some oscillation between a shallow and a deep interpretation.

6.1 The Internal/External Distinction

Rudolf Carnap's (1956) distinction between internal and external questions may prove relevant here. For Carnap, an internal question is a question that is asked within a particular linguistic framework. Internal questions are answered by invoking the rules of the framework together with logic and the empirical facts. Not all such questions are trivial, but questions about the existence of the sorts of entities definitive of the framework are. Carnap in fact thought that the traditional metaphysician aimed to ask a framework independent question, an external question, failing to realize that external questions are best seen as non-cognitive practical questions about which framework to adopt and at worst meaningless. (See the link to Weisberg 2000, in the Other Internet Resources section).

Relying on Carnap's distinction, within certain linguistic frameworks, such as that presupposed by the Metaphysics 101 argument, it is almost trivial that there are propositions. All it takes is something as superficial as the Metaphysics 101 argument, or the following even less enlightening argument, “The proposition that snow is white is true; therefore, some proposition is true; therefore, there are propositions.” The traditional metaphysician, however, aims to ask a non-trivial question about the reality of the propositions outside such frameworks. Such questions have no cognitive content.

One of the chief difficulties for Carnap is to explain the truth of internal statements. If ‘there are propositions’ is true, even within a framework, what does its truth consist in? If truth in a framework is explained in terms of truth given the axioms of the framework, we will want to know about the truth-value of the axioms themselves. If they are true, what makes them true? If they are not true, why can't we conclude that there really are no propositions?

Even if we must reject Carnap's internal/external distinction, perhaps some form of “Neo-Carnapian” ambiguity hypothesis can help explain away the appeal of the Metaphysics 101 argument.

A number of questions arise for the Neo-Carnapian. First, how are the internal and external readings to be distinguished? Second, how pervasive is the ambiguity? are there different readings not only for quantified sentences but for attitude- and truth-ascriptions as well? Third, what is the status of the Metaphysics 101 argument, given the two readings? The argument must be unsound when understood externally, but must it be invalid, or is it a valid argument with a false premise? If so, which is false? Fourth, how could philosophers regularly miss the internal/external ambiguity?

We will briefly describe two Neo-Carnapian accounts.

6.2 Fictionalism

One possibility is to explain the internal/external distinction by reference to fictions. Internal statements are statements made within or relative to a fiction, and they are to be assessed as true or false relative in the fiction.

However, any fictionalist interpretation of the internal/external distinction would have to explain why the fiction of propositions, like the fictions of properties and numbers, is not a mere game, but can be used for describing reality. We will briefly discuss a kind of fictionalism designed to do just this: figuralism. (See discussion, see Yablo (2000, 2001), Yablo and Rayo (2001), Yablo and Gallois (1998), and for a similar view, Balaguer 1998a and 1998b).

Relying on pioneering work by Kendall Walton (1990), Yablo argues that pretense can serve serious practical and theoretical purposes. To use Walton's example, by pretending that Italy is a boot, I can easily convey to you the location of the Italian town of Crotone. Here I am, in effect, using a pretense to convey information about the real world. Literally, Italy is not a boot, but my interest is not in speaking the literal truth, but in conveying a rather complicated fact to you as effectively as I can. Similarly, Yablo and Gallois claim, one may pretend there are certain entities in order to better convey certain facts (1998, 245–8). One might pretend there are directions in order to facilitate communication of facts about which lines stand in which geometric relations to which other ones. Perhaps one could do the same with propositions?

However, Yablo (2001) emphasizes that the figuralist need not be committed to any psychological thesis about making-believe. We may not consciously pretend that there are propositions when we say that what we believe is true, just as we may not consciously pretend that there are such things as stomach butterflies when we say we have butterflies in our stomach. Figuralism requires only that there is a semantical distinction between literal content and figurative content, and that by asserting sentences with certain false or at least highly doubtful literal contents, we may also express genuine facts, which would be well nigh impossible to express literally. (See Balaguer 1998a and 1998b on the concept of representational aids)

Figuralism makes it possible to diagnose the failure of the Metaphysics 101 argument as follows. If its steps are interpreted literally, the argument is unsound but valid. If its steps are interpreted figuratively, it is sound. Why are we fooled, then? One promising suggestion is that it can be very difficult to distinguish figurative from literal content, particularly when the figures employed have little presentational force.

If we accept this diagnosis, we are committed to thinking that every belief-ascription is literally false. This is a bitter pill to swallow, though it may seem less bitter the less importance is placed on literalness in communication (See Yablo 2001, p. 85).

6.3 Two Readings for Quantifiers

Some philosophers have suggested that ordinary English quantifiers are susceptible to multiple readings, or different readings in different contexts of use. Thus, Hilary Putnam (1987, 2004) has argued that there is no single meaning associated with the vocabulary of quantification, and that, depending on context, an assertion of ‘there are Fs’ might be true or false. For example, the Polish mereologist, in certain contexts, might be able to speak truly in asserting ‘any objects compose a further object’, whereas an assertion of the negation of this sentence might true in different contexts. (Note that Putnam is clear that the phenomenon he is describing isn't mere quantifier-restriction.)

The acknowledgement of different meanings for the quantifiers is not enough by itself to explain away the intuitiveness of the Metaphysics 101 argument. As we mentioned earlier, what is needed is an account of the apparent oscillation between a shallow and a deep interpretation. There could, in principle, be a plurality of interpretations of the quantifiers even if none of the readings differed with respect to metaphysical depth.

