# Newton's *Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica*

*First published Thu Dec 20, 2007*

No work of science has drawn more attention from philosophers than
Newton's *Principia*. The reasons for this, however,
and consequently the focus of the attention have changed significantly
from one century to the next. During the 20^{th} Century
philosophers have viewed the *Principia* in the context of
Einstein's new theory of gravity in his theory of general
relativity. The main issues have concerned the relation between
Newton's and Einstein's theories of gravity and what the
need to replace the former with the latter says about the nature,
scope, and limits of scientific knowledge. During most of the
18^{th} Century, by contrast, Newton's theory of gravity
remained under dispute, especially because of the absence of a
mechanism — in particular, a contact mechanism — producing
gravitational forces. The philosophic literature correspondingly
endeavored to clarify and to resolve, one way or the other, the dispute
over whether the *Principia* should or should not be viewed as
methodologically well founded. By the 1790s Newton's theory
of gravity had become established among those engaged in research in
orbital mechanics and physical geodesy, leading to the
*Principia* becoming *the* exemplar of science at its
most successful. Philosophic interest in the *Principia*
during the 19^{th} Century therefore came to focus on how
Newton had achieved this success, in part to characterize the knowledge
that had been achieved and in part to pursue comparable knowledge in
other areas of research. Unfortunately, a very large fraction of
the philosophic literature in all three centuries has suffered from a
quite simplistic picture of the *Principia* itself. The
main goal of this entry is to replace that simplistic picture with one
that does more justice to the richness of both the content and the
methodology of the *Principia*.

- 1. Overview: The Importance of the Work
- 2. The Historical Context of the
*Principia* - 3. The Three Editions of the
*Principia* - 4. “Definitions” and absolute space, time, and motion
- 5. Newton's Laws of Motion
- 6. Book 1 of the
*Principia* - 7. Book 2 of the
*Principia* - 8. Book 3 of the
*Principia* - 9. The Scientific Achievement of the
*Principia* - 10. The Methodology of the
*Principia* - Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Overview: The Importance of the Work

Viewed retrospectively, no work was more seminal in the development
of modern physics and astronomy than Newton's
*Principia*. Its conclusion that the force retaining the
planets in their orbits is one in kind with terrestrial gravity ended
forever the view dating back at least to Aristotle that the celestial
realm calls for one science and the sublunar realm, another. Just
as the Preface to its first edition had proposed, the ultimate success
of Newton's theory of gravity made the identification of the
fundamental forces of nature and their characterization in laws the
primary pursuit of physics. The success of the theory led as well
to a new conception of exact science under which *every*
systematic discrepancy between observation and theory, no matter how
small, is taken as telling us something important about the
world. And, once it became clear that the theory of gravity
provided a far more effective means than observation for precisely
characterizing complex orbital motions — just as Newton had proposed
in the *Principia* in the case of the orbit of the Moon —
physical theory gained primacy over observation for purposes of
answering specific questions about the world.

The retrospective view of the *Principia* has been
different in the aftermath of Einstein's special and general theories
of relativity from what it was throughout the nineteenth century.
Newtonian theory is now seen to hold only to high approximation in
limited circumstances in much the way that Galileo's and Huygens's
results for motion under uniform gravity came to be seen as holding
only to high approximation in the aftermath of Newtonian inverse-square
gravity. In the middle of the nineteenth century, however, when
there was no reason to think that any confuting discrepancy between
Newtonian theory and observation was ever going to emerge, the
*Principia* was viewed as the exemplar of perfection in
empirical science in much the way that Euclid's *Elements* had
been viewed as the exemplar of perfection in mathematics at the
beginning of the seventeenth century. Because of the extent to
which Einsteinian theory was grounded historically on Newtonian
science, the *Principia* has retained its unique seminal
position in the history of physics in our post-Newtonian era.
Perhaps more strikingly, because of the logical relationship between
Newtonian and Einsteinian theory — Einstein showed that Newtonian
gravity holds as a limit-case of general relativity in just the way
Newton showed (in Book 1, Section 10) that Galilean uniform gravity
holds as a limit-case of inverse-square gravity — even though the
*Principia* can no longer be regarded as an exemplar of
perfection, it is still widely regarded by physicists as an exemplar of
empirical science at its best.

In spite of extravagant claims made about the *Principia* by
some in the years after it first appeared — “… he seems to have
exhausted his Argument, and left little to be done by those that shall
succeed
him”^{[1]}
—
the most positive view of it that anyone could have substantiated
during the first half of the eighteenth century would have emphasized
its promise more than its achievements. The theory of gravity had
too many loose ends, the most glaring of which was a factor of 2
discrepancy in the mean motion of the lunar apogee, a discrepancy that
undercut the claim that the Moon is held in orbit by an inverse-square
force. No one knew these loose ends better than Newton himself,
yet no one had a greater sense of the potential of the theory of
gravity to resolve a whole host of questions in planetary astronomy —
which may well explain why he made these loose ends difficult to see
except by the most technically skilled, careful readers. Between
the late 1730s and the early 1750s the situation changed dramatically
when several of the loose ends were tied up, in some cases yielding
such extraordinary results as the first truly successful descriptive
account of the motion of the Moon in the history of astronomy.
During the second half of the eighteenth century the promise of the
*Principia* was not only universally recognized by those active
in empirical research, but a large fraction of this promise was
realized. What we now call “Newtonian mechanics” emerged in this
process, as did the gravity-based accounts of the often substantial
divergences of the planets from Keplerian motion, the achievement of
Newton's theory of gravity that ultimately ended all opposition to
it.

During the eighteenth century the *Principia* was also seen as
putting forward a world view directly in opposition to the broadly
Cartesian world view that in many circles had taken over from the
Scholastic world view during the second half of the seventeenth
century. Newton clearly intended the work to be viewed in this
way when in 1686 he changed its title to *Philosophiae Naturalis
Principia Mathematica*, in allusion to Descartes's most prominent
work at the time, *Principia Philosophiae*. (The title
page of Newton's first edition underscored this allusion by placing the
first and third words of the title in larger type.) The main
difference in the world view in Newton's *Principia* was to rid
the celestial spaces of vortices carrying the planets. Newtonians
subsequently went beyond Newton in enhancing this world view in various
ways, including forces everywhere expressly acting at a distance.
The “clockwork universe” aspect of the Newtonian world view, for
example, is not to be found in the *Principia*; it was added by
Laplace late in the eighteenth century, after the success of the theory
of gravity in accounting for complex deviations from Keplerian motion
became fully evident.

In addition to viewing the theory of gravity as potentially
transforming orbital astronomy, Newton saw the *Principia* as
illustrating a new way of doing natural philosophy. One aspect of
this new way, announced in the Preface to the first edition, was the
focus on forces:

For the whole difficulty of philosophy seems to be to discover the forces of nature from the phenomena of motions and then to demonstrate the other phenomena from these forces. It is to these ends that the general propositions in books 1 and 2 are directed, while in book 3 our explication of the system of the world illustrates these propositions. For in book 3, by means of propositions demonstrated mathematically in books 1 and 2, we derive from celestial phenomena the gravitational forces by which bodies tend toward the sun and toward the individual planets. Then the motions of the planets, the comets, the moon, and the sea are deduced from these forces by propositions that are also mathematical. If only we could derive the other phenomena of nature from mechanical principles by the same kind of reasoning! For many things lead me to have a suspicion that all phenomena may depend on certain forces by which particles of bodies, by causes not yet known, either are impelled toward one another and cohere in regular figures, or are repelled from one another and recede. Since these forces are unknown, philosophers have hitherto made trial of nature in vain. But I hope that the principles set down here will shed some light on either this mode of philosophizing or some truer one. [P, 382]^{[2]}

A second aspect of the new method concerns the use of mathematical theory not to derive testable conclusions from hypotheses, as Galileo and Huygens had done, but to cover a full range of alternative theoretical possibilities, enabling the empirical world then to select among them. This new approach is spelled out most forcefully at the end of Book 1, Section 11:

I use the word “attraction” here in a general sense for any endeavor whatever of bodies to approach one another, whether that endeavor occurs as a result of the action of the bodies either drawn toward one another or acting on one another by means of spirits emitted or whether it arises from the action of ether or of air or of any medium whatsoever — whether corporeal or incorporeal — in any way impelling toward one another the bodies floating therein. I use the word “impulse” in the same general sense, considering in this treatise not the species of forces and their physical qualities but their quantities and mathematical proportions, as I have explained in the definitions. Mathematics requires an investigation of those quantities of forces and their proportions that follow from any conditions that may be supposed. Then, coming down to physics, these proportions must be compared with the phenomena, so that it may be found out which conditions of forces apply to each kind of attracting bodies. And then, finally, it will be possible to argue more securely concerning the physical species, physical causes, and physical proportions of these forces. [P, 588]

A third aspect of the new method, which proved most controversial at the time, was the willingness to hold questions about the mechanism through which forces effect their changes in motion in abeyance, even when the mathematical theory of the species and proportions of the forces seemed to leave no alternative but action at a distance. This aspect remained somewhat tacit in the first edition, but then, in response to criticisms it received, was made polemically explicit in the General Scholium added at the end of the second edition:

I have not as yet been able to deduce from phenomena the reason for these properties of gravity, and I do not feign hypotheses. For whatever is not deduced from the phenomena must be called a hypothesis; and hypotheses, whether metaphysical or physical, or based on occult qualities, or mechanical, have no place in experimental philosophy. In this experimental philosophy, propositions are deduced from the phenomena and are made general by induction. The impenetrability, mobility, and impetus of bodies and the laws of motion and law of gravity have been found by this method. And it is enough that gravity should really exist and should act according to the laws that we have set forth and should suffice for all the motions of the heavenly bodies and of our sea. [P, 943]^{[3]}

During most of the eighteenth century the primary challenge the
*Principia* presented to philosophers revolved around what to
make of a mathematical theory of forces in the absence of a mechanism,
other than action at a distance, through which these forces work. By
the last decades of the century, however, little room remained for
questioning whether gravity does act according to the laws that Newton
had set forth and does suffice for all the motions of the heavenly
bodies and of our sea. No one could deny that a science had emerged
that, at least in certain respects, so far exceeded anything that had
ever gone before that it stood alone as the ultimate exemplar of
science generally. The challenge to philosophers then became one of
spelling out first the precise nature and limits of the knowledge
attained in this science and then how, methodologically, this
extraordinary advance had been achieved, with a view to enabling other
areas of inquiry to follow suit.

## 2. The Historical Context of the *Principia*

The view is commonplace that what Newton did was to put forward his
theory of gravity to explain Kepler's already established “laws” of
orbital motion; and the universality of the law of gravity then ended
up explaining the deviations from Keplerian motion by attributing them
to gravitational interaction of the planets. This is wrong on
several counts, the most immediate of which is that Kepler's “laws”
were by no means established before the *Principia*. The
rules for calculating orbital motion that Kepler put forward in the
first two decades of the seventeenth century had indeed achieved a
spectacular gain in accuracy over anything that had come before.
Kepler's rules, however, did not yield comparable accuracy for the
motion of the Moon, and even in the case of the planets the calculated
locations were sometimes off by as much as a fourth of the width of the
Moon. More importantly, by 1680 several other approaches to
calculating the orbits had been put forward that achieved the same
level of not quite adequate accuracy as Kepler's. In particular,
Newton was familiar with seven different approaches to calculating
planetary orbits, all at roughly the same accuracy. Only two of
these, Kepler's and Jeremiah Horrocks's, used Kepler's area rule —
planets sweep out equal areas in equal times with respect to the Sun —
to locate planets along their trajectories. Ismaël Boulliau
and, following him, Thomas Streete (from whose *Astronomia
Carolina* Newton first learned orbital astronomy) replaced the area
rule with a geometric construction. Vincent Wing had adopted
still another geometric construction in the late 1660s after having
earlier used a point of equal angular motion oscillating about the
empty focus of the ellipse; and Nicolaus Mercator in 1676 added still a
further geometric
construction.^{[4]}
Of these six alternative approaches, only
Horrocks and, following him, Streete, took Kepler's 3/2 power rule —
the periods of the planets vary as the square root of the cube of their
mean distances from the Sun — seriously enough to use the periods
rather than positional observations to determine their
mean
distances.^{[5]}

All these approaches followed Kepler in using an ellipse to represent
the trajectory. (The primary historical reason for this was
Kepler's success in predicting the 1631 transit of Mercury across the
Sun.) This, however, does not mean that the ellipse was
established as anything more than a mathematically tractable close
approximation to the true orbit. In fact, the planetary orbits
known then are not all that elliptical. The minor axis of Mercury
is only 2 percent shorter than the major axis, the minor axis of Mars,
only 0.4 percent shorter, and in all other cases the difference between
an ellipse and an eccentric circle was beyond detection. Newton
had real grounds for claiming in a letter to Halley in June 1686 a
“right” to the ellipse, remarking that “Kepler knew the Orb to be not
circular but oval, and guest it to be Elliptical” [**C**,
II, 436]. Entirely independently, the most judicious reader of the
first edition of the *Principia*, Christiaan Huygens, wrote the
following summary of the *Principia*‘s achievement in his
notebook upon reading the complimentary copy Newton had sent him:

The famous M. Newton has brushed aside all the difficulties together with the Cartesian vortices; he has shown that the planets are retained in their orbits by their gravitation toward the Sun. And that the excentrics necessarily become elliptical. [OH, XXI, 143]

So, all three of Kepler's rules that came to be called “laws” after
the *Principia* were known to be nothing more than holding to
high approximation when Newton started on the project in 1684.
And the leading issue in orbital astronomy at the time was not why
Kepler's rules hold, but rather which, if any, of the comparably
accurate different approaches to calculating orbits was to be
preferred.

