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Montague Semantics

First published Mon Nov 7, 2011

Montague semantics is a theory of natural language semantics and of its relation with syntax. It was originally developed by the logician Richard Montague (1930–1971) and subsequently modified and extended by linguists, philosophers, and logicians. The most important features of the theory are its use of model theoretic semantics which has commonly been used for the semantics of logical languages and it adherence to the principle of compositionality—that is, the meaning of the whole is a function of the meanings of its parts and their mode of syntactic combination. This entry presents the origins of Montague Semantics, summarizes important aspects of the classical theory, and sketches more recent developments. We conclude with a small example, which illustrates some modern features.

1. Introduction

1.1 Background

Montague semantics is the approach to the semantics of natural language introduced by Richard Montague in the 1970s. He described the aim of his enterprise as follows:

The basic aim of semantics is to characterize the notion of a true sentence (under a given interpretation) and of entailment (Montague 1970c, 223 fn).

The salient points of Montague's approach are a model theoretic semantics, a systematic relation between syntax and semantics, and a fully explicit description of a fragment of natural language. His approach constituted a revolution: after the Chomskyan revolution that brought mathematical methods into syntax, now such methods were introduced in semantics.

Montague's approach became influential, as many authors began to work in his framework and conferences were devoted to ‘Montague grammar’. Later on, certain aspects of his approach were adapted or changed, became generally accepted or were entirely abandoned. Nowadays not many authors would describe their own work as ‘Montague semantics’ given the many differences that have taken shape in semantics since Montague's own work, but his ideas have left important traces, and changed the semantic landscape forever. In our presentation of Montague semantics the focus will be on these developments.

Richard Montague was a mathematical logician who had specialized in set theory and modal logic. His views on natural language must be understood with his mathematical background in mind. Montague held the view that natural language was a formal language very much in the same sense as predicate logic was a formal language. As such, in Montague's view, the study of natural language belonged to mathematics, and not to psychology (Thomason 1974, 2). Montague formulated his views:

There is in my opinion no important theoretical difference between natural languages and the artificial languages of logicians; indeed I consider it possible to comprehend the syntax and semantics of both kinds of languages with a single natural and mathematically precise theory. (Montague 1970c, 222)

Sometimes only the first part of the quote is recalled, and that might raise the question whether he did not notice the great differences: for instance that natural languages develop without an a priori set of rules whereas artificial languages have an explicit syntax and are designed for a special purpose. But the quote as a whole expresses clearly what Montague meant by ‘no important theoretical difference’; the ‘single natural and mathematically precise theory’ which he aimed at, is presented in his paper ‘Universal Grammar’ Montague (1970c). He became most well known by Montague (1973) in which the theory is applied to some phenomena which were discussed intensively in the philosophical literature of those days.

Montague's interest in the field arose while teaching introductory logic courses. Standard in such courses are exercises in which one is asked to translate natural language sentences into logic. To answer such exercises required a bilingual individual, understanding both the natural language and the logic. Montague provided, for the first time in history, a mechanical method to obtain these logical translations. About this, Montague said:

It should be emphasized that this is not a matter of vague intuition, as in elementary logic courses, but an assertion to which we have assigned exact significance. (Montague 1973, 266)

We next describe the basic ideas of Montague semantics are presented. Section 2 presents several components of Montague semantics in more detail. Section 3 includes a discussion of philosophically interesting aspects, and Section 4 provides a detailed example and further reading.

1.2 Basic Aspects

To implement his objective, Montague applied the method which is standard for logical languages: model theoretic semantics. This means that, using constructions from set theory, a model is defined, and that natural language expressions are interpreted as elements (or sets, or functions) in this universe. Such a model should not be conceived of as a model of reality. On the one hand the model gives more than reality: natural language does not only speak about past, present and future of the real world, but also about situations that might be the case, or are imaginary, or cannot be the case at all. On the other hand, however, the model offers less: it merely specifies reality as conceived by language. An example: we speak about mass nouns such as water as if every part of water is water again, so as if it has no minimal parts, which physically is not correct. For more information on natural language metaphysics, see Bach (1986b).

Montague semantics is not interested in a particular situation (e.g. the real world) but in semantical properties of language. When formalizing such properties, reference to a class of models has to be made, and therefore the interpretation of a language will be defined with respect to a set of (suitable) models. For example, in the introduction we mentioned that the characterization of entailment was a basic goal of semantics. That notion is defined as follows. Sentence A entails sentence B if in all models in which the interpretation of A is true, also the interpretation of B is true. Likewise a tautology is true in all models, and a contradiction is true in no model.