Recently, Thomas Hofweber (2005) has claimed to have found the required pair of readings. A quantifier, he claims, may have either a domain-conditions or inferential role reading. The domain-conditions reading is just the familiar reading we know from first order semantics: ‘there are Fs’ is true iff there exists an entity in the relevant real domain which satisfies ‘F’. This reading is therefore ontologically committing and so deep (and thus external). The inferential reading, by contrast, brings with it no ontological commitment, and so is shallow (and thus internal).

Hofweber explains that the inferential role reading serves an important function. It enables us the easy expression of partial information. For example, I might not recall a name or unique description of Fred's favorite detective, but if I want express the partial information I have, I can do this by saying “Fred admires some detective.”. Now, on the domain-conditions reading, what I express is false, and so I have misinformed my audience. What we need, to achieve the desired end, is a reading for ‘there is an F’ which validates existential generalization, regardless of whether the names occurring in the premise refer to an entity. This is what the inferential role reading provides. Thus, we say “Fred admires some detective — yes, it's Sherlock Holmes!”

Hofweber points out that these two readings are not like the two readings for ‘bank’. They validate many of the same inferences (e.g., ‘there is an F&G, therefore, there is an F and there is a G’) and, within discourses lacking empty singular terms, they validate all of the same inferences.

Now for the relevance to the Metaphysics 101 argument. On either reading of the relevant quantifiers in the Metaphysics 101 argument (those in steps 1, 2, and 4), the argument is valid. But on the domain-conditions reading, premise 1 (at least) is, if not false, then at least dubious -- a piece of controversial ontology. On the inferential-role reading, all the problems go away, and the argument appears completely shallow. The Janus-faced character of the argument comes from oscillating between the two readings. Moreover, given the close relations between the two readings, it is understandable that the metaphysician fails to realize her mistake in thinking that the argument establishes the existence of propositions.

For an account like Hofweber's to succeed, it must be possible for attitude- and truth-ascriptions to be true even if that-clauses do not designate. For if they designate, then the domain-conditions reading of ‘there is something S believes’ would be true.

7. The Nature and Status of Propositions

7.1 Easy Arguments: Mind-Independence and Abstractness

Reflection on the proposition role leads many propositionalists to rather dramatic answers to questions about the nature and status of propositions. Below is one standard line of argument, versions of which can be found in Bealer (1998), Schiffer (2003). (See also Cartwright (1962) and Soames (1999).)

The proposition that there are rocks, which we denote <there are rocks>, does not entail the existence of any beings that have or are capable of having mental states. It entails this neither in a strictly or broadly logical sense. That is, it is possible in the broadest sense for <there are rocks> to be true in the absence of all mental states. But now, if this proposition is possibly true in the absence of mental states, then it possibly exists in the absence of all mental states, and so is mind-independent. This is an easy argument for the mind-independence of at least some propositions.

A parallel “easy argument” can be given for the abstractness of at least some propositions. <2+2=4> does not entail the existence of concrete entities. So it is possible for it to be true (and so to exist) in the absence of concrete entities. Thus, it is possibly abstract. Assuming, contra Linksy and Zalta (1996), that abstractness is, necessarily, an essential feature of abstract entities, then it follows that <2+2=4> is in fact abstract. One might want to extend such arguments to contingent propositions. Consider <there are trees>. This proposition is false in a world without concrete entities. But if it is false in such a world, it must exist in that world, and so is possibly, and so actually abstract.

Similar arguments can be constructed for properties. If properties are what we assert of objects and what is true/false of objects, then there are simple arguments for the conclusion that at many properties are mind-independent and abstract.

It is dangerous to generalize these sorts of “Easy Arguments” to all propositions (particularly singular propositions). But even if they cannot be fully generalized, they threaten to show that propositions would be mind-independent abstract entities. Now, given that propositions de jure are sharable objects of attitudes, it is antecedently unlikely that they should turn out to be, say, token utterances. But one might have thought that propositions could be identified with natural language sentence types (as in Quine 1960), or with sentence types in the language of thought. But if the Easy Arguments succeed, it seems that to accept propositions, we must accept Platonism. Conceptualism about propositions seems ruled out.

Many philosophers deny that there are propositions precisely because they accept the validity of these Easy Arguments (and the truth of certain attitude ascriptions). There are familiar problems besetting the believer in abstract entities. The two “Benacerraf problems,” in particular have received much attention in the literature: the epistemological problem and identification problem. The epistemological problem for abstract propositions, roughly, is this: how can we know about abstract propositions, given that we cannot causally interact with them? The identification problem requires a bit more explanation. If propositions are abstract, then there will be many distinct candidates for propositions which seem to play the proposition role equally well. If certain entities, the Fs, are candidates for being propositions, why won't the entities consisting of an F paired with the number 1 count as adequate candidates as well, so long as we reconstrue predicates for propositions in such a way as to make the number 1 irrelevant? But propositions cannot be both Fs and these new entities, because these new entities are not Fs. Is it simply indeterminate what propositions are? See the entry on platonism: in metaphysics. (See also J. Moore 1999)

The Easy Arguments can appear suspicious. How can the seemingly obvious acknowledgement that there are propositions — i.e., that beliefs have sharable objects which bear truth-values — commit us to there being mind-independent abstract entities? We will discuss two sorts of reply found in the literature. Both are objections to the inference from there being propositions to the claim that propositions have the surprising features. We are putting aside objections to the claim that there are propositions.