The distinct possibility of the ellipse being only an approximation to
the true trajectory explains the appropriateness of the question Hooke
put to Newton in 1679 and Halley put to him again in 1684 — what
trajectory does a body describe when moving under an inverse-square
force directed toward a central body? The inverse-square part of
this question came from combining the mathematical theory of uniform
circular motion, which Huygens had published in his *Horologium
Oscillatorium* of 1673, with Kepler's 3/2 power rule: the force in
a string retaining a body in a uniform circular orbit varies directly
as the radius of the circle and inversely as the square of the period;
but the squares of the periods of the planets vary as the cubes of
their mean distances; and hence, at least to a first approximation, the
forces retaining the planets in their orbits vary inversely with the
square of the radii of their nearly circular orbits. But now
allow the distance of the orbiting body from the center to vary rather
than remaining constant, as in a circle. What trajectory would
result if the force toward the center varies as the inverse-square of
the distance from the center toward which the force is always
directed? The answer in the nine page tract “De Motu Corporum in
Gyrum” that Newton sent to Halley in November 1684 is, an ellipse,
provided the velocity is not too high (and if it is, then instead a
parabola or a hyperbola, depending on the velocity). The key step
in developing this answer is a generalization of uniform circular
motion to the case of motion under a “centripetal” force — a term
Newton coined from Huygens's “centrifugal” force, by which he meant the
tension in the string keeping the body in a circle; and a key to this
step was the discovery that a body moving under any form of centripetal
force always sweeps out equal areas in equal times with respect to that
center, so that the appropriate geometrical representation of time for
generalizing uniform circular motion is area swept out rather than
angle or arc length. The tract also confirms that Kepler's 3/2
power rule continues to hold for bodies orbiting in confocal ellipses
governed by inverse-square centripetal forces.

These were remarkable steps forward at the time, but they and the
questions behind them form only an initial part of the context in which
Newton went on to write the *Principia*. Shortly after the
“De Motu” tract went off to London, Newton revised the tract and added
two further passages. The question precipitating this revision
appears to have been about the effect the inverse-square centripetal
forces directed toward Jupiter, as implied by its satellites, have on
the Sun. Newton first added two principles that he first called
“hypotheses” and then changed to “laws”:

Law 3: The relative motions of bodies enclosed in a given space are the same whether that space is at rest or moves perpetually and uniformly in a straight line without circular motion.

Law 4: The common center of gravity does not alter its state of motion or rest through the mutual actions of bodies. [

U, 267]

The second of the two added passages concerns motion in resisting
media; it provides a context in which to read Book 2 of the
*Principia*.

The first added passage, which has become known as the “Copernican
scholium,” we here quote in full because it, better than anything else,
explains what led Newton into the further research that turned the
nine-page tract into the five hundred page *Principia*. It
occurs as a single long paragraph, but is here broken into three
segments in order to facilitate commenting on it:

Moreover, the whole space of the planetary heavens is either at rest (as is commonly believed) or uniformly moved in a straight line, and similarly the common centre of gravity of the planets (by Law 4) is either at rest or is moved at the same time. In either case the motions of the planets among themselves (by Law 3) take place in the same manner and their common centre of gravity is at rest with respect to the whole space, and so it ought to be considered the immobile center of the whole planetary system. Thence indeed the Copernican system is proved

a priori. For if a common centre of gravity is computed for any position of the planets, this either lies in the body of the Sun or will always be very near it.By reason of this deviation of the Sun from the center of gravity the centripetal force does not always tend to that immobile center, and hence the planets neither move exactly in ellipses nor revolve twice in the same orbit. Each time a planet revolves it traces a fresh orbit, as happens also with the motion of the Moon, and each orbit depends upon the combined motions of all the planets, not to mention their actions upon each other. Unless I am much mistaken, it would exceed the force of human wit to consider so many causes of motion at the same time, and to define the motions by exact laws which would allow of an easy calculation.

Leaving aside these fine points, the simple orbit that is the mean between all vagaries will be the ellipse that I have discussed already. If any one shall attempt to determine this ellipse by trigonometrical computation from three observations (as is usual) he will be proceeding without due caution. For these observations will share in the very small irregular motions here neglected and so cause the ellipse to deviate somewhat from its actual magnitude and position (which ought to be the mean among all errors), and so there will be as many ellipses differing from each other as there are trios of observations employed. Very many observations must therefore be joined together and assigned to a single operation which mutually moderate each other and display the mean ellipse both as regards position and magnitude. [

U, 280]

The first segment highlights a further component of the historical
context in which the *Principia* was written and read.
Galileo's discovery of the phases of Venus in 1613 had provided
decisive evidence against the Ptolemaic
system,^{[6]}
but it could not provide grounds
favoring the Copernican over the Tychonic system. In the latter,
Mercury, Venus, Mars, Jupiter and Saturn circumnavigate the Sun, and
the Sun circumnavigates the Earth, with the consequence that these
seven bodies are at all times in the same position in relation to one
another as they are in the Copernican system. Whether any
decisive empirical grounds could be found favoring the Copernican over
the Tychonic system became one of the most celebrated issues of the
seventeenth century. Kepler, Galileo, and Descartes all published
major books in the first half of the century purporting to resolve
this
issue,^{[7]}
Kepler and
Descartes basing their arguments on the physical mechanism each had
proposed as governing the orbital motion. Nevertheless, the
leading observational astronomer of the second half of the century, G.
D. Cassini, was a Tychonist. In the first segment of the
“Copernican Scholium” Newton identifies the center of gravity of the
planetary system as the appropriate point to which all the motion
should be referred — the technical issue behind the issue over the two
systems — and then announces that the centripetal forces identified in
the text of “De Motu” as governing the orbital motion open the way to
establishing a slightly qualified form of the Copernican
system.^{[8]}
Newton's
discovery of this line of reasoning was surely a major factor urging
him on to the *Principia*.

The second segment of the “Copernican Scholium” addresses an issue in
orbital astronomy that forms a still further component in the
historical context of the *Principia*. Separate from the
question whether Kepler's or some other approach was to be preferred
was the question whether the true motions are significantly more
irregular and complicated than the calculated motions in any of these
approaches. The complexity of the lunar orbit and the continuing
failure to describe it within the accuracy Kepler had achieved for the
planets was one consideration lying behind this question. Another
came from Kepler's own finding, noted in the Preface to his
*Rudolphine Tables*^{[9]}
and subsequently supported by others, that the
true motions may involve further vagaries, as evidenced by apparent
changes in the values of orbital elements over time. The most
important consideration behind this question, however, came from
Descartes' claim that, in keeping with the changing motions of his
vortices over long periods of time, the orbits are not mathematically
perfect and “they are continuously changed by the passing of the ages”
[**D**, 3, 34]. In the second segment of the quoted
Scholium, Newton concludes that, in contrast to the ellipse that
answered the mathematical question put to him by Hooke and Halley, the
true orbits are not ellipses, but are indeed indefinitely
complex. This conclusion is nowhere so forcefully stated in the
published *Principia*, but knowledgeable readers nonetheless saw
the work as answering the question whether the true motions are
mathematically perfect in the negative.

Finally, the second and third segments together not only point out that
Keplerian motion is only an approximation to the true motions, but they
call attention to the potential pitfalls in using the orbits published
by Kepler and others as evidence for claims about the planetary
system. For example, if the true motions are so complicated, then
it is not surprising that all the different calculational approaches
were achieving comparable accuracy, for all of them at best hold only
approximately. Equally, the success in calculating the orbits
could not serve as a basis to argue against Cartesian vortices, for the
irregularities entailed by them could not simply be dismissed.
The spectre raised was the very one Newton had objected to during the
controversy over his earlier light and color papers: too many
hypotheses could be made to fit the same
data.^{[10]}
Worse, the multiplicity
of tenable hypotheses was a spectre haunting mathematical astronomy as
a discipline from the end of the sixteenth century
forward.^{[11]}
So, the
conclusion that calculated orbits can at most be mere approximations
would have been seen as raising the possibility that truth and
exactness were beyond the reach of mathematical astronomy. The
main reason why the *Principia* includes so much beyond the “De
Motu” tract is Newton's endeavor to reach conclusions that had claim to
being exact and true in spite of the inordinate complexities of the
actual motions.

The historical context in which Newton wrote the *Principia*
involved a set of issues that readers of the first edition saw it as
addressing: Was Kepler's approach to calculating the orbits, or some
other, to be preferred? Was there some empirical basis for
resolving the issue of the Copernican versus the Tychonic system?
Were the true motions complicated and irregular versus the calculated
motions? Can mathematical astronomy be an exact science? No
reader of the *Principia* at the time had the benefit of seeing
how Newton had these questions tied together in the “Copernican
Scholium” because it did not appear in print until two hundred
years
later.^{[12]}
Nothing, however, brings out more clearly the extent to which the
expanded scope of the *Principia* stemmed from Newton's
preoccupation with the problem of reaching conclusions that had claim
to being exact from evidence that, by his reckoning, held at best to
high approximation. This is why the “Copernican scholium”
provides the most illuminating context for reading the
*Principia*. Equally, its being unknown for so long helps
to explain why the *Principia* has generally been read so
simplistically.

## 3. The Three Editions of the *Principia*^{[13]}

Newton originally planned a two-book work, with the first book
consisting of propositions mathematically derived from the laws of
motion, including a handful concerning motion under resistance forces,
and the second book, written and even formatted in the manner of
Descartes's *Principia*, applying these propositions to lay out
the system of the world. By the middle of 1686 Newton had
switched to a three-book structure, with the second book devoted to
motion in resisting media. What appears to have convinced him
that this topic required a separate book was the promise of
pendulum-decay experiments to allow him to measure the variation of
resistance forces with
velocity.^{[14]}
When Hooke raised a priority issue on
inverse-square forces, Newton dropped the original version of the last
book, switching to presenting the system of the world in a sequence of
mathematically argued propositions, many of which demand far more of
the reader than anything in the original version. The original
“System of the World” did appear in print the year after Newton died.
No complete text for the original version of Book 1 has ever been
found.

Newton was disappointed in the critical response to the first
edition. The response in England was adulatory, but the failure
to note loose ends must have led Newton to doubt how much anyone had
mastered technical details. The leading scientific figure on the
Continent, Christiaan Huygens, offered a mixed response to the book in
his *Discourse on the Cause of Gravity* (1690). On the one
hand, he was convinced by Newton's argument that inverse-square
terrestrial gravity not only extends to the Moon, but is one in kind
with the centripetal force holding the planets in orbit; on the other
hand,

I am not especially in agreement with a Principle that he supposes in this calculation and others, namely, that all the small parts that we can imagine in two or more different bodies attract one another or tend to approach each other mutually. This I could not concede, because I believe I see clearly that the cause of such an attraction is not explicable either by any principle of Mechanics or by the laws of motion. Nor am I at all persuaded of the necessity of the mutual attraction of whole bodies, having shown that, were there no Earth, bodies would not cease to tend toward a center because of what we call their gravity. [HD, p.159]

Others on the Continent pressed this complaint even more
forcefully. The response that may well have bothered Newton most
was the review in *Journal des Sçavants*:

The work of M. Newton is a mechanics, the most perfect that one could imagine, as it is not possible to make demonstrations more precise or more exact than those he gives in the first two books…. But one has to confess that one cannot regard these demonstrations otherwise than as only mechanical; indeed the author recognizes himself at the end of page four and the beginning of page five that he has not considered their Principles as a Physicist, but as a mere Geometer….

In order to make an

opusas perfect as possible, M. Newton has only to give us a Physics as exact as his Mechanics. He will give it when he substitutes true motions for those that he has supposed.^{[15]}

Complicating the matter further was the publication in 1689 of
Leibniz's “Essay on the causes of celestial motions,” which offered a
vortex theory in which “*a planet moves with a double motion
composed of the harmonic circulation of its fluid deferent orb, and the
paracentric motion*, as if it had a certain gravity of attraction,
namely an impulsion *towards the Sun*” [**L**,
132].^{[16]}
Leibniz further concluded that when the body “*is carried in an
ellipse* (or another conic section) *with a harmonic
circulation, and the centre both of attraction and of circulation is at
the focus of the ellipse, then the attractions or solicitations of
gravity will be directly as the squares of the circulations, or
inversely as the squares of the radii or distances from the focus*”
[**L**, 137]. So, within a year and a half of the
publication of the *Principia* a competing vortex theory of
Keplerian motion had appeared that was consistent with Newton's
conclusion that the centripetal forces in Keplerian motion are
inverse-square. This gave Newton reason to sharpen the argument
in the *Principia* against vortices.

The second edition appeared in 1713, twenty six years after the
first. It had five substantive changes of note. First, the
structure of the argument for universal gravity at the beginning of
Book 3 was made more evident, and the word ‘hypothesis’ was dropped
from it. Second, because of disappointment with pendulum-decay
experiments and an erroneous claim about the rate a liquid flows
vertically through a hole in the bottom of a container, the second half
of Section 7 of Book 2 was entirely replaced, ending with new
vertical-fall experiments to measure resistance forces versus velocity
and a forcefully stated rejection of all vortex
theories.^{[17]}
Third,
the treatment of the variation of surface gravity with latitude (Book
3, Proposition 20) was significantly extended, partly in response to
Huygens's alternative treatment of this variation, but also because of
more recent data from near the Equator. Fourth, the treatment of
the wobble of the Earth producing the precession of the equinoxes was
revised in order to accommodate a much reduced gravitational force of
the Moon on the Earth than in the first edition. Fifth, several
further examples of comets were added at the end of Book 3, taking
advantage of Halley's efforts on the topic during the intervening
years. In addition to these, two changes were made that were more
polemical than substantive: Newton added the General Scholium following
Book 3 in the second edition, and his editor Roger Cotes provided a
long anti-Cartesian (and anti-Leibnizian) Preface.

