Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Otto Neurath

Visual Education

After 1921, Neurath became secretary of the Cooperative Housing and Allotment Association in Vienna, a public housing program. From an administrative and political standpoint, he remained interested in central management but shifted towards guild socialism—according to which professional guilds, common in Vienna, acquired enhanced social and political roles. With the experience of having directed the Museum of War Economy of Leipzig in 1918, his educational and social ambitions led him to found a similar institution in Vienna, and he became Director of the Settlement Museum or Museum of City Planning (1919-1924), soon renamed Social and Economic Museum (1924-1934), supporting and communicating reform policies on housing, health and education. The methods of visual education started out of these resources and his exhibitions became internationally renowned and commissioned.

The application of simple colors and figures along with the use of lino-cutting and printing methods were best for the production of graphic symbols; but they were all alien to Vienna's recent artistic movements. One of the earliest artists willing and able to work in those formats was Erwin Bernath, a Swiss living in Vienna. Neurath's displays at the GESOLEI exhibition (Große Ausstellung für Gesundheit, soziale Fürsorge und Leibesübungen) in Düsseldorf in 1926 provided the occasion for Neurath's acquaintance with the Cologne artist Gerd Arntz. Arntz had held similar revolutionary socialist views in Germany after 1918. He published his expressive modernist clear-cut figures combining the dramatic contrast and simplicity of the woodcut and linocut techniques of German expressionism and the geometrical clarity, order and simplicity of Russian Constructivism. Neurath hired him in 1928 to begin the professional design of a visual language for the public communication of historical and statistical information (see Figures 1 and 2 below) (Gerd Arntz Web Archive).

Figure 1
Figure 1

Figure 2
Figure 2

The pictograms of the Vienna Method of Picture Statistics, later in the internationalist phase, in exile, relabeled ISOTYPE (International System Of TYpogra phic Picture Education) method, expressed the modernist ideals of minimalism, functionalism, of design, with the factuality, universality and neutrality, relative autonomy and stability, of the visual with respect to interpretation and cultural references. It had an abstracted, simplified, elemental and Gestalt-like conventional quality intended to convey a concept through the constructed representation of a typical individual—also similar to Bauhaus ‘essential types’, a graphic product of the same German intellectual culture of typology which included taxonomy, morphology, physiognomics (discussed by Neurath in 1921), eugenics and Hempel and Oppenheim's logical analysis of types (Hempel and Oppenheim 1936). The resulting symbol was both an index and an icon, in Peirce's semiotics, adopted by Neurath's American intellectual ally and encyclopedia co-editor, Charles Morris (Lupton 1986). Morris offered an American-inspired general theory of signs, which synthesized the formal accounts by Leibniz, Frege, Russell and Carnap, with naturalistic and pragmatist accounts of knowledge, language, communication and social behavior by William James, Charles Peirce and George Herbert Mead.

Like the political context, a broader context of modernist ideas, projects, practitioners and institutions straddles the boundary between art and philosophy, education and politics, theory and practice, individual and social. In 1929 Philip Frank's brother the architect Josef Frank gave a talk to the Verein Ernst Mach, ‘Modern world conception and architecture’. Frank became the chief architect for the Austrian model housing estate (Werkbundsiedlung) and even design Neurath's Social and Economic Museum when it moved to the ground floor of the New Town Hall. Frank compartmentalized the space into areas where charts were displayed together around one topic and people were brought together to discuss them (Neurath M. 1974, 142). Carnap, Feigl and Neurath gave lectures at the Bauhaus School in Dessau. Franz Roh, author of Post-Expressionism (1925), was a close friend of Carnap from their student days in Jena and intellectual motor of the modernist Neue Sachlichkeit (New Objectivity or Factuality) movement. The anti-metaphysical, formal, constructive, and pragmatic character of logical empiricist works resonated with the constructive, reformist, anti-ornamental, functional and international aesthetics of modernism (Galison 1990, Galison 1996, Dhams 2004, and for a less mechanical and foundationalist reading of the modernist connection, Potochnik and Yap 2006).