7.2 Reply #1: Truth in a World vs. Truth at a World.

The Easy Arguments rely on an assumption about entailment and truth, namely:

(Assumption A) If a proposition <p> fails to entail a proposition <q>, then it is possible for <p> to be true while not-q.

This assumption is needed to reason from premises about propositions failing to entail other propositions about there being mental states or being concrete entities to the possible truth of those propositions in the absence of mental states and concrete entities.

But how could (A) fail? If a proposition fails to entail that q, doesn't it follow that there is a possible world in which the former is true and not-q?

Some philosophers (Pollock 1985, King 2007) have argued that principles like (A) have two readings, one clearly acceptable but useless to the Easy Arguments and the other useful to those arguments but false. The two readings correspond to two ways of understanding talk of truth with respect to possible worlds. One way for something to be true with respect to a world requires the truth-bearer to exist in the world and be true there. Another way is for the truth-bearer to “correctly describe” the world, where this does not require existing in the world. Pollock gives the example of a picture depicting the non-existence of all pictures. The picture could correctly depict a situation even though the situation it depicts is one in which the picture itself does not exist. Similarly, the Medieval philosopher Jean Buridan discusses the example of an utterance of ‘there are no negative utterances’. This utterance correctly describes a certain possible situation even though that situation is one in which the utterance would not exist. Following Adams (1981), we may call the former way of being true with respect to a world truth in a world and the latter truth at a world. The conceptualist may claim that propositions can be true at worlds without being true in them, by analogy with the examples from Pollock and Buridan. A proposition like <there are no propositions> is true at certain possible worlds but true in none. Since we do not want to say that such propositions are necessary, we must understand necessity as truth at every possible world. Correspondingly, to preserve the connections between entailment and necessity, we must understand entailment in terms of the entailed proposition being true at every world at which the entailing proposition is true. Given all this, we can distinguish two readings for Assumption A:

(Reading 1) If a proposition <p> fails to entail a proposition <q>, then there is a possible world W such that <p> is true in W and not-q at W.

(Reading 2) If a proposition <p> fails to entail a proposition <q>, then there is a possible world W such that <p> is true at W and not-q at W.

Given the understanding of entailment in terms of truth at a world, the conceptualist will claim that Reading 1 is false, while Reading 2 is true but useless to the Easy Arguments. Thus, the conclusions of those arguments are blocked.

The plausibility of this response depends on having a good account of what truth at a world amounts to. But this, in turn, depends on issues in the metaphysics of modality.

If worlds are concrete particulars (“I and all my surroundings”), as they are for David Lewis (1986), then we could say that a proposition is true at a world if the proposition is about the entities that are parts of that world and is true, and true in a world if true at a world and also part of that world. There may well be difficulties of explaining how a proposition could be part of more than one concrete world (and why it would only be part of some concrete worlds but not all), but this framework seems to make conceptual room for the possibility propositions being true at worlds without being true in them.

Suppose, however, that worlds were conceived as world stories, i.e., as maximal consistent sets of propositions (see Section 2). How, then, might truth at a world be understood? One approach, favored by Adams (1981), is to explain truth at a world in terms of truth in a world, understanding the latter to amount to truth were the world actual (were all its members true). On this approach, we would understand what is true at a world in terms of what is true in it, together with certain facts about the actual world. However, the conceptualist cannot abide this approach. For, on this approach, the members of any world are true in that world. But since the members of any and every world are propositions, it would follow that, contrary to conceptualism, that it is necessary that there are propositions. A more conceptualist-friendly approach is to reverse the order of explanation, to explain truth in a world in terms of truth at a world + existence in that world. How could truth at a world be understood? A natural proposal is to understand it as membership in a world story.

Difficulties emerge with this proposal when we face the question of how to understand consistency of world stories. There are maximal sets of propositions that are not possible worlds because they are not consistent in the relevant sense. But the relevant sense is not easily defined. Following Adams (1981), we might wish to use the concept of possibility to gloss the notion of consistency: a set of propositions is consistent if and only if those propositions could all be true together. This returns us to the problem noted in the previous paragraph: it again would turn out that necessarily there are propositions (even in mindless worlds).

The conceptualist might hope to take the relevant notion of consistency as primitive and reject the gloss in terms of joint possible truth. Still, we should ask about the broader implications of denying the joint possible truth of consistent world stories. Consider, for instance the notion of actuality. Only one of the many possible worlds is actual, although each is actual relative to itself. The actual one, on the world story view, is the one all of whose members are true. But if this is what actuality for worlds amounts to, then assuming possible worlds are possibly actual, it would follow that for each possible world all its members could be true together. Ought we to deny that possible worlds are possibly actual?

The conceptualist might hope to avoid these problems, without falling back on Lewis's concrete realism about possible worlds, by understanding worlds in terms of properties or states of affairs, rather than propositions. Following Stalnaker (1976), one might think of worlds as properties which are ways things could have been. Following Plantinga (1974) and others, one might think of worlds as maximal consistent states of affairs, where these are thought of as distinct from propositions.

However, this retrenchment may end up only shifting the Platonist worries elsewhere. To distinguish the ways that are possible worlds (or possible world-states) from those which are not, it is difficult to avoid appealing to a gloss in terms of being possibly instantiated: the possible worlds are not only maximal but they could be instantiated. Taking this line would require conceding that in every world there are properties. Something similar holds for the conception of possible worlds as maximal consistent states of affairs.

