Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Process Philosophy

First published Tue Apr 2, 2002; substantive revision Wed Jan 9, 2008

The philosophy of process is a venture in metaphysics, the general theory of reality. Its concern is with what exists in the world and with the terms of reference in which this reality is to be understood and explained. The task of metaphysics is, after all, to provide a cogent and plausible account of the nature of reality at the broadest, most synoptic and comprehensive level. And it is to this mission of enabling us to characterize, describe, clarify and explain the most general features of the real that process philosophy addresses itself in its own characteristic way. The guiding idea of its approach is that natural existence consists in and is best understood in terms of processes rather than things — of modes of change rather than fixed stabilities. For processists, change of every sort — physical, organic, psychological — is the pervasive and predominant feature of the real.

Process philosophy diametrically opposes the view — as old as Parmenides and Zeno and the Atomists of Pre-Socratic Greece — that denies processes or downgrades them in the order of being or of understanding by subordinating them to substantial things. By contrast, process philosophy pivots on the thesis that the processual nature of existence is a fundamental fact with which any adequate metaphysic must come to terms.

Process philosophy puts processes at the forefront of philosophical and specifically of ontological concern. Process should here be construed in pretty much the usual way — as a sequentially structured sequence of successive stages or phases. Three factors accordingly come to the fore:

  1. That a process is a complex — a unity of distinct stages or phases. A process is always a matter of now this, now that.
  2. That this complex has a certain temporal coherence and unity, and that processes accordingly have an ineliminably temporal dimension.
  3. That a process has a structure, a formal generic format in virtue of which every concrete process is equipped with a shape or format.

From the time of Aristotle, Western metaphysics has had a marked bias in favor of things or substances. However, another variant line of thought was also current from the earliest times onward. After all, the concentration on perduring physical things as existents in nature slights the equally good claims of another ontological category, namely processes, events, occurrences — items better indicated by verbs than nouns. And, clearly, storms and heat-waves are every bit as real as dogs and oranges.

What is characteristically definitive of process philosophizing as a distinctive sector of philosophical tradition is not simply the commonplace recognition of natural process as the active initiator of what exists in nature, but an insistence on seeing process as constituting an essential aspect of everything that exists — a commitment to the fundamentally processual nature of the real. For the process philosopher is, effectively by definition, one who holds that what exists in nature is not just originated and sustained by processes but is in fact ongoingly and inexorably characterized by them. On such a view, process is both pervasive in nature and fundamental for its understanding.


1. Historical Aspects

Like so much else in the field, process philosophy began with the ancient Greeks. The Greek theoretician Heraclitus of Ephesus (b. ca. 540 B.C.) — known even in antiquity as “the obscure” — is universally recognized as the founder of the process approach. His book “On Nature” depicted the world as a manifold of opposed forces joined in mutual rivalry, interlocked in constant strife and conflict. Fire, the most changeable and ephemeral of these elemental forces, is the basis of all: “This world-order … is … an ever living fire, kindling in measures and going out in measures” (Fr. 217, Kirk-Raven-Schofield). The fundamental “stuff” of the world is not a material substance of some sort but a natural process, namely “fire,” and all things are products of its workings (puros tropai). The variation of different states and conditions of fire — that most process-manifesting of the four traditional Greek elements — engenders all natural change. For fire is the destroyer and transformer of things and “All things happen by strife and necessity” (Fr. 211, ibid). And this changeability so pervades the world that “one cannot step twice into the same river” (Fr. 215, ibid). As Heraclitus saw it, reality is at bottom not a constellation of things at all, but one of processes: we must at all costs avoid the fallacy of substantializing nature into perduring things (substances) because it is not stable things but fundamental forces and the varied and fluctuating activities which they produce that make up this world of ours. Process is fundamental: the river is not an object, but an ever-changing flow; the sun is not a thing, but a flaming fire. Everything in nature is a matter of process, of activity, of change. Heraclitus taught that panta rhei (“everything flows”) and this principle exerted a profound influence on classical antiquity. Even Plato, who did not much like the principle (“like leaky pots” he added at Cratylus 440 C), came to locate his exception to it — the enduring and changeless “ideas” — in a realm wholly removed from the domain of material reality.

Heraclitus may accordingly be seen as the founding father of process philosophy, at any rate in the intellectual tradition of the West. And the static system of Parmenides affords its sharpest contrast and most radical opposition. However, the paradigm substance philosophy of classical antiquity was the atomism of Leucippus and Democritus and Epicurus, which pictured all of nature as composed of unchanging and inert material atoms whose only commerce with process was an alteration of their positioning in space and time. Here the properties of substances are never touched by change, which effects only their relations. It was this sort of view that Heraclitus preeminently sought to oppose.