Neurath lectured on 27 May 1929 with the talk ‘Pictorial statistics and the Present’ and 9 June 1930 with ‘History and economy; two lectures’. Carnap lectured during the third week of October 1929 with ‘Science and Life’, ‘Task and content of science’, ‘The logical construction of the world’, and ‘The four-dimensional world of modern physics’ (Dahms 2004, 362-6). Carnap told his audience ‘I work in science, and you in visible forms; the two are only different sides of a single life’ (Galison, 1990, 710). Frank became a founding member of the Congrès Internationale d'Architecture Moderne started at La Sarraz, Switzerland, in 1928, chaired by Cornelius van Eesteren, city planner in Amsterdam. The CIAM's philosophy became analytical, analysis through survey preceded synthesis in design. The Netherlands became the main destination for immigration of German architects, especially modernists associated to the New Objectivity and Bauhaus movements. The CIAM invited Neurath to become member and to participate at their fourth congress, in 1933, between Marseille and Athens, where an exhibition was held on ‘The Functional City’ to speak on the Vienna Method of picture language: ‘the problems of urbanism are fundamentally problems of social order. But those are better represented in the form of schemes of visual statistics than in the form of geographic maps.’ (Neurath 1933, 1154, quoted in Faludi 406). Inseparable from the cognitive theory of visual language was a pluralist, anti-foundational theory of knowledge and planning: Experts and planners, with analyses, arguments and calculations can only put forth (incommensurable) alternative possibilities, patterns or solutions but reach no definite unique conclusion, which requires a ‘preparedness to act’, ‘making a decision of performing an action’ based on a ‘path of life’ and attitude.

With Morris as co-editor of the International Encyclopedia for Unified Science, Neurath felt encouraged to plan for a visual Thesaurus (an extension of children's education and the Enlightenment Encyclopedic tradition he discussed with Einstein). Morris contributed an essay ‘Foundations of the Theory of Signs’ (Morris 1938) as a framework for understanding the intersubjectivity of scientific language and knowledge, with a reference to iconic signs, although without an explicit reference to Neurath's Isotype. He would mention Neurath's plan of the visual thesaurus in Isotype language in his personal account of the Encyclopedia (Morris 1960, also in Neurath 1973, 67).

The visualized concept could be used in charts to convey quantitative information. The signs formed a language through their design: through reduction (empiricist abstraction) and consistency (coherence) in design. We have here the linguistic turn and the logical and empiricist dimensions (Müller 1991). The semiotics of the pictorial language is based on rules that constrain the design of symbols (Müller 1991): (1) Basic symbols must be self-evident, clear in themselves, representatives of a general concept or type; (2) symbols must be independent of color; (3) the use of color is not regulated in general; (4) symbols must be drawn without perspective; (5) symbols must leave a vivid lasting impression on the mind; (6) symbols must be combinable; (7) symbol can stand for a number of things, as a graphic unit, and a number of symbols then stand for a corresponding multiple number of things; (8) pictorial statistics are to be red from top left to bottom right like a book, except when comparing national statistics, on a geographical map; (9) combinations of symbols may form a unit of information like a story. Clearly, the pictorial language is semantically, syntactically and pragmatically limited and underdeveloped.

No rules of translation between the verbal and iconic were univocal. The relation between the quantitative, verbal, and expert information, and the final visual representation was described as a transformation, and the expert in charge of carrying out this task was called a transformer (Transformator), Marie Reidemeister, later Marie Neurath, trained in mathematics and art was a chief transformer (Neurath 1933/1973, 222, Neurath, M. 1974, 136, and Kinross 1990, 42).

Like Gestalt psychology and aesthetics, art history, cartography, geography, medicine, engineering, industrial management, statistics and other disciplines relevant to the project at hand, the production of Isotype work was an instance of scientific attitude through its commitment to empirical testing and a cooperative, holistic and synthetic process of production: at the levels of graphic design and intellectual disciplinary integration. The scientific dimension of Isotype work was established by the empirical status of its source sciences (Neurath, M. 1974, 136); testing was hardly strict or systematic.

Testing educational materials and producing visual attraction to information as a cognitive property took advantage of opportunities to reach target audiences developed by the educational institutions and by the economy; in particular, marketing practices. Regarding the latter, Neurath praised the value of some techniques in advertising (Neurath 1944, 57, and Neurath 1925/1973, 214). Regarding testing, for still images in Vienna Marie Neurath mentions ‘experiments’ which ‘were made whether such arrangements affected understandability’ (Neurath M. 1974, 131). In The Hague, according to Neurath, Isotype material was given to children of ages 4-10 at a Montessori school and psychology students monitored peoples' reactions to charts at public exhibition (Neurath 1946, 99). About educational films, including Neurath's animations for producer and director Paul Rotha's documentaries, were often tested as part of the marketing research practices adopted by production companies to test audiences at controlled screenings calls ‘mass observations’ (see, for instance, Marie Neurath's reference to ‘testing [films'] effectiveness’ during public viewings, in Neurath M., 1974, 143, and the Report on ‘Short Diagrammatic Film’ From Mass-Observation M-O 25.11.41, in Neurath-Rotha Correspondence, Isotype Institute Archive, University of Reading; Cat forthcoming and Cat and Paydar forthcoming).