One might think, however, that Platonism about properties is less problematic than Platonism about propositions. The former do not represent the world, whereas the latter, as truth-bearers, do (Jubien 2001, King 2007). However, properties can apply or fail to apply to objects, and can be said to be true or false of objects, and so it is not clear that worries about representation clearly gain more traction for propositions than for properties. Similar considerations apply to states of affairs.

Despite these worries, the conceptualist might be encouraged by the example of singular propositions. Hasn't the truth in vs. truth at distinction been useful in dealing with the modality of singular propositions? For example, consider any singular proposition about Socrates, e.g., the proposition that Socrates was a philosopher. Such propositions, plausibly, depend for their existence on the object they are directly about. One might therefore think that no singular proposition about Socrates could exist unless Socrates existed. Consider, then, the proposition that Socrates does not exist. It is clearly contingent that Socrates exists; things could have been otherwise. But then the proposition that Socrates does not exist would appear to be possible without being possibly true. Unlike the examples from Pollock and Buridan, however, we cannot understand such possibility without possible truth in terms of expressing a possibly true proposition while not being possibly true itself. Propositions do not express propositions, of course, and so we cannot understand their possibility without possible truth in this way (Plantinga 1981). What is it, then, for such a singular proposition to be possible but not possibly true? Answering this question was one of the key motivations in the development of the distinction between truth in and truth at a world. But while Adams and others attempted to do this by thinking of truth at a world as determined by what is true in that world together with a certain set of facts about the actual world, the conceptualist hopes to kick aside the ladder of truth in a world altogether. Whether this hope is reasonable or not is an important issue in contemporary work on propositions. (Key recent discussions include King 2007 and Soames 2010).

7.3 Reply #2: Deflationism to the Rescue?

Another response to the Easy Arguments is, so to speak, to deflate their significance by deflating propositions. The Easy Arguments succeed, but their success marks no great philosophical discovery and raises no hard questions of the sort that have traditionally bothered metaphysicians of a nominalist bent.

We will here discuss only Stephen Schiffer's (2003) theory of “pleonastic propositions.”[8]

Propositions exist, for Schiffer, but unlike rocks or cats, there is nothing more to them than what our concept of a proposition guarantees. One may call them “abstract entities,” if one likes, but this label should not encourage the thought that our minds can reach beyond the physical world to make contact with denizens of a Platonic universe. We know about propositions, not by interacting with them, as we do with rocks and cats, but by being participants in certain sorts of linguistic or conceptual practice. It's because we speak or think in certain ways that we are able to know about propositions.

Schiffer argues, in effect, that given our proposition-talk and thought, propositions are, in D. M. Armstrong's phrase, a kind of “ontological free lunch.” That is, the key “axioms” of our proposition-talk and thought are guaranteed to be true. These include the instances of the equivalence schema (E) for propositions: The proposition that p is true iff p. Given the truth of such axioms, it follows that propositions exist and have the features attributed to them by our axioms. Moreover, because these axioms are constitutive of the concept of a proposition, it follows that, by possessing that concept, we can know the truth of these axioms.

One might concede to Schiffer that the axioms are constitutive of our concept of a proposition. But why think those axioms are true? Schiffer stresses that we do not make the axioms true by saying, thinking, or “stipulating” that they are true. The mind-independence of propositions, after all, is implicit in those axioms.

Schiffer's argument for pleonastic propositions is of a piece with his argument for pleonastic entities generally, including fictional entities, events, and properties. A pleonastic entity, for him, is an entity that falls under a pleonastic concept. The latter is the key notion and is defined as follows.

Definition: A concept F is pleonastic iff it implies true something-from-nothing transformations.

A SFN (something-from-nothing) transformation (about Fs) is a statement that allows us to deduce a statement about a kind of entity F, from a statement that involves no reference to Fs. (61) SFN transformations assert a kind of supervenience condition on Fs: if the relevant non-F conditions obtain, Fs exist and have the relevant features. (E.g., if snow is white, then the proposition that snow is white exists and is true.)

If the concept F is pleonastic, then there are Fs. We need to know how to tell if a concept is pleonastic. Here is Schiffer's test:

Test: A concept F is pleonastic (and so implies true something-from-nothing transformations) iff adding it to any theory yields a conservative extension of that theory. (57)

Schiffer's final formulation of the conservativeness test is:

For any theory T and sentence S expressible in T, if the theory obtained by adding to T/~F <the theory resulting from restricting quantifiers in T to ~Fs> the concept of an F, together with its something-from-nothing F-entailment claims, logically entails S~F<the sentence resulting from restricting quantifiers in S to ~Fs>, then T/~F logically entails S~F. (p. 57)

One might think the conservativeness test is overly complicated, and that all that matters is that the new entities not interfere with the empirical world. If so, then the test would mention only empirical theories not all theories. But, as Matti Eklund (2007) points out, two kinds of entity that are individually non-interfering with respect to the empirical world might interfere with one another. Schiffer is aware of this problem (see his discussion of anti-fictional entities, pp. 55–6), and this is why he turns to the more complicated account.

Schiffer's picture is this. If a concept satisfies the conservativeness test, then its instantiation would be unproblematic because it would interfere with nothing else. Its instantiation comes for free. If a concept doesn't meet this test, it doesn't come for free.