In recent years, “process philosophy” has virtually become a code-word for the doctrines of Alfred North Whitehead and his followers. But of course, this cannot really be what process philosophy actually is. If there indeed is a “philosophy” of process, it must pivot not a thinker but on a theory. What is at issue must, in the end, be a philosophical position that has a larger life of its own, apart from any particular exposition or expositor. And in fact process philosophy is a well-defined and influential tendency of thought that can be traced back through the history of philosophy to the days of the Pre-Socratics. Its leading exponents were Heraclitus, Leibniz, Bergson, Peirce, and William James — and it ultimately moved on to include Whitehead and his school (Charles Hartshorne, Paul Weiss), but also other 20th Century philosophers such as Samuel Alexander, C. Lloyd Morgan, and Andrew Paul Ushenko.

2. How Process Philosophy Proceeds

Against this historical background, “process philosophy” may be understood as a doctrine invoking certain basic propositions: (1) That time and change are among the principal categories of metaphysical understanding, (2) That process is a principal category of ontological description, (3) That process is more fundamental, or at any rate not less fundamental than things for the purposes of ontological theory, (4) That several if not all of the major elements of the ontological repertoire (God, nature-as-a whole, persons, material substances) are best understood in process linked terms, and (5) That contingency, emergence, novelty, and creativity are among the fundamental categories of metaphysical understanding. A process philosopher, accordingly, is someone for whom temporality, activity, and change — of alteration, striving, passage, and novelty-emergence — are the cardinal factors for our understanding of the real.

The demise of classical atomism brought on by the dematerialization of physical matter through the rise of the quantum theory brings much aid and comfort to a process-oriented metaphysics. Matter in the small, as contemporary physics conceives it, is not a Rutherfordian planetary system of particle-like objects, but a collection of fluctuating processes organized into stable structures (insofar as there is indeed stability at all) by statistical regularities — i.e., by regularities of comportment at the level of aggregate phenomena. Twentieth century physics has thus turned the tables on classical atomism. Instead of very small things (atoms) combining to produce standard processes (windstorms and such) modern physics envisions very small processes (quantum phenomena) combining to produce standard things (ordinary macro-objects) as a result of their modus operandi.

For the process philosopher, the classical principle operari sequitur esse (functioning follows upon being) is reversed: his motto is the reverse esse sequitur operari. As he sees it, all is in the final analysis the product of processes. Process thus has priority over product — both ontologically and epistemically. As process philosophers see it, processes are basic and things derivative, because it takes a mental process (of separation) to extract “things” from the blooming buzzing confusion of the world's physical processes. For process philosophy, what a thing is consists in what it does.

And insofar as reality itself is a vast macroprocess embracing a diversified manifold of microprocesses novelty, innovation, and the emergence of new focus is an inherent feature of the cosmic scene.

3. An Evolutionary Perspective

Evolution is an emblematic and paradigmatic process for process philosophy. For not only is evolution a process that makes philosophers and philosophy possible, but it provides a clear model for how processual novelty and innovation comes into operation in nature's self-engendering and self-perpetuating scheme of things. Evolution, be it of organism or of mind, of subatomic matter or of the cosmos as a whole, reflects the pervasive role of process which philosophers of this school see as central both to the nature of our world and to the terms in which it must be understood. Change pervades nature. The passage of time leaves neither individuals nor types (species) of things statically invariant. Process at once destabilizes the world and is the cutting-edge of advance to novelty. And evolution of every level, physical, biological, and cosmic carries the burden of the work here. But does it work blindly?

On the issue of purposiveness in nature, process philosophers divide into two principal camps. On the one side is the naturalistic (and generally secularist) wing that sees nature's processuality as a matter of an inner push or nisus to something new and different. On the other side is the teleological (and often theological) wing that sees nature's processuality as a matter of teleological directedness towards a positive destination. Both agree in according a central role to novelty and innovation in nature. But the one (naturalistic) wing sees this in terms of chance-driven randomness that leads away from the settled formulations of an established past, while the other (teleological) wing sees this in terms of a goal-directed purposiveness preestablished by some value-geared directive force.

Process philosophy correspondingly has a complex, two sided relationship with the theory of evolution. For secular, atheological processists evolution typifies the creative workings of a self-sustaining nature that dispenses with the services of God. For theological processists like Teilhard de Chardin, evolution exhibits God's handwriting in the book of nature. But processists of all descriptions see evolution not only as a crucial instrument for understanding the role of intelligence in the world's scheme of things but also as a key aspect of the world's natural development. And, more generally, the evolutionary process has provided process philosophy with one of its main models for how large scale collective processes (on the order of organic development at large) can inhere in and result from the operation of numerous small-scale individual processes (on the order of individual lives), thus accounting for innovation and creativity also on a macro-level scale. At every level of reality, “the many become one, and are increased by one”, as Whitehead puts it in Process and Reality (p. 20).