The third edition appeared in 1726, thirty nine years after the first. Most changes in it involved either refinements or new data. The most significant revision of substance was to the variation of surface gravity with latitude, where Newton now concluded that the data showed that the Earth has a uniform density. Subsequent editions and translations have been based on the third edition. Of particular note is the edition published by two Jesuits, Le Seur and Jacquier, in 1739-42, for it contains proposition-by-proposition commentary, much of it employing the Leibnizian calculus, that extends to roughly the same length as Newton's text.

## 4. “Definitions” and absolute space, time, and motion

The *Principia* opens with a section called “Definitions”
that includes Newton's discussion of absolute space, time, and
motion. No part of the *Principia* has received more
discussion by philosophers over the three centuries since it was
published. Unfortunately, however, a tendency not to pay close
attention to the text has caused much of this discussion to produce
unnecessary
confusion.^{[18]}

The definitions inform the reader of how key technical terms, all of
them designating quantities, are going to be used throughout the
*Principia*. In the process Newton introduces terms that
have remained a part of physics ever since, such as *mass*,
*inertia*, and *centripetal force*. The emphasis in
every one of the definitions is on how the designated quantity is to be
measured, as illustrated by the opening definition: “Quantity of matter
[or mass] is a measure of matter that arises from its density and
volume jointly.” (Because a primary measure of density was then
specific gravity, no circularity arises here.) Newton
distinguishes among three ways of quantifying centripetal forces: the
absolute quantity, which corresponds to what we would call the field
strength of a central force field; the accelerative quantity, which “is
the measure of this force that is proportional to the acceleration
generated in a given time;” and the motive quantity, which is the
measure of the force proportional to what we would call the change in
linear momentum in a given time.

It is important to recognize that, in calling the referents of the
defined terms “quantities,” Newton is assigning them to the ontological
category of quantity in Aristotle's sense. Thus force and motion
are quantities that have direction as well as magnitude, and it makes
no sense to talk of forces as individuated entities or
substances. Newton's laws of motion and the propositions derived
from them involve relations among quantities, not among objects.
In place of “no entity without identity,” we have “no quantity without
definite
proportions;”^{[19]}
and the demand on measurement is to supply
values that unequivocally yield an adequate approximation to these
definite proportions.

Immediately following the eight definitions is a Scholium on space, time, and motion. One source of confusion in the literature on this scholium is not paying attention to the primary distinction Newton is drawing, which is between “absolute, true, mathematical” motion versus “relative, apparent, common” motion. The naive distinction between true and apparent motion was, of course, entirely commonplace. Moreover, Newton is scarcely introducing it into astronomy. Ptolemy's principal innovation in orbital astronomy — the so-called bi-section of eccentricity — entailed that half of the observed first inequality in the motion of the planets arises from a true variation in speed, and half from an only apparent variation associated with the observer being off center. Similarly, Copernicus's main point was that the second inequality — that is, the observed retrograde motions of the planets — involved not true, but only apparent motions. And the subsequent issue between the Copernican and Tychonic system concerned whether the observed annual motion of the Sun through the zodiac is a true or only an apparent motion of the Sun. So, what Newton is doing in the scholium on space and time is not to introduce a new distinction, but to explicate with more care a distinction that had been fundamental to astronomy for centuries.

The distinctions between “absolute, true, and mathematical” and
“relative, apparent, and common” time and space are the conceptual
basis Newton employs in laying out the corresponding distinction for
motion. He says, “relative, apparent, and common time is any
sensible and external measure (precise or imprecise) of duration by
motion,” adding a parallel point about absolute space. He points
out that the distinction between absolute and relative time has long
been part of astronomy insofar as astronomers have long introduced
corrections (via the equation of time) to the natural day “in order to
measure celestial motions on the basis of a truer time,” and he raises
the possibility of there being “no uniform motion by which time may
have an exact measure.” Absolute motion is defined as change from
one place in absolute space to another. “But since these parts of
space cannot be seen and cannot be distinguished from one another by
our senses, we use sensible measures in their stead,” adding “it is
possible that there is no body truly at rest to which places and
motions may be referred” [**P**, 410]. In short,
both absolute time and absolute location are quantities that cannot
themselves be observed, but instead have to be inferred from measures
of relative time and location, and these measures are always only
provisional; that is, they are always open to the possibility of being
replaced by some new (still relative) measure that is deemed to be
better behaved across a variety of phenomena in parallel with the way
in which sidereal time was deemed to be preferable to solar
time.

Notice here the expressed concern with measuring absolute, true,
mathematical time, space, and motion, all of which are identified at
the beginning of the scholium as quantities. The scholium that
follows the eight definitions thus continues their concern with
measures that will enable values to be assigned to the quantities in
question. Newton expressly acknowledges that these measures are
what we would now call theory-mediated and provisional.
Measurement is at the very heart of the *Principia*. It
pervades the definitions and scholium on space and time precisely
because the primary point of this section is to spell out (in Howard
Stein's words) “the empirical content of a set of theoretical
notions” [Stein, 1967, 281].

Accordingly, while Newton's distinctions between absolute and relative
time and space provide a conceptual basis for his explicating his
distinction between absolute and relative motion, absolute time and
space cannot enter directly into empirical reasoning insofar as they
are not themselves empirically accessible. In other words, the
*Principia* presupposes absolute time and space for purposes of
conceptualizing the aim of measurement, but the measurements themselves
are always of relative time and space, and the preferred measures are
those deemed to be providing the best approximations to the absolute
quantities. Newton never presupposes absolute time and space in
his empirical reasoning. Motion in the planetary system is
referred to the fixed stars, which are provisionally being taken as an
appropriate reference for measurement, and sidereal time is
provisionally taken as the preferred approximation to absolute
time. Moreover, in the corollaries to the laws of motion Newton
specifically renounces the need to worry about absolute versus relative
motion in two cases:

Corollary 5. When bodies are enclosed in a given space, their motions in relation to one another are the same whether the space is at rest or whether it is moving uniformly straight forward without circular motion.

Corollary 6. If bodies are moving in any way whatsoever with respect to one another and are urged by equal accelerative forces along parallel lines, they will all continue to move with respect to one another in the same way as they would if they were not acted on by those forces.

So, while the *Principia* presupposes absolute time and space
for purposes of conceptualizing absolute motion, the presuppositions
underlying all the empirical reasoning about actual motions are
philosophically more modest.

If absolute time and space cannot serve to distinguish absolute from
relative motions — more precisely, absolute from relative
*changes* of motion — empirically, then what can? Newton
answers, “The causes which distinguish true motions from relative
motions are the forces impressed upon bodies to generate motion.
True motion is neither generated nor changed except by forces impressed
upon the moving body itself.” The problem then becomes one of
distinguishing the forces impressed on bodies, where forces are
quantities; and hence the key issue is whether there are
theory-mediated measures of them that yield unequivocal values — in
contrast to different measures of the same force that yield different
values, the hallmark of relative motion. The famous bucket
example that follows is offered as illustrating how forces can be
distinguished that will then distinguish between true and apparent
motion. The final paragraph of the scholium begins and ends as
follows:

It is certainly very difficult to find out the true motions of individual bodies and actually to differentiate them from apparent motions, because the parts of that immovable space in which the bodies truly move make no impression on the senses. But the situation is not utterly hopeless…. But in what follows, a fuller explanation will be given of how to determine true motions from their causes, effects, and apparent differences, and, conversely, of how to determine from motions, whether true or apparent, their causes and effects. For this was the purpose for which I composed the following treatise. [P, 414f]

What does follow are two books of propositions that provide means
for inferring forces from motions and motions from forces and a final
book that illustrates how these propositions can be applied to the
system of the world first to identify the forces governing motion in
our planetary system and then to use them to differentiate between
certain true and apparent motions of particular interest. In this
respect, the empirical content of the theoretical concepts that Newton
has explicated in the section called “Definitions” is inextricably
linked with the physical theory presented in the rest of the
*Principia*.

The contention that the empirical reasoning in the *Principia*
does not presuppose an unbridled form of absolute time and space should
not be taken as suggesting that Newton's theory is free of fundamental
assumptions about time and space that have subsequently proved to be
problematic. For example, in the case of space, Newton
presupposes that the geometric structure governing which lines are
parallel and what the distances are between two points is
three-dimensional and Euclidean. In the case of time Newton
presupposes that, with suitable corrections for such factors as the
speed of light, questions about whether two celestial events happened
at the same time can in principle always have a definite answer.
And the appeal to forces to distinguish real from apparent non-inertial
motions presupposes that free-fall under gravity can always, at least
in principle, be distinguished from inertial
motion.^{[20]}

Equally, the contention that the empirical reasoning in the
*Principia* does not presuppose an unbridled form of absolute
space should not be taken as denying that Newton invoked absolute space
as his means for conceptualizing true deviations from inertial
motion. Corollary 5 to the Laws of Motion, quoted above, put him
in a position to introduce the notion of an inertial frame, but he did
not do so, perhaps in part because Corollary 6 showed that even using
an inertial frame to define deviations from inertial motion would not
suffice. Empirically, nevertheless, the *Principia*
follows astronomical practice in treating celestial motions relative to
the fixed stars, and one of its key empirical conclusions (Book 3,
Prop. 14, Corol. 1) is that the fixed stars are at rest with respect to
the center of gravity of our planetary system.

## 5. Newton's Laws of Motion

The designation “laws of motion” had been used in the
*Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society* in the late
1660s for principles governing motion under impact put forward by
Christopher Wren, John Wallis, and Christiaan Huygens. Only the
first of the three laws Newton gives in the *Principia*
corresponds to any of these principles, and even the statement of it is
distinctly different: *Every body perseveres in its state of being
at rest or of moving uniformly straight forward except insofar as it is
compelled to change its state by forces impressed*. This
general principle, which following the lead of Newton came to be called
the principle or law of inertia, had been in print since Pierre
Gassendi's *De motu impresso a motore translato* of 1641.
Newton probably first encountered it in print when he read Descartes'
*Principia*, where it is comprised by his first two “laws of
nature” and is used immediately to assert “that any body which is
moving in a circle constantly tends to move away from the center of the
circle which it is describing.” This is the basis for Descartes
concluding that some form of unseen matter (namely the vortices) must
be in contact with the planets, for otherwise they would go off in a
straight line. It is the first of the three hypotheses from which
Huygens develops his theory of “falling heavy bodies and their motion
in a cycloid” in his *Horologium Oscillatorium* of 1673: *If
there were no gravity, and if the air did not impede the motion of
bodies, then any body will continue its given motion with uniform
velocity in a straight line*. Newton had adopted it as a
“hypothesis” in the registered version of “De Motu,” though stated
without reference to impressed forces: *Every body under the sole
action of its innate force moves uniformly in a straight line
indefinitely unless something extraneous hinders it*. The
striking difference in the formulation in the *Principia* versus
the one in “De Motu” — and, for that matter, versus all earlier
formulations in print — is the reference to impressed forces. In
all earlier formulations, any departure from uniform motion in a
straight line implied the existence of a material impediment to the
motion; in the more abstract formulation in the *Principia*, the
existence of an impressed force is implied, with the question of how
this force is effected left open.

The modern *F=ma* form of Newton's second law nowhere occurs in
any edition of the *Principia* even though he had seen his
second law formulated in this way in print during the interval between
the second and third editions in Jacob Hermann's *Phoronomia* of
1716. Instead, it has the following formulation in all three
editions: *A change in motion is proportional to the motive force
impressed and takes place along the straight line in which that force
is impressed*. In the body of the *Principia* this law
is applied both to discrete cases, in which an instantaneous impulse
such as from impact is effecting the change in motion, and to
continuously acting cases, such as the change in motion in the
continuous deceleration of a body moving in a resisting medium.
Newton thus appears to have intended his second law to be neutral
between discrete forces (that is, what we now call impulses) and
continuous forces. (His stating the law in terms of proportions
rather than equality bypasses what seems to us an inconsistency of
units in treating the law as neutral between these two.)

The obvious question with the second law is what Newton means by “a
change in motion.” If he had meant a change in what we call
momentum — that is, if he had meant, in modern notation,
*Δ**mv* — the proper phrasing would have been “a
change in the quantity of motion.” In a passage composed in the
early 1690s when Newton was intending to restructure the
*Principia*, he explained what he meant:

If the body

Ashould [see Fig. 1], at its placeAwhere a force is impressed upon it, have a motion by which, when uniformly continued, it would describe the straight lineAa, but shall by the impressed force be

Figure 1

deflected from this line into another one

Aband, when it ought to be located at the placea, be found at the placeb, then because the body, free of the impressed force, would have occupied the placeaand is thrust out from this place by that force and transferred therefrom to the placeb, the translation of the body from the placeato the placebwill, in the meaning of this Law, be proportional to this force and directed to the same goal towards which this force is impressed. Whence, if the same body deprived of all motion and impressed by the same force with the same direction, could in the same time be transported from the placeAto the placeB, the two straight linesABandabwill be parallel and equal. For the same force, by acting with the same direction and in the same time on the same body whether at rest or carried on with any motion whatever, will in the meaning of this Law achieve an identical translation towards the same goal; and in the present case the translation isABwhere the body was at rest before the force was impressed, andabwhere it was there in a state of motion. [M, 541]

In other words, the measure of the change in motion is the distance
between the place where the body would have been after a given time had
it not been acted on by the force and the place it is after that
time. This is in keeping with the measure universally used at the
time for the strength of the acceleration of surface gravity, namely
the distance a body starting from rest falls vertically in the first
second. The only special provision that Newton has to make is for
non-uniform continuously acting forces, for which, in accord with Lemma
10, he takes the distance *AB* to vary “at the very
beginning of the motion in the squared ratio of the
times.”^{[21]}

If this way of interpreting the second law seems perverse, keep in
mind that the geometric mathematics Newton used in
the *Principia* — and others were using before him
— had no way of representing acceleration as a quantity in its
own right. Newton, of course, could have conceptualized acceleration
as the second derivative of distance with respect to time within the
framework of the symbolic calculus. This indeed is the form in which
Jacob Hermann presented the second law in his *Phoronomia* of
1716 (and Euler in the 1740s). But the geometric mathematics used in
the *Principia* offered no way of representing second
derivatives. (Newton employed curvature — that is, the circle
“touching a curve” — in place of the second
derivative with respect to distance throughout
the *Principia*). Hence, it was natural for Newton to stay with
the established tradition of using a length as the measure of the
change of motion produced by a force, even independently of the
advantage this measure had of allowing the law to cover both discrete
and continuously acting forces (with the given time taken in the limit
in the continuous case).