Although Schiffer's view of propositions can be described as deflationary in one sense (because it attempts to deflate questions about the existence and nature of propositions), the meta-ontology underlying Schiffer's approach is, if anything, inflationary: all “non-interfering” kinds of entity are instantiated.

Schiffer's, and other deflationist theories, must, at a minimum, answer the following two questions, in addition to the questions facing all propositionalists:

(1) Why would the non-interference of Fs be evidence for their existence?

Even if Fs would be non-interfering in Schiffer's sense, the postulation of Fs logically conflicts with some consistent theories, e.g., ‘There are no Fs’. Schiffer places severer constraints on the denial of entities than on the acceptance of them. Suppose Fs would be non-interfering. Then adding them would not add information about non-Fs. But suppose also that denying Fs would not add information about non-Fs. Why isn't this a reason to deny Fs? So, in this sense, the theory denying Fs passes a corresponding conservativeness test.

(2) How can the deflationist explain how these propositions have truth-conditions?

If the proposition that snow is white is a simple, necessary and eternal object, why does its having a property (truth) have anything to do with concrete snow's having a property (whiteness)? Do instances of the T-schema simply state brute necessary connections between abstract objects and concrete ones? Or do these necessary connections somehow derive from our practices, and if so, how?

7.4 Reply #3: Propositions as Types

Another reaction one might have to the Easy Arguments is to accept their conclusions but to give an account of the nature of propositions which will make these conclusions palatable. One promising line of thinking, in this regard, is to think of propositions as types, the tokens of which are mental or linguistic events, and in particular the events that would be thought to express the proposition. Such views have been developed in recent years by Dummett (1996), Hanks (2011), and Soames (2010). If one denied the existence of uninstantiated types, one would of course face the problem of “missing propositions.” For instance, if propositions P and Q were tokened, but no token existed for their conjunction, there would be no conjunctive proposition with P and Q as conjuncts. To avoid such gaps, one might move to a view on which there are uninstantiated types.

One who thought that propositions are types of mental or linguistic events, and that these types need not be instantiated to exist might well accept the conclusions of the Easy Arguments but deny that they are troubling. Thus, Dummett suggests that even though propositions (for him, Fregean thoughts) do not depend in a simple modal sense on utterances, they do depend on them in a logical sense. He offers two analogies of the relation between a proposition and an utterance: the relation between moves in chess and the associated pieces, and the relation between a tune and hummings of it. About chess moves, Dummett writes:

There are many different moves which pieces have had in obsolete or still-practised variations of chess, such as those of the pieces called Camel and Giraffe in Tamerlane's ‘great chess’; and there must be countless other possible moves that might be assigned to pieces in versions of chess that have never been played or thought of. It is harmless to say that ‘there are’ such moves; but it would be insane to deny that moves are of (actual or possible) chess pieces. This ‘of’ of logical dependence is not properly expressed by saying that a certain move exists only if there is a piece that has that move, since, as just noted, we can speak of moves that have never been assigned to any piece. It means, rather, that to conceive of any move is to conceive of a piece as having that move. (1996, p. 248)

Just as a move in chess is intrinsically a move of an actual or possible piece, even though there can be moves which no piece ever makes, so a thought is intrinsically a thought expressed by an utterance of a sentence, even though there can be thoughts that go unexpressed.

Dummett focuses on utterances of sentences, but his guiding idea could be accepted by a propositionalist who placed less weight on sentences. A Platonist might, for instance, claim that propositions are intrinsically the sorts of things that can be believed, doubted, etc. and which are the bearers of truth-values. However, it is not clear this takes any of the mystery out of Platonic propositions.

Dummett's second analogy may be more useful for this purpose. Near the end of his paper, he writes:

When someone hums a tune, the tune is the object of his humming only in a grammatical sense: the tune, being a type as opposed to a token, is a species of musical performance to which the humming belongs. Similarly, a sentence is a species of utterance. The thought expressed by the utterance of a sentence on an occasion is the significance of that utterance, given the language and the occasion.... (1996, 259)

A tune is related to a humming of it as type is to token. Dummett is suggesting that the type-token relation might help us understand how to accept thoughts, even thoughts which are modally mind-independent and abstract, without embracing, as Frege did, a troubling Platonism. (For further development of Dummett's ideas on thoughts as types, see Dodd (2000).)

What would count, though, as a troubling Platonism about propositions? Merely accepting the conclusions of the Easy Arguments would not be sufficient. Soames (2010, chapter 6) offers an explanation. A theory of the nature of propositions must enable us to see how they could represent things as being a certain way. The proposition that snow is white represents snow as white, insofar as it is true if and only if snow is white. Now if we say that this proposition simply is a certain abstract object, Soames thinks, this is not enough to enable us to see how it could have this feature. Nor does it do any good just to say that intrinsically it does have that feature! We need to be able to see how it has it. Soames claims that if we see propositions as certain sorts of types, roughly types of events of predicating properties of objects, we can explain the representational features of propositions, and we can do so without having to reject the Easy Arguments. (Soames (p. 104) himself inclines to the view that a type does not exist if untokened, but he is happy to speak of there being types that are not tokened. He would therefore not reject the Easy Arguments if they were reformulated by replacing talk of existence with talk of what there is.)

