## Notes to Platonism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

1. Does platonism
directly *contradict* physicalism? The answer will depend on
how physicalism is defined. If physicalism is defined as the view that
everything supervenes on the physical, and if all mathematical truths
are necessary, then the two views will be formally consistent. For
assuming S5, any two worlds are alike with respect to necessary
truths. Thus *a fortiori*, any two worlds that are alike with
respect to physical truths are also alike with respect to mathematical
truths. But this is a standard definition of the claim that
mathematical truths supervene on the physical. If on the other hand
physicalism is defined as the view that all entities are composed of,
or constituted by, fundamental physical entities, then the two views
will contradict each other. (See the entry on
physicalism.)

2. For instance, there is wide-spread agreement among mathematicians about the guiding problems of their field and about the kinds of methods that are permissible when attempting to solve these problems. Moreover, using these methods, mathematicians have made, and continue to make, great progress towards solving these guiding problems.

3. However, the philosophical analysis itself could be challenged. For this analysis goes beyond mathematics proper and does therefore not automatically inherit its strong scientific credentials.

4. However, it is not easy
to understand what this dependence or constitution amounts to. More
recent forms of intuitionism are often given an alternative
development in the form of a non-classical semantics for the language
of mathematics. Semantic theories of this sort seek to replace the
classical notion of truth with the epistemologically more tractable
notion of proof. Where classical platonism says that a mathematical
sentence *S* is true just in case the objects that *S*
talks about have the properties that *S* ascribes to them, the
present form of intuitionism says that *S* is true (in some
suitably lightweight sense) just in case *S* is provable. See
Wright 1992 and Dummett 1991b.

5. To highlight the contrast with truth-value realism, platonism and anti-nominalism are sometimes referred to as forms of ‘object realism’. This is not a term that I will use here.

6. One example is the
“modal structuralism” of Hellman 1989,
where an arithmetical sentence *A* is analyzed as
☐∀*X*∀*f*∀*x*[PA^{2}(*X*/ℕ,
*f*/*s*,
*x*/0)*A*(*X*/ℕ, *f*/*s*,
*x*/0)], where PA^{2} is the conjunction of the axioms
of second-order Peano Arithmetic.

7. This is the point
of *Kreisel's dictum*, which makes many appearances in the
writings of Michael Dummett, for instance:

As Kreisel remarked in a review of Wittgenstein, “the problem is not the existence of mathematical objects but the objectivity of mathematical statements”. (Dummett 1978b, p. xxxviii)

See also Dummett 1981, p. 508. The remark of Kreisel's to which Dummett is alluding appears to be Kreisel 1958, p. 138, fn. 1 (which, if so, is rather less memorable than Dummett's paraphrase). For another example of the view that truth-value realism is more important than platonism, see Isaacson 1994, and Gaifman 1975 for a related view.

8. See Hilbert 1996, p. 1102. Famously, one of the problems Hilbert sets is the Continuum Hypothesis. For this problem to be “solvable”, the Continuum Hypothesis must have an objective truth-value despite being independent of standard ZFC set theory.

9. Note that this step uses
the parenthetical precisification in **Truth**. Without this
precisification, it would be possible for most sentences accepted as
mathematical theorems to be true and all sentences of the form
mentioned in the text to be false.

10. There is a related argument which stands to object-directed intentional acts the way the Fregean argument stands to sentences or propositions. (See Gödel 1964 and Parsons 1980.)

(2) People have intuitions as of mathematical objects.

(3) These intuitions are veridical.

These premises entail **Existence** as well: for an intuition can
only be veridical when its intentional object exists. I will
concentrate on the original Fregean argument as this seems more
tractable. For it is easier to assess whether a mathematical sentence
is true than whether a mathematical intuition is veridical.

11. An epistemic holist will claim that evidence for or against a linguistic analysis can in principle come from anywhere. I need not deny this claim. My point is simply that the hypothesis in question belongs to empirical linguistics and has to be assessed as such.

12. Two differences between Benacerraf's and Field's arguments deserve mention. Firstly, Field's argument is carefully formulated so as to avoid any appeal to problematic causal theories of knowledge. Secondly, unlike Field, Benacerraf does not regard his argument as an objection to mathematical platonism but rather as a dilemma. One desideratum in the philosophy of mathematics is a unified semantics for mathematical and non-mathematical language. Another desideratum is a plausible epistemology of mathematics. If we accept mathematical platonism, we satisfy the first desideratum but not the second. If on the other hand we reject mathematical platonism, we satisfy the second desideratum but not the first.

13. Even if Premise 3 turns out to be defensible, it may no longer be so when ‘anti-nominalism’ is substituted for ‘mathematical platonism’. The discussion in Section 5.2 provides some reason to doubt this modified version of Premise 3. See also Linnebo 2006, Section 5.

14. The
*transitive closure* of a relation *R* is the smallest
transitive relation *S* which contains *R*. The
transitive closure of a relation is sometimes also known as the
ancestral of the relation.