Under this interpretation, Newton's second law would not have seemed
novel at the time. The consequences of impact were also being
interpreted in terms of the distance between where the body would have
been after a given time, had it not suffered the impact, and where it
was after this time, following the impact, with the magnitude of this
distance depending on the relative bulks of the impacting bodies.
Moreover, Huygens's account of the centrifugal force (that is, the
tension in the string) in uniform circular motion in his *Horologium
Oscillatorium* used as the measure for the force the distance
between where the body would have been had it continued in a straight
line and its location on the circle in a limiting small increment of
time; and he then added that the tension in the string would also be
proportional to the weight of the body. So, construed in the
indicated way, Newton's second law was novel only in its replacing bulk
and weight with
mass.^{[22]}

In the early stages of his work on the *Principia* Newton had
identified three logically equivalent alternatives for the third law:
the action-reaction principle he ultimately chose, the principle we
call conservation of linear momentum (Corollary 3 in the
*Principia*), and the principle that “the common center of
gravity of two or more bodies does not change its state whether of
motion or of rest as a result of the actions of the bodies upon one
another” (Corollary 4). Huygens had stated that both of these
principles follow from his solution for spheres in collision, and the
center of gravity principle, as Newton emphasizes, amounts to nothing
more than a generalization of the principle of inertia. Even
though his third law was novel in comparison with these other
two,^{[23]}
Newton
nevertheless chose it and relegated the other two to corollaries.
Two things can be said about this choice. First, the third law is
a local principle, while the two alternatives to it are global
principles, and Newton, unlike those working in mechanics on the
Continent at the time, generally preferred fundamental principles to be
local, perhaps because they pose less of an evidence burden.
Second, with the choice of the third law, the three laws all expressly
concern impressed forces: the first law authorizes inferences to the
presence of an impressed force on a body, the second, to its magnitude
and direction, and the third to the correlative force on the body
producing it. In this regard, Newton's three laws of motion are
indeed axioms characterizing impressed force. Real forces, in
contrast to such apparent forces as Coriolis forces (of which Newton
was entirely aware, though of course not under this name), are forces
for which the third law, as well as the first two, hold, for only by
means of this law can real forces and hence changes of motion be
distinguished from apparent ones.

Newton presents his first two laws as already “accepted by
mathematicians and confirmed by experiments of many kinds”
[**P**,
424].^{[24]}
For the third law, by contrast, he
offers a variety of forms of support, including experiments on
impact. One important element that becomes clear in his
discussion of evidence for the third law — and also in Corollary 2 —
is that Newton's impressed force is the same as static force that had
been employed in the theory of equilibrium of devices like the level
and balance for some time. Newton is not introducing a novel
notion of force, but only extending a familiar notion of force.
Indeed, Huygens too had employed this notion of static force in his
*Horologium Oscillatorium* when he identified his centrifugal
force with the tension in the string (or the pressure on a wall)
retaining an object in circular motion, in explicit analogy with the
tension exerted by a heavy body on a string from which it is
dangling. Huygens's theory of centrifugal force was going beyond
the standard treatment of static forces only in its inferring the
magnitude of the force from the motion of the body in a circle.
Newton's innovation beyond Huygens was first to focus not on the force
on the string, but on the correlative force on the moving body, and
second to abstract this force away from the mechanism by which it acts
on the body. Three steps were thus involved in passing from the
already familiar static forces to the more abstract Newtonian “dynamic”
forces, one by Huygens and two by
Newton.^{[25]}

The continuity with Huygens's theory of centrifugal force is important
in another respect. In his brief defense of the first two laws of
motion Newton remarks, “What has been demonstrated concerning the times
of oscillating pendulums depends on the same first two laws and first
two corollaries, and this is supported by daily experience with clocks”
[**P**, 424]. In Huygens's *Horologium
Oscillatorium*, the only place any counterpart to the second law
surfaces is in the theory of centrifugal force and uniform circular
motion. The theory Huygens presents extends to conical pendulums,
including a conical pendulum clock that he indicates has advantages
over simple pendulum clocks. In the 1670s Newton had used a
conical pendulum to confirm Huygens's announced value of the strength
of surface gravity as measured by simple cycloidal and small-arc
circular
pendulums.^{[26]}
(Huygens himself had measured the
strength of surface gravity with a conical pendulum, obtaining the same
value to four significant figures as he had obtained with
simple
pendulums.^{[27]})
The precise agreement between these
two theory-mediated measures of surface gravity, one of them predicated
on Newton's first two laws of motion and the other not, in fact
constituted the strongest evidence for the first two laws at the time
the *Principia* was first published. For, the simple
pendulum measure was known to be stable and accurate into the fourth
significant figure. The evidence in hand for the first two laws, taken
as a basis for measuring forces, was thus much stronger than has often
been appreciated.

Save perhaps for the attribution of the *F=ma* form of the
second law to the *Principia*, the most widespread mistake about
Newton's three laws of motion is that they alone sufficed for all
problems in classical mechanics. Those who developed what we now
call Newtonian mechanics during the eighteenth century at all times
appreciated how far from the truth this is. Newton's three laws
of motion suffice for problems involving what Euler dubbed
“point-masses.” Indeed, once given the forces acting on a point
mass, the three laws hold for all point-masses, including those that
lie within bodies. But the three laws must be supplemented by
further principles for a whole host of celebrated problems involving
bodies, rigid or otherwise, that are not mere point-masses.
Perhaps the simplest prominent example at the time was the problem of a
small arc circular pendulum with two (or more) point-mass bobs along
the string. Huygens had solved this problem in the part of his
*Horologium Oscillatorium* entitled “The Center of Oscillation,”
in the process providing the theoretical basis for using added masses
to tune pendulum
clocks.^{[28]}
The reason why Newton's three laws of
motion have to be supplemented to solve this problem is easy to
see. Consider the case of a pendulum with two point-masses along
the length of a rigid string. The outer point-mass has the effect
of reducing the speed of the inner one, versus what it would have had
without the outer one, and the inner point-mass increases the speed of
the outer one. In other words, motion is transferred from the
inner one to the outer one along the segment of the string joining
them. Once the force transmitted to each point-mass along the
string is known, Newton's three laws of motion are sufficient to
determine the motion. But his three laws are not sufficient to
determine what this force transmitted along the string is. Some
other principle beyond them is needed to solve the problem. Which
principle is to be preferred in solving this problem became a
celebrated issue extending across most of the eighteenth
century.^{[29]}

## 6. Book 1 of the *Principia*

Book 1 develops a mathematical theory of motion under centripetal
forces. In keeping with the Euclidean tradition, the propositions
mathematically derived from the laws of motion are labeled either as
theorems or as problems. The theorems all have an “if-then” form,
enabling them to authorize inferences of their consequents, given
their
antecedents.^{[30]}
But then so too do the problems in
effect have an “if-then” logical form, for the (geometric style)
solutions they provide authorize inferences from given information to
unknowns. The best way to think of the derived propositions,
therefore, is as “inference-tickets.” As such, the propositions
fall into three categories: (1) ones that license conclusions about
forces from information about motions, (2) ones that license conclusions
about motions from information about forces, and (3) ones that license
conclusions about (net) forces directed toward whole bodies from
information about (contributing) forces directed toward the individual
parts of the bodies.

A fundamental contrast between Newton's mathematical theory of motion
under centripetal forces and the mathematical theories of motion
developed by Galileo and Huygens is that Newton's is generic. Galileo
and Huygens examined one kind of force, uniform gravity, with a goal
of deriving testable consequences. Newton's theory covers not only
forces that vary as 1/*r*^{2}, for which the
*Principia* is famous, but also forces that vary as *r*,
as 1/*r*^{3}, and even as any arbitrary function of
*r*. At the end of Section 11 he gives a reason, quoted
earlier:

Mathematics requires an investigation of those quantities of forces and their proportions that follow from any conditions that may be supposed. Then, coming down to physics, these proportions must be compared with the phenomena, so that it may be found out which conditions of forces apply to each kind of attracting bodies. And then, finally, it will be possible to argue more securely concerning the physical species, physical causes, and physical proportions of these forces. [P, 588f]

He had other reasons as well. The theory of gravity entails
that gravity below the surface of a uniformly dense sphere varies
linearly with the distance from the center, and hence, at least to a
first approximation, this is how gravity varies below the surface of
the Earth. Centripetal forces that vary as
1/*r*^{3} hold if and only if the trajectory is
a
spiral;^{[31]}
and,
given any stationary orbit governed by centripetal forces,
superposition of a 1/*r*^{3} centripetal force will
cause that orbit to precess, as in the case of the lunar
orbit.^{[32]}
Still,
Newton's main reason appears to have been the one given in the
quotation.

In one curious respect that Newton mentions only once in passing, the
theory does not cover all “conditions that may be supposed.”
Newton's theory treats centripetal forces that vary only with the
distance from the force center, that is, ones for which the force on
two bodies equally distant from that center is always the same.
It does not treat centripetal forces that vary with *θ*
and *φ*, the two angular components of (*r*,
*θ*, *φ*) spherical coordinates. This is
notable for two reasons. First, the central forces arising in
Cartesian vortices would almost certainly have varied with both of
these angular components, and hence Newton is tacitly begging a
question. Second, as Newton himself realized and noted in Section
13 of Book 1, gravity around a spheroid does not vary simply as
1/*r*^{2}, but must also vary with
latitude.^{[33]}
From
Newton's point of view, therefore, gravity around Jupiter and the
Earth, and surely the Sun as well, does not vary simply as
1/*r*^{2}. This is one of many often ignored cues
pointing to the extent to which the evidential reasoning in the
*Principia* has to be more intricate and subtle than was
appreciated at the time, or for that matter even now.

Up to the end of Section 10, Book 1 considers forces that are directed
toward geometric centers rather than bodies. As a consequence, only
the first two laws of motion enter into any of the proofs until late
in Book 1. Even further, as Newton develops the theory to that point,
only the accelerative measure of force is employed, and hence even
*mass* plays no role. Included in this segment are by far the
most widely read parts of Book 1, then and now: Section 2, which deals
with centripetal forces generally, and Section 3, which develops
Newton's fundamental discovery that a body moves in a conic section,
sweeping out equal areas in equal times about a focus, if and only if
the motion is governed by an inverse-square centripetal force directed
toward this focus. The stick-figure picture of Book 1 that results
from viewing these two sections as its high point blinds the reader
not only to the richness of the theory developed in it, but also to
several no less important results derived in the rest of it.

The paragraph that opens Section 11 announces, “Up to this point I have
been setting forth the motions of bodies attracted toward an immovable
center, such as, however, hardly exists in the natural world…. I
now go on to set forth the motion of bodies that attract one another”
[**P**, 561] The section first successfully solves
the problem of the motion of two bodies under inverse-square mutual
attraction. It then turns to the case of more than two bodies,
for which Newton can solve only the case of mutual attraction that
varies linearly with the distance between bodies. For the
inverse-square case, Newton gives only qualitative results, most of
them in 22 corollaries to Proposition 66 that Newton calls “imperfect”
in the Preface to the first edition. All of these corollaries
identify qualitative tendencies in the motions of a body orbiting a
second body and attracted to a third, with the majority of the results
directed specifically to the perturbing effects of the Sun on the
motion of our Moon. It is with Section 11, then, that the
*Principia* departs from the realm of the “De Motu” tract and
begins to consider the complexities of the true motions.

Sections 12 and 13 treat attractive forces between bodies that result from — are composed out of — centripetal forces between each of the individual microphysical particles forming them. Section 12 treats spherical bodies, and Section 13, non-spherical bodies. As Newton anticipated, this was the part of Book 1 that would arouse the strongest complaints from readers committed to the view that all forces involve contact between bodies. On top of this, nowhere in Book 1 did the mathematics become more demanding than here. These two sections give primary attention to inverse-square forces and forces that vary linearly with distance, but, just as earlier in Book 1, some results pertain to forces that vary in other ways, included among which are results pointing to experiments that might differentiate between inverse-square and any alternative to it. In the Scholium to Proposition 78 Newton singles out the result of this inquiry that he regarded as most notable:

I have now set forth the two major cases of attractions, namely when the centripetal forces decrease in the squared ratio of the distances or increase in the simple ratio of the distances, causing bodies to revolve in conics, and composing centripetal forces of spherical bodies that decrease or increase in proportion to the distance from the center according to the same law — which is worthy of note. [P, 599]^{[34]}

This is one of the few places in the *Principia* where Newton
singles out a result in an aside in this way. That an attracting
sphere can be treated as if the mass were concentrated at its center in
the case of attractive forces that vary linearly with the distance was
not so notable, for as Newton shows in Section 13, in this case of
attractive forces an attracting body always can be treated as if the
mass were located at its center of gravity, regardless of shape.
The truly notable finding is that it is also true of spheres in the
case of inverse-square forces. The subsequent results in Sections
12 and 13 indicate that, in the case of all other kinds of centripetal
force, the attraction toward a sphere is not the same as attraction
toward all its mass concentrated in the center; and even in the
inverse-square case, the result does not hold for other shapes or for
spheres that do not have spherically symmetric density.