Soames, like Dummett, takes propositions to be types, not types of utterance but types of cognitive events of predication. Propositions have their representational features, then, because they are types the tokens of which are intrinsically and essentially representational. Soames takes it to be clear that when I predicate whiteness of snow, the event of my doing this represents snow as being white and so is true iff snow is white. Propositions as types derive their representational features from that of their tokens (p. 107). There are many examples of types that inherit features of their tokens (a sonata (type) can be discordant in virtue of performances of it being discordant; a movie can be frightening in virtue of its tokens being so, etc.). See the entry on types and tokens.

Soames' account holds out promise for a middleground between conceptualism and traditional Platonic realism about propositions. Like conceptualism, it can hope to explain the representational features of propositions as deriving from those of token mental or linguistic events. Like traditional Platonic realism, it can avoid the complications involved in attempting to avoid the Easy Arguments.

A number of important questions remain about Soames' view. First, since propositions can have truth-conditions in worlds in which they are never tokened, one might ask in virtue of what they have these truth-conditions in such worlds. Not in virtue of inheriting this from the tokens it has in those worlds, of course. One possible answer is that in such worlds propositions derive their truth-conditions from their merely possible tokens. This takes us again into the territory of the metaphysics of modals. If there are no merely possible tokens, then facts about them could not ground facts about the corresponding types. It is an interesting question how well Soames' account fits with actualism. Second, as Soames himself discusses at length, it is unclear that the notion of predication can bear the weight his account places on it. When I think that there are dogs, what am I predicating of what? The most plausible predication view, here, is that I am predicating being instantiated of the property of being a dog. But, as Soames argues, this leaves it unexplained why this proposition is true iff there are dogs. Third, there are questions about whether the representational features of properties might seem just as problematic as those of propositions. As we noted above, a property can apply or not apply to an object, can be true or false of an object. We might wish to know what properties are which could explain this remarkable feature of them, just as we might wish to know the same of propositions' truth-conditions. If so, then it might seem problematic simply to appeal to properties as givens in giving an account of propositions. (We might ask what a cognitive realism about properties would look like and whether it would be compatible with Soames' cognitive realism about propositions.)

Peter Hanks (2011) argues for an account of propositions similar to Soames' in broad outlines. For Hanks, propositions are act types performed by speakers in uttering sentences. Hanks argues that his account provides a new solution to Frege's puzzles about names in identity sentences and propositional attitude ascriptions. The key to his solution is an account of the semantic content of names as types of reference acts.

8. The Individuation of Propositions

Some philosophers, notably W.V.O. Quine, recognize the existence of certain sorts of abstract entities but not others at least partly on the basis of concerns about identity conditions. Quine granted the existence of sets, in part because they obey the extensionality axiom: sets are identical iff they have the same members. When it came to properties, relations and propositions, however, he found no such clear criterion of identity. The property of being a creature with a heart, he noted, is distinct from the property of being a creature with a kidney, even if all the same things exemplify the two properties.

It is a controversial matter whether Quine was right to demand such rigorous criteria of identity as a condition for acceptance of a class of entities. However, even if Quine asks too much, any good theory of propositions ought to have something to say about when propositions are identical and when they are distinct. Developing theories which give such accounts in a way that fits well with intuitive data concerning propositional attitude ascriptions would enhance our reasons to accept propositions.

The question of identity conditions for propositions is importantly related to the question of whether propositions are structured entities. Propositions are structured if they have constituents, in some broad sense, and the order of the constituents matters. Order matters only if there could be two structured propositions sharing all the same constituents, but which are distinct due to differences in the way under which those constituents are “united” in the proposition. E.g., if the proposition that a loves b is the ordered triple <loving, a, b>, it is distinct from the proposition that b loves a, which would be the ordered triple <loving, b, a>.

If propositions are structured entities, then sameness of constituents and sameness of order will entail identity. There are, of course, dangers, in regarding propositions as structured. Prima facie, one would rather not claim that the proposition that x is triangular is identical to the proposition that x is trilateral, since a subject might believe one but not the other. It will be important, then, not to individuate propositions too coarsely. However, one might worry, in the opposing direction, about overly fine individuations of propositions. Is the proposition that John loves Mary different from the proposition that Mary is loved by John? For more on structured propositions, see the entry on structured propositions.[9]

Any theory that construes propositions as structured entities would seem to face the problem of the unity of the proposition. It is not entirely straightforward to say what this problem or set of problems is. But at the very least, there are at least two problems here. There is the problem of explaining why one sort of structured whole, a proposition, can be true or false, while the set of its constituents is not. A list isn't true or false, and a proposition with the same constituents is; why is this? Second, there is a general problem of explaining how two distinct things could have all the same constituents. For a thorough discussion of the history of philosophical work on the unity of the sentence and the proposition, the reader should consult Gaskin (2008).

If propositions are unstructured, then if they are sets, they inherit the identity conditions for sets: sameness of members. Thus, if a proposition is the set of worlds in which it is true (as in Stalnaker 1976), then P=Q iff P and Q have the same worlds as members iff P and Q are true in the same worlds. As is well-known, this theory leads to a very coarse individuation of propositions, too coarse, arguably, to handle propositional attitudes. (See Soames 1987 for a discussion of this theory as well as the theory of propositions as sets of concrete situations or facts.)