But the general success of the visual language was suggested by the international scale of the commissions received and instruction for the application of the method: from Russia, between 1931 and 1934, Mexico in 1936, and the US, to Nigeria and China. After touring Germany and exhibitions in The Hague and Chicago in 1929, in 1931 the Soviet embassy in Vienna invited Neurath to establish a Museum of Economy and Society in Moscow. The Council of People's Commissars decreed: ‘All public and co-operative organisations, unions and schools are directed to use picture statistics according to the method of Dr. Neurath.’ Neurath's personal and intellectual efforts regarding unity of science and pictorial language were enthusiastically chronicled in the United States by his maternal first cousin and science editor of the New York Times, Waldemar Kaempffert (Weybright 1936, Kaempffert 1938 and Kaempffert 1939). In terms that resonated with urban America, Neurath was described as a social scientist, social showman and practical man (Weybright 1936).

In The Hague in 1933, Neurath established the International Foundation for Visual Education to house and continue international Isotype activities. A year later he was in Moscow discussing Isotype method and exhibitions with the Russian government when a Catholic fascist government rose to power in Austria. He was denounced as a communist and fled to exile to The Hague, where he was joined by Marie Reidemeister and Gerd Arntz. Books became important vehicles of the educational mission of the Isotype project, especially Modern Man in the Making (1939) and Tuberculosis (1939). In exile in Britain in 1940, Neurath and his wife resumed Isotype work out of a newly created Isotype Institute Ltd, officially chaired by the philosopher Susan Stebbing, based in Oxford and subsequently relocated to London.

The most important distinctive trait of the visual educational work of the Isotype institute was, next to the design and publication of books, the engagement in cinematographic work. Neurath main collaborator and source of commissions was the socialist documentary filmmaker Paul Rotha. Rotha was, with John Grierson and others, part of a group of socially engaged members of the so-called British Documentary Movement (Low 1979). They had been inspired by the Russian Eisenstein's editing techniques of montage and the social reformist value of objective realism: Democracy and the improvement of social conditions demanded the shared experience and knowledge of facts about life in society (Grierson 1939, Rotha 1936).

Objectivity and realism in the documentary movement shared the cognitive and political value of objectivity or factuality we have seen in modernism, socialism, scientism and logical empiricism. The documentarians' works and views could easily straddle the grey divide between information and propaganda, advertising and education. The tools clearly underdetermined their possible usages. The example of advertisement suggests that desirability of the usage or decision cannot be determined just by the emphasis on visual language, physicalist protocol statements, or science alone. Science and engineering, and propaganda, may serve many masters. Voluntarism here re-enters the picture as the necessary precondition for Rotha's and Neurath's choice of notions of social and intellectual ideals. Science and socialism, to the extent that they ultimately involve ideas and ideals, objects and objectives, and require decisions that cannot be reached by idealized inferences or calculations alone, will stand or fall together as foundations. Neither is privileged. Socialism is furthered by the scientific attitude; and science is socially constructed and established, while it is theoretically underdetermined and even possibly left indeterminate by data; and, as Paul Feyerabend argued, even propaganda yields acceptance and agreement (Feyerabend 1975 and private communication). Science and socialism (or some equivalent social ideal) may support each other, as in reflective equilibrium.

Not surprisingly, then, ideological affinity, technical and pragmatic attitude, and social and political opportunities brought Neurath and Rotha together. Films were intellectual and social-political tools. There was demand for children and adult education, especially scientific education, and the government support of information and war propaganda documentaries. Animation was already a developed visual technique, so animated Isotype diagrams had a technical niche, whether as pure-animation features (A Few Ounces a Day (1941)) or part of a photographic documentary films (for instance, Rotha's Blood Transfusion (1941), World of Plenty (1943) and Defeat Tuberculosis (1944)).

In his evaluation of the cognitive, and thereby educational values and limitations of images mentioned, Neurath distinguished between still images and cinematographic images (Neurath 1944b, Neurath 1925/1973, 214, Burke and Haggith 1999, Cat and Paydar forthcoming, Cat forthcoming). His Isotype activities extended to both media (see below, and Burke and Haggith and especially Cat and Paydar forthcoming and Cat forthcoming). Yet, he noted the limitation that moving images make comparative analyses difficult, as the information disappears from our visual attention and cannot be revisited (Neurath 1945/1973, 238). Film hinders what he called meditation and argument (see above). By contrast, two of film's virtues are the capacity to document the unfamiliar, especially human customs, and turn motion into rest or complicated motion into simpler and slower motion (Neurath 1944b, 56).

But he also insisted in taking advantage of the temporal dimension of film to exploit the communicational possibilities of sound in the same way Isotype exploited the visual potential of spatiality. He advocated the introduction of conventional (artificial) and characteristic (typical) sounds, produced by electronic instruments developed by his acquaintance the electrical engineer Wolja Saraga (see Neurath-Saraga correspondence and Neurath-Rotha correspodence for 1941, Cat forthcoming and Cat and Paydar forthcoming). Before Neurath's death, Rotha and Neurath were planning to set up a production company that would focus on the diversity of visual communication tools, from films to animations, to film strips, and was going to be called, appropriately, Unifilm (Neurath-Rotha correspondence 1945).