But there is one further complexity here. Where human intelligence is concerned, biological evolution is undoubtedly Darwinian, with teleologically blind natural selection operating with respect to teleologically blind random mutations. Cultural evolution, on the other hand, is generally Teilhardian, governed by a rationally-guided selection among purposefully devised mutational variations. Taken in all, cognitive evolution involves both components, superimposing rational selection on biological selection. Our cognitive capacities and faculties are part of the natural endowment we owe to biological evolution. But our cognitive methods, procedures, standards, and techniques are socio-culturally developed resources that evolve through rational selection in the process of cultural transmission through successive generations. Our cognitive hardware (mechanisms and capacities) develops through Darwinian natural selection, but our cognitive software (the methods and procedures by which we transact our cognitive business) develops in a Teilhardian process of rational selection that involves purposeful intelligence-guided variation and selection. Biology produces the instrument, so to speak, and culture writes the music — where obviously the former powerfully constrains the latter. (You cannot play the drums on a piano.)

The ancient Greeks grappled with the question: Is anything changeless, eternal, and exempt from the seemingly all-destructive ravages of time. Rejecting the idea of eternal material atoms, Plato opted for eternal changeless universals (“form,” “ideas”) and the Stoics for eternal, changeless laws. But the world-picture of modern science has seemingly blocked these solutions. For, as it sees the matter, species (natural kinds) are also children of time, not changelessly present but ever-changingly emergent under the aegis of evolutionary principles. The course of cosmic evolution brings nature's laws also within the orbit of process, endowing these laws with a developmental dimension, (where, after all, was genetics in the microsecond after the big bang?). For process philosophy, nothing is eternal and secure from the changes wrought by time and its iron law that everything that comes into being must perish, so that mortality is omnipresent and death's cold hand is upon all of nature — laws as well as things.

However, process philosophy does not see this gloomy truth as the end of the story. For process philosophy has always looked to evolutionary theory to pull the plum of collective progress from the pie of distributive mortality. In the small — item by item — nature's processes are self-canceling: what arises in the course of time perishes in the course of time. But nevertheless the overall course of processual change tends to the development of an ever richer, more complex and sophisticated condition of things on the world's ample stage. For there are processes and processes: processes of growth and decay, of expanding and contracting, of living and dying. Recognizing that this is so, process philosophy has always accentuated the positive and worn a decidedly optimistic mien. For it regards nature's microprocesses as components of an overall macroprocess whose course is upwards rather than downwards, so to speak. Hitching its wagon to the star of a creative evolutionism, process philosophy sees nature as encompassing creative innovation, productive dynamism and an emergent development of richer, more complex and sophisticated forms of natural existence.

To be sure, there are, in theory, both productive and destructive processes, degeneration and decay being no less prominent in nature than growth and development. Historically, however, most process philosophers have taken a decidedly optimistic line and have envisioned a close relationship between process and progress. For them, this relationship is indicated by the macro-process we characterize as evolution. At every level of world history — the cosmic, the biological, the social, the intellectual — process philosophers have envisioned a developmental dynamic in which later is better — somehow superior in being more differentiated and sophisticated. Under the influence of Darwinian evolutionism, most process philosophers have envisioned a course of temporal development within which value is somehow survival-facilitative so that the arrangements which do succeed in establishing and perpetuating themselves will as a general tendency manage to have done so because they represent actual improvements in one way of another. (A decidedly optimistic tenor has prevailed throughout process philosophy.)

After all, differentiation is sophistication; detail is enrichment. The person who merely sees a bird does not see as much as the person who sees a finch, and she in turn does not see as much as the person who sees a Darwin finch. The realization and enhancement of detail bestows not just complexification as such but also sophistication. As process philosophy sees it, the world's processuality involves not only change but improvement — the evolutionary realization — at large and on the whole — of what is not only different but also in some way better. Accordingly, novelty and fruitfulness compensate for transiency and mortality in process philosophy's scheme of things.

4. An Instructive Application

Recourse to process is a helpful device for dealing with the classical problem of universals. We are surrounded on all sides by items more easily conceived of as processes than as substantial things — not only physical items like a magnetic field or an aurora borealis, but also conceptual artifacts like letters of the alphabet, words, and statements. That purported universal — the opening line of a play, say, or a shade of phenomenal red — now ceases to be a mysterious object of some sort and becomes a specifiable feature of familiar processes (readings, perceivings, imaginings). How distinct minds can perceive the same universal is now no more mysterious than how distinct walkers can share the same limp — it is a matter of actions proceeding in a certain particular way. Since processes are structural in nature, universals are now pulled down from the Platonic realm to become generic features of the ways in which we concretely conduct our cognitive affairs.

The philosophy of mind is another strongpoint of process philosophizing. It feels distinctly uncomfortable to conceptualize people (persons) as things (substances) — oneself above all — because we resist flat-out identification with our bodies. However, there is no problem with experiential access to the processes and patterns of process that characterize us personally — our doings and undergoings, either individually or patterned into talents, skills, capabilities, traits, dispositions, habits, inclinations, and tendencies to action and inaction are, after all, what characteristically define a person as the individual he or she is.