If propositions are unstructured and distinct from sets, there are several possibilities for explaining their identity conditions. First, identity conditions might be specified in terms of possible attitudes. One possibility is this: P=Q if, necessarily whoever believes (asserts, denies, etc.) P believes (asserts, denies, etc.) Q, and vice versa. Second, proposition identity might be reduced to property identity in the manner of Myhill (1963) and Zalta (1983). Thus, Zalta (1983, 72) offers the following definition of proposition identity: <p>=<q> if and only if the property of being such that p is identical to the property of being such that q. A third proposal, not incompatible with the second, is to explain proposition identity in terms of the “free generation” of propositions from a stock of certain non-propositional entities, e.g., individuals, properties and relations, by algebraic operations (Bealer 1982, Menzel 1986, Zalta 1983 and 1989).[10] Although propositions on this approach are unstructured, each proposition may be represented by its “construction sequence.” To avoid identifying <Hesperus is beautiful> with <Phosphorus is beautiful>, the relevant inputs cannot simply be Hesperus (Phosphorus) and the property of being beautiful. A well-known strategy to cope with this problem, due to Frege, is to appeal to different modes of presentation associated with the different names, each contributing something different to the proposition expressed. However, these modes need not be understood as complex properties uniquely exemplified by referent of the name. For instance, Bealer (1998) invokes what he calls “non-Platonic” modes of presentation. Whether these non-Platonic modes of presentation are understood as words, as causal chains of word use, or in some other way, the important point is that the mode associated with ‘Hesperus’ will be different than that associated with ‘Phosphorus’. Zalta (1989) introduces propositions with abstract constituents to do the work of these modes. On Zalta's view, such singular propositions are built out of abstract individuals that encode the cognitive content of names. Since these abstract individuals encode this cognitive content, there is no need for the referent of the name to instantiate it, and a fortiori no need for the content to be a property uniquely instantiated by this referent. For more on encoding vs. instantiating, see section 6 of the entry on existence. Thus, these theorists hope to use the metaphysical tools of these algebraic accounts to accommodate some of the key Fregean intuitions about differences in propositions expressed while avoiding difficulties with the Fregean doctrine of sense.

9. Propositions, Facts, and States of Affairs

Frege famously wrote, “‘Facts, facts, facts’ cries the scientist if he wants to bring home the necessity of a firm foundation for science. What is a fact? A fact is a thought that is true.” (1918, p. 25)

Is a fact just a true proposition? There are metaphysical and linguistic arguments to the contrary. Here is a standard metaphysical argument. The fact that snow is white couldn't exist if snow wasn't white, but the true proposition would (only it would be false). Therefore, the fact isn't the true proposition (See Moore 1953, p. 308). Facts might be, still, in some sense, derivative from true propositions, even if the identity claim fails. Following Moore (1953, pp. 261–2) and Slote (1974, p. 99), Kit Fine (1982, pp. 52–3) suggests that facts may be conceived as concretizations of true propositions. Thus, the fact that p is the truth of <p>. However, so construing facts makes them poor candidates for truthmakers: the truth of p, presumably, is not what makes <p> true.

One well-known linguistic argument against identifying facts with true propositions is closely related to the Ambiguity Response to The Substitution Problem, considered in Section 5.4. Substitution of ‘the fact that p’ for ‘the true proposition that p’, or vice versa, produces peculiarities such as “John believes the fact that Obama is president”, or Harman's (2003) “The true proposition that fires are hot makes it the case that fires are hot.” If facts were true propositions, so it is argued, one would expect the substitutions to preserve truth.

Nonetheless, there are other uses of ‘fact’ that support the identification:

Snow is white. That's a fact. But it wouldn't have been a fact if snow were not white. So, some things that are facts might not have been facts.

Used in this way, ‘fact’ seems to apply to entities that resemble propositions, in that they have two modes of being: existence and something akin to truth (e.g., obtaining) (see McGrath 2003).[11]

One option, in the face of apparently conflicting uses of ‘fact’, is to posit an ambiguity. (Fine 1982, p. 54) There are two kinds of entity associated with different uses of ‘fact’: one kind has one mode of being (it simply exists), the other has having two modes of being (it may exist without obtaining). “Bipolar” facts correspond, roughly, to what some philosophers call possible states of affairs.

However, some philosophers would want to distinguish even such bipolar facts from propositions. Bipolar facts, the argument goes, are states of affairs, rather than true propositions. Clearly, not all propositions can be possible states of affairs, because there are propositions that are not possibly true, whereas possible states of affairs must obtain in at least some possible world. We might wish to extend the notion of a state of affairs to include impossible ones. Whether states of affairs, understood in this extended sense, are propositions clearly depends on the answers to questions about their identity conditions. See the entry on states of affairs.

King (1995 and 2007) argues that all propositions are facts, although not the ones that we might expect. The proposition that Mary loves John is not the fact that Mary loves John but rather (to a first approximation) the following fact: Mary, loving, and John being the semantic values of linguistic items standing in a certain syntactic relation (represented by a phrase marker tree) which encodes instantiation. King argues that his account has many virtues. It helps solve the problem of the unity of the proposition (see the previous section), insofar as the structure of a proposition derives from the syntactic structure of a corresponding sentence. It requires relatively minimal ontological commitments: if one accepts that there are languages with expressions designating objects and properties and in which certain syntactic relations encode instantiation, then one will accept King-propositions. The account also provides for finely individuated propositions: differences in syntactic structure of sentences will carry over to differences in the propositions expressed. Given that the existence of King-propositions seems to depend on their being language-users who use language in certain ways, King is a conceptualist about propositions. (See section 7.2 above).