Although Newton does not so expressly single out other results of Book
1, a few deserve comment here. The key that opened the way to
Newton's theory of motion under centripetal forces was his discovery of
how to generalize to non-circular trajectories the solution that he and
Huygens had obtained for the central force in uniform circular
motion. Figure 2 shows Newton's diagram for this generalization
from the first edition. Suppose first that the trajectory APQ is
part of a circle of radius SP along which the body at P is moving
uniformly. Both Newton and Huygens had reasoned that the
displacement QR from the tangent is proportional to the product of the
force retaining the body in its circular orbit and the square of the
time *t* for the body to

Figure 2

move from P to Q, and hence the force varies as
QR/*t*^{2}. But the time is proportional to PQ
divided by the velocity *v*, and in the limit as Q approaches P,
PQ approaches PR, so that *t*^{2} becomes equal to
PR^{2}/*v*^{2}. Proposition 36 of Book 3
of Euclid entails that in this limit PR^{2} is equal to the
product of QR and twice the radius SP, and hence the force for uniform
motion in a circle varies as *v*^{2}/SP or
*v*^{2}/*r*.^{[35]}

Newton's Proposition 6 generalizes this result to not necessarily
uniform motion *under centripetal forces* along an arbitrary
trajectory in which equal areas are swept out in equal times with
respect to S, in accord with Proposition 1 of Book 1. The central
force at P is again proportional to the displacement from the tangent
QR over a short increment of time divided by the square of this time;
but now the time is proportional not to the arc PQ, but to the area
swept out, which in the limit as Q approaches P, is the triangular area
SPxQT/2. Therefore, to keep a body moving along a given
non-circular trajectory, the centripetal force must vary along the
trajectory as (1/SP^{2}) — that is, 1/*r*^{2}
— times the limit of (QR/QT^{2}) as Q approaches P. In
the second edition Newton adds a corollary that displays another way of
seeing the result as a generalization of uniform circular motion: the
centripetal force along the trajectory must everywhere vary as
*v*^{2}/(*ρ*sinSPR), where *ρ* is
the radius of curvature of the trajectory at P. With this, the
body can be viewed as driven from one instantaneous circle to the next
by the component of force tangential to the motion, a component that
disappears in the case of uniform circular motion.

Newton illustrates the value of Proposition 6 with a series of
examples, the two most important of which involve motion in an
ellipse. If the force center is at a focus S of the ellipse, then
the limit of (QR/QT^{2}) is everywhere equal to half the
constant latus rectum of the ellipse, and hence the force varies as
1/SP^{2}, or 1/*r*^{2}. But if the force
center is at the center C of the ellipse, the force turns out to vary
as PC, that is, linearly with *r*. This contrast raises an
interesting question. What conclusion can be drawn in the case of
motion in an ellipse for which the foci are very near the center, and
the center of force is not known to be exactly at the focus?
Newton clearly noticed this question and supplied the means for
answering it in the Scholium that ends Section 2.

Section 10 includes a philosophically important result that has gone
largely unnoticed in the literature on the *Principia*.
Newton's argument that terrestrial gravity extends to the Moon depends
crucially on Huygens's precise measurement of the strength of surface
gravity. This theory-mediated measurement was based on
the
isochronism^{[36]}
of the cycloidal pendulum under uniform gravity directed in parallel
lines toward a flat Earth. But gravity is directed toward the
center of the (nearly) spherical Earth along lines that are not
parallel to one another, and according to Newton's theory it is not
uniform. So, does Huygens's measurement cease to be valid in the
context of the *Principia*? Newton recognized this concern
and addressed it in Propositions 48 through 52 by extending Huygens's
theory of the cycloidal pendulum to cover the hypocycloidal pendulum —
that is, a cycloidal path produced when the generating circle rolls
along the inside of a sphere instead of along a flat surface.
Proposition 52 then shows that such a pendulum, although not
isochronous under inverse-square centripetal forces, is isochronous
under centripetal forces that vary linearly with the distance to the
center. Insofar as gravity varies thus linearly below the surface
in a uniformly dense sphere, the hypocycloidal pendulum is isochronous
up to the surface, and hence it can in principle be used to measure the
strength of gravity. A corollary to this proposition goes further
by pointing out that, as the radius of the sphere is increased
indefinitely, its surface approaches a plane surface and the law of the
hypocycloidal asymptotically approaches Huygens's law of the cycloidal
pendulum. This not only validates Huygens's measurement of
surface gravity, but also provides a formula that can be used to
determine the error associated with using Huygens's theory rather than
the theory of the hypocycloidal pendulum.

Thus, what Newton has taken the trouble to do in Section 10 is to show
that Huygens's theory of pendulums under uniform parallel gravity is a
limit-case of Newton's theory of pendulums under universal
gravity. At the end of Section 2 he points out in passing that
this limit strategy also captures Galileo's theory of projectile
motion. In other words, Newton took the trouble to show that the
Galilean-Huygensian theory of local motion under their uniform gravity
is a particular limit-case of his theory of universal gravity, just as
Einstein took the trouble to show that Newtonian gravity is a
limit-case of the theory of gravity of general relativity.
Newton's main reason for doing this appears to have been the need to
validate a measurement pivotal to the evidential reasoning for
universal gravity in Book 3. From a philosophic standpoint,
however, what is striking is not merely his recognizing this need, but
more so the trouble he went to to fulfill it. Section 10 may thus
illustrate best of all that Newton had a clear reason for including
everything he chose to include in the *Principia*.

Section 9 includes another often overlooked result that is pivotal to
the evidential reasoning for universal gravity in Book 3.
Proposition 45 applies the result on precessing orbits mentioned
earlier to the special case of nearly circular orbits, that is, orbits
like those of the then known planets and their satellites. This
proposition establishes that such orbits, under purely centripetal
forces, are stationary — that is, do not precess — if and only if the
centripetal force governing them is *exactly*
inverse-square. It does this by deriving a formula relating the
exponent *n* in the force law to the angle *θ*
between the point where the orbiting body is furthest from the force
center to the point where it is nearest, that is, the apsidal angle:
*n* = (180/*θ*)^{2}-3. (To
illustrate, if the apsidal angle is 180 degrees, as in a Keplerian
ellipse, then the exponent in the force law is -2, and if the apsidal
angle is 90 degrees, as in an ellipse for which the force center is in
the center, the exponent is +1.) This result is striking in three
ways. First, insofar as the cumulative effect of even a very
small precession is detectable after several revolutions, this formula
turns the rate of precession (2*θ* per revolution) into a
sensitive measure of the exponent in the force law. Second, it
yields a conditional beyond “*If the orbit is stationary, then the
centripetal force is inverse-square*,” namely, “*If the orbit is
nearly stationary, then the centripetal force is nearly
inverse-square*.” Using Newton's preferred phrasing, *quam
proxime* (literally, “most nearly as possible”), this latter
conditional has an “If…*quam proxime*,
then…*quam proxime*” form. Newton illustrates this
by taking the mean precession rate of the lunar orbit, 3 degrees per
revolution, to conclude that the exponent for the net centrifugal force
acting on the Moon is -2 and 4/243. Third, even when an orbit does
precess, once such a fractional departure of the exponent from -2 is
shown to result from the perturbing effect of outside bodies, then one
can still conclude that the force toward the central body is exactly
-2. This is precisely the strategy Newton follows in concluding
that the centripetal force on the Moon, once a correction is made for
the perturbing effects of the Sun, is inverse-square.

This is not the only place in Book 1 where Newton takes the trouble to
derive an “If…*quam proxime*, then…*quam
proxime*” version of an exact “If…, then…”
proposition. Propositions 1 and 2 establish that a motion is
governed purely by centripetal forces if and only if equal areas are
swept out in equal times. The second and third corollaries of
Proposition 3 then yield the conclusion that a motion is *quam
proxime* governed purely by centripetal forces if and only if equal
areas are *quam proxime* swept out in equal times. Again,
after establishing that Kepler's 3/2 power rule holds exactly for
concentric uniform circular motions if and only if an exact
inverse-square centripetal force holds across all the orbits, he adds
the generalization, “And universally, if the periodic time is as any
power *R ^{n}* of the radius

*R*, … the centripetal force will be inversely as the power

*R*

^{2}

^{n}^{-1}of the radius, and conversely.”

^{[37]}This result holds for non-integer values of

*n*, and hence it yields the further result that the 3/2 power rule holds

*quam proxime*for uniform circular orbits if and only if the centripetal force is

*quam proxime*inverse-square. These propositions— which Newton has taken the trouble to show still hold in a

*quam proxime*form — are the very ones he invokes in Book 3 to conclude that the forces retaining bodies in their orbits in our planetary system are all centripetal and inverse-square. (By contrast, as noted earlier, while the proposition, “if a Keplerian ellipse exactly, then inverse-square exactly,” is true, the proposition, “if a Keplerian ellipse

*quam proxime*, then inverse-square

*quam proxime*,” is not true when the eccentricity of the ellipse is not large, as explained in Smith, 2002.) A failure to notice these

*quam proxime*forms in Book 1 blinds one to the subtlety of the approximative reasoning Newton employs in Book 3.

## 7. Book 2 of the *Principia*

The purpose of Book 2 is to provide a conclusive refutation of the Cartesian idea, adopted as well by Leibniz, that the planets are carried around their orbits by fluid vortices. Newton's main argument, which extends from the beginning of Section 1 until the end of Section 7, occupies 80 percent of the Book. Section 9, which ends the Book, offers a further, parting argument. We best dispense with this second argument before turning to the first.

The thrust of the argument in Section 9 is that fluid vortices are
incompatible with Kepler's area and 3/2 power rules. The argument
has two shortcomings, both of them recognized by Newton's opponents at
the time. First, the entire argument is predicated on a
hypothesis: “The resistance that arises from want of slipperiness of
the parts of the fluid is, *ceteris paribus*, proportional to
the velocity with which the parts of the fluid are separated from one
another.” Fluids of this sort are now called “Newtonian.”
The absence of evidence for the hypothesis left Newton's opponents free
to adopt other rules for the velocity gradient in a vortex generated
around a rotating cylinder or sphere, rules that could undercut his
conclusions. Second, his analysis of the vortex generated around
a rotating cylinder or sphere involves fundamentally wrong physics: it
defines steady state in terms of a balance of forces instead of torques
across each shell element comprising the vortex. To use Johann
Bernoulli's words from 1730, Newton “completely neglects to take into
account the action of the lever, the consideration of which however is
absolutely necessary here, it being obvious that the same force,
applied along the tangent to the circumference of a large wheel, has a
greater efficacity for making it turn than it has when applied to the
circumference of a smaller
radius.”^{[38]}
(This is not the only place in the
*Principia* where it is clear that Newton had not thought
through the mechanics of angular motion.)

The argument that carried much more weight at the time — it convinced Huygens, for example — is the one that extends across the first seven sections of the Book. The thrust of this argument is clear from its conclusion, as stated more forcefully in the second and third editions than in the first:

And even if air, water, quicksilver, and similar fluids, by some infinite division of their parts, could be subtilized and become infinitely fluid mediums, they would not resist projected balls any the less. For the resistance which is the subject of the preceding propositions arises from the inertia of matter; and the inertia of matter is essential to bodies and is always proportional to the quantity of matter. By the division of the parts of a fluid, the resistance that arises from the tenacity and friction of the parts can indeed be diminished, but the quantity of matter is not diminished by the division of its parts; and since the quantity of matter remains the same, its force of inertia — to which the resistance discussed here is always proportional — remains the same. For the resistance to be diminished, the quantity of matter in the spaces through which bodies move must be diminished. And therefore the celestial spaces, through which the globes of the planets and comets move continually in all directions freely and without any sensible diminution of motion, are devoid of any corporeal fluid, except perhaps the very rarest of vapors and rays of light transmitted through those spaces. [P, 761]

To reach this conclusion Newton had to show that (1) the inertia of
the fluid does indeed produce a resistance force proportional to its
density, a force that (2) is independent of the tenacity (that is,
surface friction) and the friction of the parts (that is, viscosity) of
the fluid. Perhaps in part in emulation of the approach to
centripetal forces that appeared to have succeeded so well in Books 1
and 3, the approach Newton takes in Book 2 is to develop, so far as he
can, a generic mathematical theory of motion under resistance forces
and then turn to experimental phenomena so that, in the words of Book
1, “it may be found out which conditions of forces apply” to different
kinds of fluids. The theory in Book 1 is generic in that it
examines centripetal forces that vary as different functions of the
distance from the force center. The theory in Book 2 is generic
in that it examines motion under resistance forces that vary as the
velocity, the velocity squared, the sum of these two, and ultimately
even the sum of two or three independent contributions, each of which
is allowed to vary as any power of velocity whatever. Because
Newton's goal was to reach a conclusion about the contribution to the
total resistance made by the inertia of the fluid, and he recognized
that surface friction and viscosity can contribute to the resistance as
well, his empirical problem became one of *disaggregating* the
inertial contribution from the total resistance, that is, the
contribution that alone varies with the density of the fluid.
Fortunately, because gravitational forces so totally dominate celestial
motions, this need to disaggregate different sorts of forces did not
arise in Book 3.