Once we conceptualize the core “self” of a person as a unified manifold of actual and potential process — of action and capacities, tendencies, and dispositions to action (both physical and psychical) — then we thereby secure a concept of personhood that renders the self or ego experientially accessible, seeing that experiencing itself simply consists of such processes. What makes my experience mine is not some peculiar qualitative character that it exhibits but simply its forming part of the overall ongoing process that defines and constitutes my life. The unity of person is a unity of experience — the coalescence of all of one's diverse micro-experience as part of one unified macro-process. (It is the same sort of unity of process that links each minute's level into a single overall journey.) On this basis, the Humean complaint — “One experiences feeling this and doing that, but one never experiences oneself” — is much like the complaint of the person who says “I see him picking up that brick, and mixing that batch of mortar, and troweling that brick into place, but I never see him building a wall.” Even as “building the wall” just exactly is the complex process that is composed of those various activities, so — from the process point of view — one's self just is the complex process composed of those various physical and psychic experiences and actions in their systemic interrelationship.

5. Diversity/Complexity

Like any philosophical tendency — realism, idealism, materialism, etc. — process philosophy is a fundamentally prismatic complex and has internal variations. The difference at issue is rooted in the issue of what type of process is taken as paramount and paradigmatic. Some contributors (especially A. N. Whitehead and Henri Bergson) see organic processes as central and other sorts of processes as modeled on or superengrafted upon them — the conception of an all-integrating physical field being pivotal even for Whitehead's organic/biological reflections. Others (especially William James) based their ideas of process on a psychological model and saw human thought as idealistically paradigmatic. Methodologically, on the other hand, some (e.g. Whitehead) articulated their process philosophy in essentially scientific terms, while others (esp. Bergson) relied more on intuition and indeed an almost mystical sort of sympathetic apprehension. And then too, of course, there are cultural processists like John Dewey. But such differences notwithstanding there are family-resemblance commonalties of theme and emphasis that nevertheless leave the teachings of the several processists in the position of variations on a common approach. So in the end it is — or should be — clear that the unity of process philosophy is not doctrinal but thematic; it is not a consensus or a thesis but rather a mere diffuse matter of type and approach.

Accordingly, process philosophy as such is something rather schematic. There are distinct approaches to implementing its pivotal idea of the pervasiveness and fundamentality of process, ranging from a materialism of physical processes (as with Boscovitch) to a speculative idealism of psychic processes (as in some versions of Indian philosophy). There are rather different ways of being a process philosopher, varying drastically according to the nature of one's ideas regarding what process is all about. In historical perspective, process philosophy has accordingly run a somewhat meandering course that traces back more to the origins of philosophy in the days of Pre-Socratic philosophy.

As such considerations indicate, the process approach has many assets. But it has significant liabilities as well. It is not unfair to the historical situation to say that process philosophy at present remains no more than a glint in the mind's eye of various philosophers. A full-fledged development of the process doctrine simply does not yet exist as an accomplished fact, its development to the point where it can be compared with other major philosophical projects like materialism or absolute idealism still remains to be realized.

The process approach has been a particularly important development in and for American philosophy — especially owing to its increasingly close linkage to pragmatism in such thinkers as Peirce, James, and Dewey. In recent decades the great majority of its principal exponents have done their philosophical work in the United States, and it is here that interest in this approach to philosophy has been the most intense and extensive, constituting a considerable sub-sector within American philosophy at large. Like American philosophy in general, process philosophy is too complex and diversified an enterprise to be captured or even dominated by any one school of thought; it is a highly diversified manifold that encompasses tendencies of thought representing a wide variety of sources.

Regrettably, authors of histories and surveys not infrequently fail to give process philosophy the recognition that is its due. For example, the otherwise excellent survey of American philosophy by the able French scholar Gerard Deledalle omits all mention of process philosophy as such and takes only perfunctory notice of Whitehead in an Appendix. To take this line is not, perhaps, to give us Hamlet without the ghost, but is at least tantamount to omitting Horatio.

6. Strawson's Critique

P. F. Strawson has argued in his influential book on metaphysics that processism in all its versions is doomed to failure because physical objects — and, in particular, material bodies — are requisites for the idea of identifiable particulars in a way that is virtually indispensable to any viable metaphysical position. Strawson maintains that the identification of particulars in communication between speakers and hearers (“referential identification” as he terms it) necessarily requires reference to things possessed of material bodies, so that “we find that material bodies play a unique and fundamental role in particular identification” (ibid., p. 56). As he sees it, processes will not do as basis for particular identification because: “If one had to give the spatial dimensions of such a process, say, [as] a death or a battle, one could only have the outline of the dying man or indicate the extent of the ground the battle was fought over” (ibid., p. 57). Strawson accordingly holds that material bodies are a necessary precondition for any setting in which objective knowledge of particulars is to be possible.