10. Propositions: Sparse or Abundant?

In discussing the question of whether there are properties, D. M. Armstrong (1989) distinguishes sparse from abundant conceptions of properties. Following standard terminology, let us say that when a predicate has a property as its semantic content, the predicate expresses that property. (For simplicity, we will assume that sentences can have propositions as semantic contents.) Under an abundant conception of properties, whether a predicate expresses a property depends only on its broadly syntactic facts about it. The simplest abundant conception holds that every well-formed predicate expresses a property. According to sparse conceptions, not every syntactically well-formed predicate expresses a property.

A similar distinction may be applied to conceptions of propositions. Abundant conceptions will impose only broadly syntactic restrictions on the expression of propositions. Sparse conceptions will deny that having the relevant syntactic properties is sufficient for the expression and designation of propositions.

10.1 Expressivism and Moral Propositions

One motivation for accepting a sparse conception of propositions is expressivism in metaethics. “Old-fashioned” expressivists (e.g., Ayer and Stevenson) claimed that moral sentences are non-cognitive. We cannot believe that lying in politics is wrong, nor can we have any broadly cognitive attitudes (e.g., disbelief) of the form ‘A-ing that p’ where ‘p’ contains moral terms. If we cannot have such attitudes, then presumably there are no moral propositions. (If there were such propositions, why wouldn't there be possible cognitive attitudes having them as contents?). And if there are no moral propositions, then moral sentences do not express propositions, and so lack truth-value.

We certainly talk and think as if we have moral beliefs, as if we believe moral propositions. For the old-fashioned expressivist, then, many of our apparently sincere ordinary claims will have to be rejected. Endorsing such a sparse conception of propositions thus leads to the surprising consequence all moral sentences lack truth-value.

Some contemporary expressivists (Blackburn 1998, Horwich 1993, Stoljar 1993) are less averse to moral propositions, moral properties and moral facts. But they take these commitments as shallow.[12] They accept an abundant conception of propositions, properties, etc., but combine it with a generous dose of deflationism. There are moral propositions, but they are mere shadows of moral declarative sentences. (Even if they are shadows of our sentences in some sense, they are not shadows in another sense, at least if the Easy Arguments for mind-independence and abstractness are successful: what is mind-independent and abstract is, in a clear sense, not merely a shadow of sentences.)

At least three important questions can be asked about the combination of expressivism and deflationism about moral propositions. First, if the expressivist accepts moral propositions, what is the difference between expressivism and realism? Second, by accepting deflationary moral propositions, can the expressivist avoid the familiar problems for moral realism (and cognitivism) which helped motivate expressivism in the first place? Third, can the realist avoid these familiar problems equally well by accepting deflationary moral propositions?

The first question is examined in the entry on moral cognitivism vs non-cognitivism. We will briefly discuss the other two.

Consider, for example, the Humean argument facing realism, a crude version of which is as follows. If there are moral propositions, then moral judgments are beliefs in moral propositions. But moral judgments are intrinsically motivational states, whereas beliefs are not. So, there are no moral propositions. Of course, this argument may be criticized as relying on an overly strong internalism, or a simple-minded speculative psychology. But even when improved, it is not immediately clear how accepting deflationism about moral propositions will help the expressivist solve the problem. The moral propositions exist, and so why can't they be believed independently of having any intrinsically motivating states? How can their deflationary character help defuse this question? Moreover, suppose that deflationism did help the expressivist cope with this problem. Why couldn't the realist follow suit with her own appeal to deflationism?

Blackburn's supervenience argument is a second argument against realism. Blackburn formulated the argument in terms of moral properties, as follows. If there are moral properties, then they supervene on non-moral properties as a matter of conceptual necessity. That is, in every conceptually possible world, if two things share all non-moral properties, they share all moral properties. But if there are moral properties, the pattern of supervenience is not itself conceptually necessary. So, even if all Ps are Ms in fact, there is some conceptually possible world in which there is a P which isn't an M. Blackburn's question is this: if moral properties can come apart from non-moral properties across worlds, why can't they come apart from them within worlds? That is: what explains the “ban on mixed worlds”? A similar problem can be formulated for truth as a feature of moral propositions. What explains the ban on conceptually possible worlds in which one moral proposition <x is M> is true, while another moral proposition <y is M> is false, but in which all relevant non-moral propositions <x is P> and <y is P> are alike in truth-value? What is not immediately clear is, first, how deflationary moral propositions will prove useful to the expressivist in answering this question, and second, how, supposing they do prove useful, why they won't prove equally useful to the realist.

What the expressivist seeks is a conception of propositions (and of truths, facts, and beliefs) substantive enough to explain and validate our ordinary realist-seeming discourse but deflationary enough to avoid the traditional problems for realism. Whether it is possible to navigate the two is the subject of intense scrutiny in contemporary metaethics.


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abstract objects | Carnap, Rudolf | cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism, moral | existence | Platonism: in metaphysics | properties | propositional attitude reports | propositions: singular | propositions: structured | states of affairs


Thanks to Berit Brogaard, Marian David, Shane Duarte, Anthony Everett, Thomas Hofweber, Robert Johnson, Jeff King, Jon Kvanvig, Peter Markie, Friederike Moltmann, Jay Newhard, Stephen Schiffer, Robin Smith, Chris Menzel, and the subject editors for helpful comments.