From Newton's point of view, then, the basic problem — assuming that
three independent mechanisms contribute to the total resistance forces,
only one of which is proportional to the fluid density
*ρ** _{f}* — was to find an experimental
phenomenon that would allow him to determine (1) the three exponents in
the following schema, and (2) laws defining the three coefficients —
or, more minimally, at least the variation of the coefficient of the
last term for the specific case of spheres:

F=_{resist}a+_{0}v^{n0}a+_{1}v^{n1}b_{2}ρ_{f}v^{n2}

Some preliminary pendulum-decay experiments showed promise for doing this, leading him in the first edition to rely solely on this phenomenon. The idea was to start a pendulum from several different heights in order to cover a range of velocities and then to use simultaneous algebraic equations to fit a two or three term polynomial to two or three lost-arc data-points, changing the exponents until the polynomial achieved good agreement with the other lost-arc data points. The theoretical solutions for pendulum motion under resistance forces in Section 6 would then allow him to infer the forces from the rate of decay of the pendulum. These theoretical solutions covered resistance forces that vary not only as velocity to the powers 0, 1, and 2, but also as any power at all of velocity. In principle, therefore, he saw himself in a position to infer laws for resistance forces on spheres from the phenomenon of pendulum decay in full parallel with his deduction of the law of universal gravity from the phenomena of orbital motion in Book 3. And he could then conclude from the total absence of signs of resistance forces acting on the planets and, most especially, comets that the density of any fluid in the celestial regions must be exactly or very nearly zero.

Unfortunately, pendulum-decay turned out not to be as well behaved a
phenomenon as Newton anticipated it was going to be while he was
working on the first edition. The problem, as he later realized,
was that he had to let the pendulum swing many times in order to
measure the rate of decay, and in the process it gave rise to a “to and
fro” motion in the surrounding fluid, so that the *relative*
velocity between the bob and the fluid, which is the velocity that
matters in resistance, could not be determined or controlled. The
General Scholium following Section
6^{[39]}
reports detailed decay-rate data for an
impressive range of experiments, including different size bobs in air
and bobs moving as well in water and mercury. The reader is also
shown in detail how to proceed from the data in each case to a
polynomial as above defining the resistance force. Any reader who
worked through the data discovered what Newton knew, but was less than
candid about: no polynomial fit the data. The experiments did
clearly indicate that resistance forces involve no power of velocity
greater than 2, and they provided good evidence that a velocity squared
effect was dominant, even to the extent of masking any effect involving
some other power. Newton also managed to extract some highly
qualified evidence that the velocity squared effect varies as the
density of the fluid and the frontal area (that is, the square of the
diameter) of spheres.

The approach to resistance in the first edition relied entirely on pendulum-decay experiments. The disappointing evidence they yielded led to a far weaker statement of the conclusion about the absence of fluid in the celestial regions in the first edition than the conclusion in the subsequent editions quoted above. Not long after the first edition was published, Newton initiated some vertical-fall experiments in water that persuaded him that the phenomenon of vertical-fall in resisting media would yield much better behaved data. In the second and third editions, therefore, even though the pendulum-decay experiments are still fully reported, the central argument in Book 2 relies on vertical-fall experiments (including ones from the top of the dome of the newly completed St. Paul's Cathedral) to establish a resistance effect on spheres that is proportional to the density of the fluid, the square of the diameter, and the square of the velocity. The data from these experiments were very good — indeed, even better than Newton realized, for small vagaries in them that he dismissed as experimental error were in fact not vagaries at all, but evidence that no polynomial of the sort he was seeking is adequate for resistance forces.

While the vertical-fall experiments put Newton in a position to make
his concluding rejection of vortex theories more forceful, they also
posed a methodological complication. The vertical-fall
experiments offered no way of disaggregating the contribution to
resistance made by the inertia of the medium from the total
resistance. But the argument against vortices required him to
show that, no matter how perfectly free of friction and viscosity the
celestial fluid might be, its inertia would still give rise to
resistance forces that would affect the motions of comets, if not
planets as well. From the resistance measured in the
pendulum-decay experiments, Newton could conclude that the forces in
air and water are dominated by a contribution that varies as the
velocity squared. In the vertical-fall experiments in air and
water the measured forces varied to first approximation as the product
of the density and the velocity squared, but only to a first
approximation, leaving room to question whether a purely inertial
contribution had been isolated. Newton dealt with this problem by
offering a rather *ad hoc* theoretical derivation for the purely
inertial contribution, showing how closely it agreed with the
vertical-fall results, and proposing that the differences between the
theoretical and the measured resistances could be used to investigate
other contributions. Success of such a program in characterizing
the contributions made by surface friction and the viscosity would have
provided compelling support for Newton's theory of the inertial
contribution. Still, the approach left Newton with not so
straightforward a derivation of the laws of resistance forces from
phenomena as he had hoped for in the first
edition.^{[40]}

In fact, there is a deep mistake in Newton's approach to resistance
forces that came to be understood only at the beginning of the
twentieth century. Resistance forces do not arise from
independent contributions made by such factors as the viscosity and
inertia of the fluid. Consequently, no polynomial consisting of a
few always positive terms in powers of velocity can ever be adequate
for resistance forces. The first indication of this came when
d'Alembert, unhappy with Newton's *ad hoc* theory for the
inertial contribution, analyzed the flow of what we now call a perfect
fluid about spheres and bodies of other shapes, discovering in all
cases that the net force of the fluid is exactly zero.
Consequently, contrary to Newton, there is no such thing as
*the* contribution made to resistance purely by the inertia of
the fluid. Resistance forces always arise from a combination of
viscous and inertial effects, however low the viscosity of the fluid
may be. Newton's assumption that resistance forces can be
represented as a sum, one term of which gives the contribution made
purely by the inertia of the fluid, was wrong empirically, much as his
assumptions about simultaneity and space being Euclidean turned out to
be wrong. Unlike the latter assumptions, however, the
assumption about resistance amounted to a dead end. All Newton
achieved in Book 2 with resistance forces was merely a curve-fit.

## 8. Book 3 of the *Principia*

Save for the short opening sections, “*Regulae
Philosophandi*” and “*Phenomena*,” Book 3, in contrast to
Books 1 and 2, is not marked off into sections. Nevertheless, the
main body of it does consist of four clearly separate parts: (1) the
derivation of the law of gravity (Props. 1-8); (2) implications of this
law for orbital and rotating bodies (from the corollaries to Prop. 8
through Prop. 24); (3) a quantitative derivation of select lunar
inequalities and the precession of the equinoxes from the law of
gravity (Props. 25-39); and (4) a solution for comet trajectories, with
examples and comments (Props. 40-42). These parts will be
discussed in sequence below.

Newton's first two rules of reasoning appeared in the first edition
(there labeled as
hypotheses^{[41]}),
the third rule was added in the second
edition, and the fourth rule, in the third edition. These are
rules intended to govern evidential reasoning in natural philosophy,
akin to rules of deductive reasoning except for their very much not
guaranteeing true conclusions from true premises. In particular,
Rule 2 authorizes the inference from same effect to same cause, a
notoriously invalid inference, and Rule 3 authorizes inductive
generalization to all bodies universally of those qualities of bodies
“that belong to all bodies on which experiments can be made.”
Newton's phrasing carries no suggestion that these rules yield truths
or even a high probability of truth. The operative phrase in both
Rules 3 and 4, for example, is properly translated “should be taken,”
and Rule 4 makes the provisional character of the authorized inferences
explicit:

In experimental philosophy, propositions gathered from phenomena by induction should be taken to be either exactly or very nearly true notwithstanding any contrary hypotheses, until yet other phenomena make such propositions either more exact or liable to exceptions.

The philosophic question why Newton's rules are appropriate is best addressed not by asking how they increase the probability of truth, but by asking whether there is some strategy in ongoing research for which these rules will both promote further discoveries and safeguard against dead-end garden paths that ultimately require all the supposed discoveries to be discarded.

Six astronomical phenomena are listed and discussed in the section
called “*Phenomena*” — most importantly, that
Mercury, Venus, Mars, Jupiter, and Saturn, and the satellites of the
latter two sweep out equal areas in equal times with respect to the
central bodies of their respective orbits, and their periods vary as
the 3/2 power of their mean distances from these bodies. The ellipse,
by the way, is not one of the phenomena. In Phenomenon 3 Newton rules
out the Ptolemaic system, just as Galileo had in his *Dialogue
Concerning the Two Chief World Systems*, by appealing to the
phases of Mercury and Venus and their absence in the case of Mars,
Jupiter, and Saturn to conclude that these five orbits encircle the
Sun. But this Phenomenon and all the others are carefully formulated
to remain neutral between the Copernican and Tychonic systems. In
Phenomenon 4 Boulliau's calculated orbits are treated on a par with
Kepler's, indicating that the phenomena do not rule out the
possibility that Boulliau's alternative to the area rule is correct.
Phenomenon 6 explicitly grants that the area rule holds only
approximately for the Moon, with a further remark indicating that none
of the phenomena are being put forward as holding exactly. This points
the way to the most reasonable reading of all of the phenomena: they
describe to reasonably high approximation, but not more than that, the
observations of the planets and their satellites made by Tycho and
others over a finite period of time — roughly from 1570 to the
time of Newton's writing. On this way of viewing the Phenomena, they
are in no way contentious or problematic. They leave entirely open not
only questions about whether any claims concerning the orbits made by
Kepler and his contemporaries hold exactly, but also questions about
whether any of these claims hold even remotely in other eras, past or
future. The Phenomena are thus not inconsistent with Descartes'
insistence that the motions are constantly changing.

The “deduction” of the law of universal gravity from the phenomena in
the first eight propositions of Book 3 has provoked a great deal of
controversy in the philosophical literature over the last century
or
so.^{[42]}
At
the heart of this controversy is the challenge posed by Pierre Duhem:
how can a deduction proceed from premises (the planets sweep out equal
areas in equal times and their orbits are stationary) to a conclusion,
the law of gravity, that then implies that the premises are false (the
planets do not sweep out equal areas in equal times and the orbits are
not stationary, but instead
precess)?^{[43]}
The answer is simple: Newton's
reasoning is approximative. He is using “if, then” statements
that have been shown in Book 1 to hold in “if … *quam
proxime*, then … *quam proxime*” form to infer
conclusions from premises that hold at least *quam proxime* over
a restricted period of time. Of course, this means that the
deduction shows only that the conclusions, most notably the law of
gravity, hold *quam proxime* over the restricted period of time
for which the premises hold. The Rules of Reasoning then license
the conclusion to be taken exactly, without restriction of space or
time. The conclusions, so taken, do indeed then show that the
premises hold only *quam proxime*, and not exactly. This
conclusion in no way contradicts the premises.

Recognizing that Newton's reasoning is approximative answers another
complaint about the “deduction” of universal gravity: Newton invokes
the proposition, *if bodies move uniformly in concentric circular
orbits whose periods vary as the 3/2 power of the radii, then the
centripetal forces acting on these bodies vary as the inverse-square of
the radii of the orbits*, knowing full well that observation had
established for centuries that the planets do not move uniformly in
circular
orbits.^{[44]}
Newton does indeed invoke this
proposition first to conclude (in Prop. 1) that, in modern parlance,
there is an inverse-square centripetal acceleration field around
Jupiter and Saturn and next to conclude (in Prop. 2) that there is an
inverse-square centripetal acceleration field around the
Sun.^{[45]}
The
orbits of the satellites of Jupiter were then considered to be
circular, and hence Newton's inference from their motion was not so
problematic. While, however, the orbits of Venus, Jupiter, and
Saturn were considered to be very nearly circular, the motion in them
had been known from before Ptolemy not to be uniform. Newton
expressly concedes that his inference of the inverse-square from the
3/2 power rule for the planets is only approximate when, in the very
next sentence, he remarks, “But this second part of the proposition is
proved with the greatest exactness from the fact that the aphelia are
at rest.” The absence of precession, however, can be used to
infer the inverse-square only for each orbit individually, not a
single, unified inverse-square centripetal acceleration field
encompassing all of the orbits. Newton is accordingly using the
3/2 rule for circular orbits to establish that an inverse-square field
holds around the Sun to at least a first approximation, and then using
the absence of precession of the individual orbits to tighten the
approximation.

Interpreting Newton's deduction of universal gravity as an exercise in
approximative reasoning answers a further complaint of Duhem's: insofar
as the area rule holds only to high approximation, so too do any number
of alternatives to it, such as Boulliau's geometric construction, and
hence Newton's “deduction” begs the question of why the area rule is to
be preferred to these
alternatives.^{[46]}
This question, however, is irrelevant
so long as the conclusion remains in the weak form, the law of gravity
holds *quam proxime* for the planets and their satellites over
the time period for which observations have shown the phenomena to hold
*quam proxime*. The phenomena really are sufficient to
reach the conclusion in this weak form. So, the complaint has
bite only when the law of gravity is taken to be exact. But
there, however, Newton does provide a response to it when he concludes
in Propositions 13 and 14 that the planets *would* describe
areas exactly proportional to the times in stationary orbits if “the
Sun *were* at rest and the remaining planets did not act upon
one
another.”^{[47]}
The reason, then, why the phenomena from which Newton proceeded in
the deduction have claim to being preferred to alternatives to them is
that the theory deduced from them, when taken to hold exactly,
identifies circumstances under which the phenomena would hold exactly,
as well. That this be the case amounts to a requirement on the
deduction from phenomena: the leap to taking the law of gravity as
exact is justified only if it yields circumstances in which the
phenomena from which it was inferred *would* hold
exactly.^{[48]}

This analysis of the “deduction” of universal gravity does
not answer two further complaints lodged against it. First, in
concluding that the centripetal force acting on the Moon is
inverse-square, Newton grants that the precession of the lunar orbit
implies an exponent of -2 and 4/243 for the force rather than exactly
-2, but then claims that the small fraction can be accounted for by
the perturbing action of the Sun's gravity. But the magnitude for the
action of the Sun that he gives in Proposition
3^{[49]}
is twice the value he later in Book 3
indicates is the correct value. This lacuna was not resolved by
Alexis-Claude Clairaut until two decades after Newton died.
Second, when Newton invokes the third law of motion in the corollaries
to Proposition 5, he is tacitly assuming that, for example, Jupiter and
the Sun are, in effect, directly interacting. In other words, he
is ignoring the alternative favored by Huygens that some unseen medium
is effecting the centripetal force on Jupiter, a medium that can in
principle absorb the linear momentum which Newton is assuming is being
transferred to the Sun. Huygens may well have perceived this
lacuna, to which Cotes explicitly called Newton's attention while he
was preparing the second
edition.^{[50]}

The group of propositions following the deduction of universal gravity gives indications of the evidential strategy that lies behind the leap to taking this law to be exact. Immediately upon concluding first that the planets would sweep out equal areas in equal times in exact ellipses and then that the orbits would be exactly stationary were it not for the gravitational interactions among the planets, Newton calls attention to the easiest to observe deviations from this idealization, the then still mysterious vagaries in the motions of Jupiter and Saturn which Newton attributes to their gravitational interaction. Because, according to the theory, the idealization would hold exactly in the specified circumstances, these and all other deviations must result from further forces not taken into account in the idealized case. Identifying these forces and showing that, according to the theory, they do produce the deviations is a way for ongoing research to marshal continuing evidence to bear on the theory of gravity. To put the point differently, the initial idealizations that Newton identifies can serve as the starting point for a process of successive approximations that should yield increasingly close agreement with the complex true motions. These idealizations are especially well suited for this purpose precisely because, according to the theory, they would hold exactly were no other forces at work, and hence every deviation from them should be physically telling, and not just, for example, an accidental feature of a curve-fit. Pursuit of such a research program of successive approximations promises to yield either further evidence for the theory of gravity when the program is successful or the exceptions Newton speaks of in Rule 4 that require the theory to be revised.