In brief outline, Strawson's argument runs essentially as follows:

  1. For objective and identifiable particulars to be knowable, some items must be (1) distinguishable from other co-existents, and (2) reidentifiable over time.
  2. These conditions (viz. distinguishability and reidentifiability) can only be met by material objects (i.e. particulars with material bodies).

If this line of reasoning is indeed correct, processism is untenable in metaphysics. For it is perfectly clear that any viable metaphysic must have room for identifiable particulars, and if these are to be had only on the basis of a material-object substantialism then process metaphysics is a lost cause.

This argumentation, however, has its problems. To begin with, Strawson would have been well advised to add yet a third item, viz. (3) that individuals must not only be distinguishable and reidentifiable by a particular knower, but interpersonally and intersubjectively distinguishable and reidentifiable throughout a community of knowers. Yet even with premiss 1 strengthened in this way, premiss 2 does not hold water.

Strawson maintained that:

The only objects which can constitute [the space-time framework essential to interpersonal communication] are those which confer upon it their own fundamental characteristics. That is to say they must be three dimensional objects with some endurance through time … They must collectively have enough diversity, richness, stability, and endurance to make possible just that conception of a single unitary [space-time] framework which we possess. [Page 39]

The process philosopher will have no quarrel with any of this. However, Strawson then proceeded straightaway to draw a deeply problematic conclusion:

Of the categories of object which we recognize, only those satisfy these requirements which are, or possess, material bodies — in the broad sense of the expression. Hence given a certain general feature of the [space-time committed] conceptual scheme which we possess, and given the character of available major categories, things which are, or possess, material bodies must be [epistemologically] basic particulars.

To its decisive detriment, Strawson's argument simply begs the question here. For all of the features that his analysis require (spatiotemporal stability and endurance, diversity, richness, interpersonal accountability, and the like) are possessed every bit as much by physical processes as by the things that “are or possess material bodies.” It is not material substances (things) that can be distinguished and reidentified within nature's spatiotemporal framework, but occurrence-contexts (processes) as well. Processes are physically realized without being literally embodied. And the one is no less confrontable and capable of ostensive indication than the other (“that lion”; “that yawning”). Only by an act of deeply problematic fiat is Strawson able — even within the restricted confines of his own analysis — to advantage and prioritize material bodies over physical processes. Even Strawson's insistence that epistemically basic particulars must be identifiable by ostension holds every bit as much for instances of physical process as for particular constrained material bodies. (Indeed, as we shall see, it is theoretically possible to reconceptualize material bodies as complexes of physical processes, while the reverse — the general reconceptualization of physical processes as complexes of material objects — is just not all that plausible (the “Reism” or “Concretism” of Kotarbiński and of the later Brentano notwithstanding).)

Strawson's reasoning sets out from the quite appropriate Kantian observation that objective distinguishably and reidentifiability requires the machinery of a spatiotemporal matrix for the emplacement of our experiential encounters with objects in a unified all-encompassing framework of coordination viz. space-time. But at this point his reasoning goes astray. For as he sees it, a spatiotemporal framework demands — and can only be determined in terms of — ordering relations among material objects. But there are in fact other physically “embodied” items distinct from material bodies that can serve this function equally well — to wit, processes. For as long as processes have both position and duration — as long as like a flame (rather than a sound) or a wedding ceremony (rather than something more ethical like a divorcement) — there are items that have a sufficiently definite place and a sufficiently long lifespan to serve as coordinate markers. Processes too, in sum, can serve to define and constitute the required spatio-temporal framework.

Strawson's position is plausible only because he accepts the question-begging Process Reducibility Thesis that insists on seeing all processes in terms of the activities of things (substances). From this standpoint, all processes are owned and we are to look at them from a specifically genitive point of view: the death of Caesar, or the great clash of the armies of Napoleon and Tsar Alexander I at Borodino. But this of-indicated object-correlativity (of that person, of these two armies) takes too narrow a view of the matter. It reflects only the particular (i.e. owned) sort of processes at issue, and not their processuality as such. Where processes are more basically concerned, their object-correlativity can disappear from view.

The point is that while we can indication-identify various concrete processes genitively — as per “this birth” = “the birth of Julius Ceasar” — proceeding in terms of process-type plus substance-correlative possession, we can no less easily in dualism identify them positionally in terms of process-type plus location: “this birth” = “the birth at such-and-such a space-time location.” And of course the referential markers that orient us in space-time need not be substantial (the town center of Greenwich) but can be processual (the pole = the place where the compass needle spins around evenly).

Accordingly, Strawson's argumentation misses its target. It is simply not the case that material objects are the indispensable basis for a framework of knowable particulars. Physical processes of a suitable sort can accomplish this essential task equally well.

7. Processes and Stability

As process ontologists see it, enduring things are never more than patterns of stability in a sea of process. Like a wave pattern in water they are simply pending configurations in a realm of change.

The very idea of a process involves trans-temporal constancies. Water evaporates. That is to say, the evaporation of water is a generic process. It has many instances, occurring alike after rainstorms in 16th century Lima and in 20th century Atlanta. Any and every particular process is always an instantiation of a general pattern. One just simply cannot identify a process that fails to be of a (processual) type and which, in consequence, is not — at that level of abstraction — capable of repetition. And so the concreta of history, viewed in an epistemic perspective, can in fact manage to transcend their space-time settings to instantiate general patterns. Although their manifestations are inevitably temporal and concrete, those processes themselves can be atemporal and generic.

And of course different concrete instances of a process can produce products of exactly the same generic type. Different factories can and often do produce the same model of car, different cooks can and do produce the same variety of soup. And this is strikingly so when the product happens to be information: different presses can print the same text, different respondents can give the same answer to the same question, different mouths can utter the same sentence, different minds can entertain the same idea.

The point is that in the realm of informational abstractness products can escape the limitations of their (invariably relativized) productive origins. The historical relativization of the production process to a particular historico-cultural context — the fact that the thinking or the assertion of a truth is so relativized — of itself does nothing to limit the product (the truth that is so thought or asserted) to a historico-cultural context. Once produced, it is generally available — and (insofar as abstract) will be cross-temporally accessible via its exemplifications and manifestations at different times and places.

Some sorts of things exist out of space but not time — one's ownership of a piece of jewelry, for example, or one's right to exercise an option to purchase a tract of land. Other sorts of things exist neither in space nor in time — numbers, facts, and generalized relationships for example. (The Eiffel Tower was erected in Paris in the 19th century, but the fact that Julius Caesar did not realize this is something that has no spatiotemporal emplacement.) And information is like that. The things that information may be about may be spatiotemporal, as will be the speech or writing by which the information is conveyed from one person to another. But the information itself is altogether nonspatiotemporal. It simply lies in the nature of certain sorts of things, information included, not to be located in space and time — to be “abstract.”

Admittedly, when we are viewing something, the only views we can possibly obtain are views from somewhere (and from view-points belonging to us and not to God). But when the viewing is done with the eyes of the mind, and its object is the realm of information rather than the realm of physical reality then what the view is a view of is something ahistorical. For information as such exists outside of history even though our acquiring it is invariably an historical transaction. We must avoid the category mistake of confusing process with product here: of conflating the information that we access with the historical actions and events of our accessing it.

Of course we have no way to get to the abstract (the belief) save via the historical (the believing). But what we achieve (the product) is something of a nature different and status distinct from the mode of its realization (the process). When we engage ourselves in intellectual processes that carry us into the informational domain we impel ourselves from history into an ahistorical sphere. The same idea (the same thought-process, the same belief) is accessible to people at different times and places. Were it not so, communication would be altogether impossible.

The overall situation in matters of abstraction is triadic (to use the term favored by C. S. Peirce). There are: (i) the various and sundry concrete green things; (ii) the abstract property at issue (viz., the property or characteristic of being green); and (iii) the mediative conception or idea of greenness which is the thought-instrumentalility through which that abstract property comes to be imputed to those concrete items that putatively manifest it. The medieval metaphysical dispute between nominalism, conceptualism, and platonism needs to be resolved conjunctively: all three are needed: a nominalism is required for concrete particulars, a conceptualism for particular-applicative concepts, and a platonism for abstractions (e.g., in prime mathematics). The situation is not one of either/or; we must endorse all those doctrinal positions — each in its own place.

Yet how can temporalized thought deal in timeless information? How is it that particularized episodic thought can make episode-abstractive generalizations? The long and short of it is that that's just how thought works. To puzzle about this is like puzzling about any of the world's brute facts. And once those realities are taken in stride the problem has been left behind. One might as well ask “How is it that money can be used to buy things? or that words can be used for speaking?” No matter how much we may wonder at the phenomena we have to accept them as part of the world's realities.

There indeed are fundamental problems that lie in the background here: how standardized exchange is possible or how verbal communication is possible. But once such fundamental background issues are resolved, the original question is dissolved as such: something that is not a medium of exchange would not be called money, nor would something that could not play a generalized role in verbal or written communication be called a word. Even so something would not be called thought if it could not function abstractly to convey general information transcending the episodic occurrences at issue.

8. Quantum Issues

As Whitehead's own reaction shows, the rise of the quantum theory put money in process philosopher's bank account. The classical conception of an atom was predicated on the principle that “by definition, atoms cannot be cut up or broken into smaller parts,” so that “atom-splitting” was, from the traditional point of view, simply a contradiction in terms. Here the demise of classical atomism brought on by the dematerialization of physical matter in the wake of the quantum theory did much to bring aid and comfort to a process-oriented metaphysics. For quantum theory taught that, at the microlevel, what was usually deemed a physical thing, a stably perduring object, is itself no more than a statistical pattern — a stability wave in a surging sea of process. Those so-called enduring “things” come about through the emergence of stabilities in statistical fluctuations.