Of the other results developed in the group of propositions following
the deduction of universal gravity, the most heralded at the time were
the defense of Copernicanism in Proposition 12 and the identification
of the cause of the tides in Proposition 24 — two topics that Kepler,
Galileo, and Descartes had all addressed. Nevertheless, the two
Propositions that proved most important were 19 and 20, which
respectively derive the non-spheroidal figure of the Earth and the
variation of surface gravity with latitude under the assumption that
the density of the Earth is uniform. This is the only passage in
the *Principia* that Newton reworked extensively in both the
second and then again in the third edition. As Newton was fully
aware, and Huygens and a few others realized, these are the only
results in the *Principia* that depend on *universal*
gravity — that is, inverse-square gravity directed toward every
particle of matter forming the Earth — and not merely macroscopic
*celestial* gravity — inverse-square gravity directed toward
celestial bodies. In his *Discourse on the Cause of
Gravity*, Huygens offered an alternative theoretical account of the
figure of the Earth and the variation of surface gravity, and he
claimed to have evidence confirming it and hence refuting Newton's
*universal*
gravity.^{[51]}
In part because evidence on the figure
of the Earth and the variation of gravity with latitude were accessible
in expeditions to the equator, these were the results in the
*Principia* that were the first to receive concerted critical
attention during the 1730s and 1740s. There was a complication in
all this, however. The extremely precise results for both the
figure of the Earth and the variation of gravity that Newton tabulated
in the second and third editions were based on uniform density, and
hence, just like Keplerian motion, represented an idealization,
departures from which would point to non-uniformities of density.
Not until Clairaut's *Theory of the Figure of the Earth* did
means become available to calculate the effects of non-uniformities in
the
density.^{[52]}

Propositions 25 through 35 derive quantitative results for three lunar inequalities — the systematic departure from the area rule called the “the variation,” the 18 year motion of the line of nodes, and the fluctuating inclination of the orbit — from the perturbing action of the Sun. For all three Newton starts with a circular orbit, so these too involve departures from an idealization. The values he obtained for the different components of the solar perturbing force in Proposition 25 and subsequently, as needed, were accurate to several significant figures. All three derivations, which are mathematically demanding, were successful in obtaining agreement with the values of the inequalities obtained from observation, especially so the derivation for the recession of the lunar nodes, for which he achieves agreement with the known value to better than 98 percent. (Newton must have been mystified by the failure of his seemingly parallel derivation of the 9 year precession of the line of apsides to achieve better than 50 percent agreement.)

The Scholium following Proposition 35 opens with the explanation for
the preceding efforts on the lunar inequalities: “I wished to show by
these computations of the lunar motions that the lunar motions can be
computed from their causes by the theory of gravity”
[**P**, 869]. Newton never found a way of deriving
the precession of the lunar apogee from the theory of gravity, and
consequently he never succeeded with a complete, gravity-derived
account of the lunar
orbit.^{[53]}
The mathematical treatment of the three
lunar inequalities nevertheless did provide added support for his
theory of gravity. It also introduced the idea of attacking the
problem of the true orbit in a sequence of successive approximations by
calculating perturbations in motion in an assumed orbit caused by the
gravitational action of the Sun. This was not only an entirely
new approach to the then unsolved problem of simply describing the
motion of the Moon, an approach that proceeded from the physical cause
to the motion; it was also the beginnings of the perturbational
approach that dominated all of celestial mechanics from the middle of
the eighteenth century until late in the
twentieth.^{[54]}
As difficult as
Propositions 25 through 35 were for readers at the time — and still
are for readers now — they crucially promoted the further research on
the complicated orbital motions that ultimately supplied overwhelming
support for Newton's theory of gravity.

It was a real breakthrough when Newton discovered that the gravitational forces of the Sun and Moon acting on an oblately spheroidal Earth would produce a wobble of the Earth that, at least qualitatively, could account for the precession of the Equinoxes. No physical explanation for this phenomenon had been proposed before. Newton faced a problem, however, in trying to carry out a quantitative derivation of the precession: he knew the magnitude of the gravitational action of the Sun on the Earth but not that of the Moon, for he could not obtain the mass of the Moon in the way he had for the Sun, Jupiter, and Saturn insofar as no bodies orbit the Moon. Propositions 36 and 37 endeavor to infer the force of the Moon on the Earth from the difference in the heights of the tides when the Sun and Moon are in conjunction and in opposition. In the first edition Newton managed to derive a value for the rate of the precession in good agreement with the known value, but during the quarter century between the first and second editions he concluded that the value he had used for the Moon's force (6 and 1/3 times the Sun's force) was much too large. The derivation of the precession was therefore extensively revised in the second edition, using a new value for the Moon's force (4.4815 times the Sun's force, still more than a factor of 2 greater than the correct value). In all editions the derivation in Proposition 39 treated the wobble not directly as the motion of a rigid body, but by analogy with the motion of the lunar nodes. By the standards of our present physics, no part of Book 3 is further off-base than Newton's solution for the precession. The phenomenon, however, subsequently provided important evidence for Newton's theory of gravity when d'Alembert in 1749 carried out a successful derivation based on rigid body motion and a correct value of the Moon's force derived from the then recently discovered phenomenon of the nutation of the Earth.

Newton's account of the tides in Propositions 24, 36, and 37 was much heralded not only at the time, but still today. He is nevertheless receiving more credit for this than he is due. He did identify solar and lunar gravity as the forces driving the tides, but this is all he did. He ignored the rotation of the Earth, and worse he considered only the radial component of the solar and lunar gravitational forces in these three propositions. In fact, the radial component of these forces has a very small effect compared with the transradial component, that is, the component perpendicular to the radial component. All of this became clear in the 1770s when Laplace developed the mathematical theory of tidal motion from which all subsequent work has proceeded.

Book 3 ends with a revolutionary analysis of comet trajectories that
occupies roughly one-third of the total length of the Book in all three
editions. This analysis was slow in coming. As late as June
1686, Newton wrote: “the third [book] wants the Theory of Comets”
[**C**, II, 437]. What made the problem difficult,
as compared to planet trajectories, was the need to work from a small
number of imprecise one-shot observations made from a moving
Earth. The method presented in the *Principia* fits a
parabola iteratively to the observations, employing novel
finite-difference methods that Newton later expanded into a full tract
in mathematics, “Methodis Differentialis.” The method presupposes
the theory of gravity first in opting for a parabola and second in
assuming that the inverse-square centripetal forces known from the
planets act on comets along their entire trajectory. The text
notes that the trajectories may well be ellipses, but the period of
return in that case would be the best way of determining the
ellipse. (The parabola approximates the high-curvature end of
ellipses with high eccentricity.) The proposal that comets may
return was novel, but even more revolutionary at the time was the claim
that they button-hook around the Sun, implying that what had sometimes
in the past been taken for two distinct comets were really one comet
before and after perihelion.

In the first edition the method was applied only to the comet of
1680-81. The results are presented in a one-foot long diagram on
the only fold-out page in the edition. Nothing like this diagram,
shown in Figure 3, had ever appeared in print before. The
diagram continued to appear in the next two editions, though in reduced
form not requiring a fold-out in the third. In the second edition
the method was refined and applied as well to the comets of 1664-65,
1683, and 1682 reflecting research Halley had carried out and published
in his *Astronomiae Cometicae Synopsis* of 1705. The comet
of 1682, now known as Halley's comet, was singled out as being
sufficiently similar in trajectory to the comet of 1607 to warrant the
proposal that it returns every 75 years.

Figure 3

Added in the third edition was the retrograde comet of 1723, for which Bradley had supplied comparatively accurate observations and the method correspondingly displayed its most impressive success, with no discrepancies between the calculated and observed positions exceeding 1 minute of arc in either longitude or latitude. This suggested that the more exacting the observations entering into the calculation, the more accurate was the method.

Because Newton's theory of comet trajectories depended only on that
part of the theory of gravity that was least controversial —
inverse-square centripetal accelerations everywhere around the Sun
— it did not provoke much philosophical resistance. The success
of the method provided evidence that these centripetal forces act
equally on comets, contrary to Hooke's proposal in his *Cometa*
of 1678 that comets must consist of a fundamentally different kind of
material from the planets insofar as they do not respond to the forces
directed toward the Sun in the same way. The success of the method
also provided strong evidence that inverse-square forces toward the
Sun hold throughout the space surrounding it, for not only do comets
traverse the spaces between the planet orbits, but also their
trajectories, in contrast to those of the then known planets, are
often highly inclined with respect to the plane of the ecliptic. Most
of all, however, the success of the method provided the most
compelling evidence against not only Cartesian vortices, but all
theories claiming that the planets are carried around the Sun by fluid
vortices. Corollary 3 to Proposition 39 in all three editions
summarizes the argument:

Hence also it is manifest that the heavens are lacking in resistance. For the comets, following paths that are oblique and sometimes contrary to the course of the planets, move in all directions very freely and preserve their motions for a very long time even when these are contrary to the course of planets. [P, 895].

This was the argument that convinced Huygens when he read the first
edition, and it became all the more compelling thereafter as the method
was so successful with further
comets.^{[55]}

The added evidence supplied by the theory of comets highlights a sometimes overlooked aspect of Book 3. The development of evidence for the theory of gravity in it does not end with the “deduction” of the law of universal gravity at the beginning, but continues all the way through the Book. During the eighteenth century attention focused overwhelmingly on the evidence supplied by Newton's theory of the figure of the Earth and the variation of surface gravity, the theory of the tides, the quantitative derivations of select lunar inequalities, the derivation of the precession of the equinoxes, and the theory of comets. This suggests that, both then and now, the “deduction” of universal gravity should not be read in isolation from the rest of Book 3, but instead the entire Book should be seen as offering a sustained evidential argument for the theory. Read this way in the context of the rest of the Book, the “deduction” is most appropriately viewed as intended to establish universal gravity, but only provisionally, as a theory on which further research is to be predicated, research that will continue to bring evidence to bear on the theory.

## 9. The Scientific Achievement of the *Principia*

From Halley's anonymous review of the first edition of the
*Principia* forward, there has been a marked tendency to
overstate what the *Principia* achieved, glossing over the many
loose ends it left for others to recognize and address. A
consequence of this is an equal tendency to distort the context of the
enormous advances made in both mechanics and orbital astronomy during
the eighteenth century, diminishing the difficulties those following
Newton faced and their accomplishments in resolving them. The
*Principia* is peculiar in this regard, for a list of its
achievements without mentioning their loose ends overstates what it
accomplished, but a list of its loose ends risks understating its
extraordinary achievements. In an effort to strike a balance we
here list eleven major scientific issues of the time to which Book 3
supplied answers in the sequence listed, the answers, and the most
important loose ends in the reasoning offered in the evidential
arguments for those answers.

**1.** *What physically retains the planets in
orbits around the Sun and their satellites in orbit around
them?* Newton's answer — *inverse-square gravity, one in
kind with everyday terrestrial gravity* — turned on a largely
suppressed failure to account for more than half of the precession of
the lunar orbit, it tacitly assumed interaction between the Sun and
Jupiter and the other individual planets, and it raised unanswered
questions about whether the perihelia of the planetary orbits do or do
not precess.

**2.** *How does gravity vary, both below and
above the surface of the Earth?* In the absence of confirming
data, Newton's answer — *to a first approximation, linearly with
distance to the center below the surface, and inversely with the square
of the distance above it* — presupposed uniform density in the
first part and a spherical Earth with spherically symmetric density in
the second, and therefore left open the possibility that gravity is
constant near the surface of the Earth, just as Huygens continued to
claim in his response to the Principia [**HD**, 153],
citing supporting evidence.

**3.** *What are the relative densities of the
planets, with respect to one another and to the Sun?* Newton
gives theory-dependent answers for Jupiter, Saturn, and the Earth in
the corollaries to Proposition 8, but the one for the Earth, even in
the third edition, depended on a still questionable value for the
horizontal solar parallax (required to determine the distance of the
Moon from the Earth in astronomical units), and no corroborating
evidence for these answers had emerged, such as from the actions of
Jupiter and Saturn on one another.

**4.** *Is there some principled way to
resolve the dispute between the Copernican and Tychonic systems and
thereby settle the question of the proper center to which all the
motions in our planetary system should be referred?* Newton's
answer — *the center of gravity of the system, about which the Sun
circulates at comparatively small distances* — depended on the
assumed applicability of the third law of motion in claiming that the
Sun is in motion, and the precise location of the center of gravity
remained open in the absence of values for the relative masses of
Mercury, Venus, and Mars.

**5.** *What are the true motions of the
planets, and which, if any, of the schemes for calculating planet
locations is to be preferred, Kepler's or one of the alternatives to
it?* Newton's answer was not simple: “*If the sun
were at rest and the remaining planets did not act upon one another,
their orbits would be elliptical, having the sun in their common focus,
and they would describe areas proportional to the times;” and the
aphelia and nodes would be stationary. The Keplerian system,
amended in the manner of Horrocks to infer mean distances from the
periods, is therefore the preferred approximation to the true
motions*. The main loose-end in this answer was whether the
actual motions do deviate from the Keplerian ideal, and if so, whether
all the deviations could be attributed to specific forces,
gravitational or otherwise. A further loose-end, addressed in
part in Book 3, was whether the non-Keplerian motion of the Moon can be
shown not to be a counterexample to Newton's argument in the case of
the planets.

**6.** *Is the motion of Jupiter and Saturn
aberrant and, if so, what are the inequalities in it and what causes
them?* Newton answered *yes, because they interact
gravitationally, and the dominant inequality has a period corresponding
to the 19 years between their consecutive conjunctions*. (The
second part of this answer did not appear in the first edition.)
By the early 1720s it had become clear that the dominant period in the
anomalies of motion of these two planets is not that of the time
between conjunctions, but something of much longer duration, giving
rise to the questions of what the vagaries actually are and whether
they can truly be derived from Jupiter's and Saturn's gravitational
forces.

**7.** *How, if at all, does the Earth's
surface gravity vary with latitude, and how, if at all, does the
Earth's figure differ from a sphere?* Newton's answer changes
from the first to the second to the third edition, but in all cases
vagaries in the cited data raise the question of what the actual
variations are. Also, because his idealized theoretical
calculation assumes uniform density, his answer raises the questions
whether the density of the Earth is uniform and whether the true figure
of the Earth and variation of surface gravity can be reconciled with
non-uniformities in density.

**8.** *What precisely is the motion of the
Moon, and what gives rise to the inequalities in it, inequalities not
observed in the motions of the satellites of Jupiter and
Saturn?* Newton's answer to the second part is the perturbing
effect of the Sun's gravity, leaving the answer to the first in the
form of a promissory note: work out all the perturbations from solar
gravity, and you will have the answer. The major open question
was whether the complex motion of the line of apsides and the
inequality known as the evection — the two features for which the
Horrocksian cinematic model that Newton had employed in the Scholium to
Book 3, Proposition 35 had resorted to an old-fashoined epicycle — can
be derived from the action of solar gravity.

**9.** *What causes the tides, and why do they
vary in time as well as from place to place in the way they
do?* Because Newton's answer — *the gravitational action
of the Sun and the Moon* — was merely qualitative, it left room to
question whether the Moon attracts the Earth and, if so, by how strong
a force. Also left open was the question of how the inertia and
viscosity of the seas and the rotation of the Earth affect the tides, a
question requiring a dynamic analysis of the motions of the seas in
response to solar and lunar gravity.

**10.** *What physically produces the
precession of the equinoxes?* Newton's derivation of the
precession from the gravitational action of the Moon and Sun raised
three unresolved questions: What are the correct values for the mass of
the Moon and the oblateness of the Earth? Is the resulting motion
of the Earth really analogous to that of the lunar nodes? How
does the varying inclination of the Moon affect the calculated
motion?

**11.** *What trajectories do comets
describe*? Newton's answer — *conic-sections that can at
least be approximated by parabolas in the region in which they are
observable* — gave weight to the question whether the parabolic
trajectory works for all comets, and not just the comet of 1680-81 in
the case of the first edition, the three others analyzed in the second,
and the additional one in the third. The *Principia* also
left open questions about how the gravity of Jupiter and Saturn might
affect comet motions, whether any significance should be attached to
the residual discrepancies between theory and observation in Newton's
results, and which, if any, comets do return in some regular
fashion.

Careful reading of the *Principia* makes clear that, although
unforthcoming about any of the loose ends, Newton was perfectly aware
of them all, in one way or another flagging each for the benefit of the
highly astute reader. An instructive way to present the history
of eighteenth century research in the wake of the *Principia* is
to trace how each of the loose ends became a prominent matter of
concern and was then resolved, at least to the point of being removed
as in any way a threat to Newton's theory of gravity. This
process of addressing the loose ends in Book 3 did not get underway
until the 1730s, after Newton had died. During his lifetime the
most pressing complaint against the *Principia* was the absence
of a mechanism to account for its action save for action at a distance,
which Newton himself regarded as “so great an absurdity, that I
believe no man who has in philosophical matters a competent faculty of
thinking can ever fall into
it.”^{[56]}
The absence of a mechanism, however,
was not something that Newton himself regarded as a loose-end in the
*Principia*, for he insisted that all the conclusions listed
above could be established, and any loose ends in them resolved,
through the law of universal gravity alone, independently of the
mechanism responsible for it. Over the decades after he died,
those engaged in research predicated on his theory of gravity came
increasingly to this same view of the question of mechanism.

## 10. The Methodology of the *Principia*

In two passages that remained word for word the same in all three
editions Newton announced that the *Principia* was meant to
illustrate a new approach to empirical inquiry. Neither the
remark about deriving forces from phenomena of motion and then motions
from these forces in the Preface to the first edition nor the remark
about comparing a generic mathematical theory of centripetal forces
with the phenomena in order to find out which conditions of force
actually hold at the end of Book 1, Section 11, however, shed much
light on just what this new approach is supposed to be. Other
than these two passages, the only notable remark about methodology is
the famous passage, quoted earlier, from the General Scholium added in
the second edition as a final, parting statement:

I have not as yet been able to deduce from phenomena the reason for these properties of gravity, and I do not feign hypotheses. For whatever is not deduced from the phenomena must be called a hypothesis; and hypotheses, whether metaphysical or physical, or based on occult qualities, or mechanical, have no place in experimental philosophy. In this experimental philosophy, propositions are deduced from the phenomena and are made general by induction. The impenetrability, mobility, and impetus of bodies, and the laws of motion and law of gravity have been found by this method. And it is enough that gravity should really exist and should act according to the laws that we have set forth and should suffice for all the motions of the heavenly bodies and of our sea. [P, 943]

Much of the discussion of the methodology of the *Principia*
in the philosophical literature, from the eighteenth century down to
the present time, has taken this clearly polemical passage as the
starting point, generating unfortunately more heat than
light.^{[57]}
This is
not the place to grapple with all the controversies surrounding this
passage. Some guarded comments about the methodology of the
*Principia* may nevertheless prove helpful.

It is scarcely surprising that the unprecedented success of Newton's
theory of gravity stimulated interest in the methodology of the
*Principia*. The obvious thought was to emulate this
success in other areas by following the same method. But then,
even independently of questions about what the method was, one has to
consider exactly how it contributed to the success. Viewed in
retrospect, Book 2 makes clear that this question has no simple
answer. If Newton followed the same method in Book 2, then the
failure of his effort on resistance forces — even worse, the failure
that he did not recognize — shows that the method was no guarantee of
success. The empirical world must cooperate for it to
succeed.

Two aspects of the general thrust of the method are perfectly
clear. First, Newton viewed it as contrasting with what was then
called the method of hypotheses — that is, the method of putting
forward hypotheses that reached far beyond the available data and then
marshalling evidence for them by deducing testable conclusions
from
them.^{[58]}
Second, Newton viewed the method as requiring that questions be
regarded as open when empirical considerations had not yet yielded
answers to them. Whatever may have been required for empirical
consideration to establish a theoretical conclusion, and whatever the
status, provisional or otherwise, any such established conclusion was
supposed to have, Newton viewed the method as allowing — even
mandating — that theoretical answers to some questions could be
established even while other closely related questions remained in
abeyance. In particular, to use Newton's phrasing from the
Scholium that ends Section 11, the physical species and physical
proportions of forces could, in the appropriate sense, be established
even though the question of their physical causes remained open.
The clear aim of the method was accordingly to limit theoretical claims
to “inductive generalizations,” as specified by the Rules of Reasoning,
of conclusions dictated by experiment and observation.

Newton's eschewing the method of hypotheses produced no controversy at
the time. In a manuscript revision of his “Essay on the causes of
celestial motions” Leibniz even adopted Newtonian phrasing: “What
follows is not based on hypotheses but is deduced from phenomena by the
laws of motion” [Aiton, 1972, 132]. A large fraction of those who had
read at most small portions of the *Principia* and depended on
others for their knowledge of it most likely saw Newton as having
hypothesized inverse-square attraction and hence as in fact following
the method of hypotheses. In the years after Newton died, the
most celebrated issues receiving concentrated research arose not from
how Newton had arrived at universal gravity, but from the claims he had
derived from it concerning the figure of the Earth, the vagaries in the
motions of Jupiter and Saturn, and the motion of the Moon. The
individuals at the center of this research certainly saw these issues
as a test of Newton's theory of gravity, but the distinction between
taking the theory as a hypothesis and taking it as a provisionally
established conclusion was a distinction without much difference for
them. Still, it is worth noting that the conclusion Clairaut
first drew from the factor of 2 discrepancy in the motion of the lunar
apogee was not that Newton's theory of gravity was false, but that the
inverse-square needed to be supplemented by a 1/*r*^{4}
term — a response fully in keeping with Newton's fourth rule of
reasoning.

The aspect of Newton's method that did produce controversy at the time
was his insisting that he had established conclusions about the
physical species and physical proportions of celestial forces while
holding questions about their physical causes in abeyance. This
was the core of the complaint by Cartesians that the *Principia*
was a work of mathematics, not physics. For Newton's two most
important critics, however, Huygens and Leibniz, the objection was not
to holding the question of physical causes open, but to accepting
certain conclusions that in their mind ruled out the very possibility
of a proper answer to the question of physical cause. The defect
in Newton's method lay in its not imposing the constraint on theory
that all action be through contact, and not at a distance. The
violation of this constraint lay behind Huygens's remarking,

Concerning the Cause of the tides given by M. Newton, I am by no means satisfied, nor by all the other Theories that he builds upon his Principle of Attraction, which seems to me absurd, as I have already mentioned in the addition to theDiscourse on Gravity. And I have often wondered how he could have given himself all the trouble of making such a number of investigations and difficult calculations that have no other foundation than this very principle. [OH, IX, 538]

This, then, was the truly controversial aspect of Newton's method in
the *Principia* with which the next generation had to come to
some accommodation before research on its loose ends could
become
respectable.^{[59]}

The idea of developing a mathematical theory in order to enable
experiment and observation to provide theory-mediated answers to
questions did not originate with the *Principia*. In his
*Horologium Oscillatorium*, the work the *Principia* most
emulates, Huygens had developed a mathematical theory of pendulum
motion that enabled measurement of the length and period of pendulums
to provide a robust precise answer to the question, how far does an
object fall in the absence of air resistance in the first second? —
the measure then of the strength of surface gravity; and he had
developed a mathematical theory of uniform circular motion that enabled
measurement of the height and period of conical pendulums to provide a
second answer to this question. By the time Newton started on the
*Principia* pendulums had been used for more than a decade to
answer questions about how surface gravity varies between Paris and
other locations. The special problem Newton saw himself as having
to face in using mathematical theory to a comparable end in the
*Principia* stemmed from his realization, expressed in the
“Copernican scholium,” that the phenomena of orbital motions are
inordinately complicated and hence open to multiple competing
descriptions. The problem thus became one of finding a way to use
mathematical theory to draw definite robust answers to questions about
the physical species and proportions of forces from these
phenomena. These answers opened the way to pursing the true
motions in a sequence of successive approximations, in the process of
which continuing evidence could be brought to bear on the theory,
potentially delimiting its exactness and its universal applicability in
the manner Newton had noted in his fourth rule of reasoning.
Because the “Copernican scholium” was unknown at the time, the
subtleties of the new method Newton followed to get around
this problem went largely unnoticed.

Needless to say, these comments do not answer the philosophically most
interesting question of how the method of the *Principia*
contributed to the unprecedented success of its theory of
gravity. Hopefully, however, they do remove some sources of
confusion that have distorted so much of the philosophical discussion
of the *Principia*.

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*The Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy*, tr. Andrew Motte, to which is added “The Laws of the Moon's Motion, according to Gravity,” by John Machin, London 1729. (The Motte translation of the 1726 edition, without Machin's addendum, has been reissued as*The Principia*, Amherst, NY: Prometheus, 1995.) - –––,
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**[U]***Unpublished Scientific Papers of Isaac Newton*, ed. A. R. Hall and M. B. Hall, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1962. (Contains several manuscripts associated with the*Principia*.) - –––,
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*Introduction to Newton's ‘Principia’*, Cambridge: Harvard University Press. - –––, 1980,
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*Reading the*Principia*: The Debate on Newton's Mathematical Methods for Natural Philosophy from 1687 to 1736*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Herivel, J., 1965,
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*Unrolling Time: Christiaan Huygens and the Mathematization of Nature*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

## Other Internet Resources

## Related Entries

Descartes, René | Duhem, Pierre | Kant, Immanuel | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Mach, Ernst | Newton, Isaac | Newton, Isaac: views on space, time, and motion | scientific revolutions | Whewell, William