The quantum view of the world is inherently probabilistic — indeed it has trouble coming to terms with concrete definiteness (with the “collapse of the wave packet” problem). And this too is congenial to processists, seeing that process philosophy rejects a pervasive determinism of law-compulsion. Processists see the laws of nature as imposed from below rather than above — as servants rather than masters of the world's existents.

Twentieth century physics has thus turned the tables on classical atomism. Instead of very small things (atoms) combining to produce standard processes (windstorms and such), modern physics envisions very small processes (quantum phenomena) combining in their modus operandi to produce standard things (ordinary macro-objects). The quantum view of reality has accordingly led to the unravelling of that classical atomism that has, from the start, been paradigmatic for substance metaphysics.

Process metaphysics envisions a limit to determinism that makes room for creative spontaneity and novelty in the world (be it by way of random mutations with naturalistic processists or purposeful innovation with those who incline to a theologically teleological position).

Moreover, process philosophers have reason to favor quantum physics over relativistic physics. For relativity sees space time as a block that encompasses all real events concurrently, leaving the time differentiation of earlier-later to be supplied from the subjective resources of observers relative to their own mode of emplacement within the grand scheme of things. Special relativity with its preoccupation with time-invariant relationships in effect suppresses time as a factor in physical reality and relegates it to the penumbral status of a subjective phenomenon. This serves to explain why Whitehead sought to provide a new theoretical basis to relativity theory and reconstrue space-time, as well as the conception of other physical objects, as being a construction made from “fragmentary individual experiences.” Processes are not the machinations of stable things; things are the stability-patterns of variable processes. All such perspectives of modern physics at the level of fundamentals dovetail smoothly into the process approach.

9. Process Theology

The God of scholastic Christian theology, like the deity of Aristotle on whose model this conception was in part based, is an immaterial individual, located outside of time — entirely external to the realm of change and process. By contrast, process theologians, however much they may disagree on other matters, take the radical (but surely not heretical) step of according God an active role also within the natural world's spatio-temporal frame. They envision a foothold for God within the overall processual order of the reality that is supposed to be his creation. After all, active participation in the world's processual commerce need not necessarily make God into a physical or material object. (While the world indeed contains various physical processes like the evolution of galaxies, it also contains immaterial processes such as the diffusion of knowledge or the emergence of order.)

For process theology, then, God does not constitute part of the world's making of physical processes, but nevertheless in some fashion or other participates in it. Clearly no ready analogy-model for this mode of participation (spectator, witness, judge, etc.) can begin to do full justice to the situation. But what matters first and foremost to the angle of process theology is the fact that God and his world are processually inter-connected — the issue of the manner how is something secondary that can be left open for further reflection. So conceived, God is not exactly of the world of physical reality, but does indeed participate in it processually — everywhere touching, affecting, and informing its operations. Thus while not emplaced in the world, the processists' God is nevertheless bound up with it in an experiential process of interaction with it. In general, process theists do not believe that God actually controls the world. The process God makes an impact persuasively, influencing but never unilaterally imposing the world's process.

Process theology accordingly invites us to think of God's relationship to the world in terms of a process of influence like “the spread of Greek learning in medieval Islam.” Greek learning did not become literally internal to the Islamic world, but exerted a substantial and extensive influence upon and within it. Analogously, God is not of the world but exerts and extends an all-pervasive influence upon and within it. After all, processes need not themselves be spatial to have an impact upon things in space (think of a price inflation on the economy of a country.) The idea of process provides a category for conceptualizing God's relation to the world that averts many of the difficulties and perplexities of the traditional substance paradigm.

Even apart from process philosophy, various influential theologians have in recent years urged the necessity and desirability of seeing God not through the lens of unchanging stability but with reference to movement, change, development, and process. But, the process theorists among theologians want to go beyond this. For them, God is not only to be related to the world's processes in a productive manner, but must himself be regarded in terms of process — as encompassing processuality as a salient aspect of the divine nature.

To be sure, process theologians differ among themselves in various matters of emphasis. Whitehead sees God in cosmological terms as an “actual occasion” functioning within nature, reflective of “the eternal urge of desire” that works “strongly and quietly by love,” to guide the course of things within the world into “the creative advance into novelty.” For Hartshorne, by contrast, God is less an active force within the world's processual commerce than an intelligent being or mind that interacts with it. His God is less a force of some sort than a personal being who interacts with the other mind-endowed agents through personal contact and love. Hartshorne wants neither to separate God from the world too sharply nor yet to have him be pantheistically immanent in nature. He views God as an intelligent world-separated being who participates experientially in everything that occurs in nature and resonates with it in experiential participation.

Such differences of approach, however, are only of secondary importance. The crucial fact is that the stratagem of conceiving of God in terms of a process that is at work in and beyond the world makes it possible to overcome a whole host of substance-geared difficulties at one blow. For it now becomes far easier to understand how God can be and be operative. To be sure, the processual view of God involves a recourse to processes of a very special kind. But extraordinary (or even supra-natural) processes pose far fewer difficulties than extraordinary (let alone supra-natural) substances, seeing that process is an inherently more flexible conception. After all, many sorts of processes are in their own way unique — or, at any rate, radically different from all others. Clearly, processes like the creation of a world or the inauguration of its lawful order are by their very nature bound to be unusual, but much the same can be said of any particular type of process. Moreover, through its recourse to the idea of a mega-process that embraces and encompasses a variety of subordinate processes, process theology is able to provide a conceptual rationale for reconciling the idea of an all-pervasive and omnitemporal mode of reality with that of a manifold of finitely temporalized constituents.

The processist view of nature as a spatiotemporal whole constituting one vast, all-embracing cosmic process unfolding under the directive aegis of a benign intelligence is in various ways in harmony with the Judeo-Christian view of things. For this tradition has always seen God as active within the historical process which, in consequence, represents not only a causal but also a purposive order. After all, the only sort of God who can have meaning and significance for us is one who stands in some active interrelationship with ourselves and our world. (Think here of the Nicene creed's phraseology: “the maker of all things … who for us men and for our salvation …”.) But of course such an “active interrelationship” is a matter of the processes that constitute the participation and entry of the divine into the world's scheme of things — and conversely.

And of course not only is it feasible and potentially constructive for the relation of God to the world and its creatures to be conceived of in terms of processes, but it is so also with the relationship of people to God. Here too process theology sees such a relationship as thoroughly processual because it rests on a potentially interactive communion established in contemplation, worship, prayer, etc.

In particular, for processists there is little difficulty in conceiving God as a person. For once we have an account of personhood in general in process terms as a systemic complex of characteristic activities, it is no longer all that strange to see God in these terms as well. If we processify the human person, then we can more readily conceive of the divine person as the focal source of a creative intelligence that engenders and sustains the world and endows it with law, beauty (harmony and order), value and meaning.

Then too there is the problem of the Trinity with its mystery of fitting three persons into one being or substance, which has always been a stumbling block for the substantialism of the Church Fathers. A process approach makes it possible to bypass this perplexity. For processes can interact and interpenetrate one another. With the laying of a single branch a woodsman can be building a wall, erecting a house, and extending a village. One act, many processes; one mode of activity many sorts of agency.

For process theology, then, God is active in relation to the world, and the world's people can and should be active in relation to God. People's relationship to the divine is a two-way street, providing for a benevolent God's care for the world's creatures and allowing those intelligent beings capable of realizing this to establish contact with God through prayer, worship, and spiritual communion. Process theology accordingly contemplates a wider realm of processes that embrace both the natural and the spiritual realms and interconnect God with the vast community of worshippers in one communal state of macroprocess that encompasses and gives embodiment to such a comprehensive whole.

To be sure, process theologians usually see the divine as one power among others and view God's role in relation to the world as rather diffused and indirect and limited. But this seems to be more because a novel perspective appeals to those of theologically liberal and unorthodox orientation than to the inherent demands of a process appraisal. In theory a process theology could take a more theologically conservative form than has been the case.

10. A Question of Legitimacy

From the days of the Pyrrhonian sceptics of antiquity we are told again and again throughout the history of philosophy that speculative systematization is inappropriate — that such knowledge as we humans can actually obtain is limited to the realm of everyday life and/or its precisification through science. Repeated in every era, this stricture is also rejected by many within each. The impetus for big-picture understanding, for a coherent, and panoramic view of things that puts the variegated bits and pieces together, represents an irrepressible demand of the human intellect as a possession of “the rational animal.” And process metaphysics affords one of the most promising and serious options for accommodating this demand.

11. Institutionalization

Process thought constitutes one (albeit only one) very prominent sector of the active philosophical scene in the USA at the present time. Apart from the proliferation of books and articles on the topic, it has achieved considerable institutionalization during the years after World War II. Indications of this phenomenon include the formation of the Society for Process Studies, as well as the prominence of process philosophizing within the aegis of the Society for American Philosophy and the American Metaphysical Society. Another clear token is the journal Process Studies, Published by the Center for Process Studies in Claremont CA, and founded in 1971 by Lewis S. Ford and John B. Cobb, Jr., a publication that has in recent years become a major vehicle for article-length discussions in the field. Representatives of process philosophy occupy influential posts in departments of philosophy and of religious studies in many of American universities and colleges, and some half-dozen doctoral dissertations are produced annually in this field. In 2002 the publishing house Ontos in Frankfurt, Germany launched a book series on “Process Thought.” American philosophy is at this historic juncture an agglomeration of different cottage industries, and process philosophy is prominent among them.

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causation: causal processes | evolution | God: concepts of | Hartshorne, Charles | process theism | Whitehead, Alfred North