An essential feature of Montague semantics is the systematic relation between syntax and semantics. This relation is described by the Principle of Compositionality which reads, in a formulation that is standard nowadays:

The meaning of a compound expression is a function of the meanings of its parts and of the way they are syntactically combined. (Partee 1984, 281)

An example. Suppose that the meaning of walk, or sing is (for each model in the class) defined as the set of individuals who share respectively the property of walking or the property of singing. By appealing to the principle of compositionality, if there is a rule that combines these two expressions to the verb phrase walk and sing, there must be a corresponding rule that determines the meaning of that verb phrase. In this case, the resulting meaning will be the intersection of the two sets. Consequently, in all models the meaning of walk and sing is a subset of the meaning of walk. Furthermore we have a rule that combines the noun phrase John with a verb phrase. The resulting sentence John walks and sings means that John is an element of the set denoted by the verb phrase. Note that in any model in which John is element of the intersection of walkers and singers, he is an element of the set of walkers. So John walks and sings entails John walks.

An important consequence of the principle of compositionality is that all the parts which play a role in the syntactic composition of a sentence, must also have a meaning. And furthermore, each syntactic rule must be accompanied by a semantic rule which says how the meaning of the compound is obtained. Thus the meaning of an expression is determined by the way in which the expression is formed, and as such the derivational history plays a role in determining the meaning. For further discussion, see Section 2.5.

The formulation of the aim of Montague semantics mentioned in the introduction (‘to characterize truth and entailment of sentences’) suggests that the method is restricted to declarative sentences. But this is need not be the case. In Montague (1973, 248 fn) we already find suggestions for how to deal with imperatives and questions. Hamblin (1973) and Karttunen (1977) have given a semantics for questions by considering them as sentences in disguise (I ask you whether …), with a meaning that is based upon sentences (viz. sets of propositions). Groenendijk and Stokhof (1989) consider questions as expressions with meanings of their own nature (namely partitions).

Since Montague only considered sentences in isolation, certain commentators pointed out that the sentence boundary was a serious limitation for the approach. But what about discourse? An obvious requirement is that the sentences from a discourse are interpreted one by one. How then to treat coreferentiality of anaphora over sentence boundaries? The solution which was proposed first, was Discourse Representation Theory Kamp (1981). On the one hand that was an offspring of Montague's approach because it used model theoretic semantics, on the other hand it was a deviation because (discourse) representations were an essential ingredient. Nowadays there are several reformulations of DRT that fit into Montague's framework (see van Eijck and Kamp (1997)). A later solution was based upon a change of the logic; dynamic Montage semantics was developed and that gave a procedure for binding free variables in logic which has an effect on subsequent formulas Groenendijk and Stokhof (1991). Hence the sentence boundary is not a fundamental obstacle for Montague semantics.

2. Components of Montague Semantics

2.1 Unicorns and Meaning Postulates

Montague's most influential article was ‘The proper treatment of Quantification in ordinary English’ Montague (1973). It presented a fragment of English that covered several phenomena which were in those days discussed extensively. One of the examples gave rise to the trademark of Montague grammar: the unicorn (several publications on Montague grammar are illustrated with unicorns).

Consider the two sentences John finds a unicorn and John seeks a unicorn. These are syntactically alike (subject-verb-object), but are semantically very different. From the first sentence follows that there exists at least one unicorn, whereas the second sentence is ambiguous between the so called de dicto reading which does not imply the existence of unicorns, and the de re reading from which existence of unicorns follows.

The two sentences are examples of a traditional problem called ‘quantification into intensional contexts’. Traditionally the second sentence as a whole was seen as an intensional context, and the novelty of Montague's solution was that he considered the object position of seek as the source of the phenomenon. He formalized seek not as a relation between two individuals, but as a relation between an individual and a more abstract entity, see Section 2.2. Under this analysis the existence of a unicorn does not follow. The de re reading is obtained in a different way, see Section 2.5.

It was Montague's strategy to apply to all expressions of a category the most general approach, and narrow this down, when required, by meaning postulates. So initially, find is also considered to be a relation between an individual and such an abstract entity, but some meaning postulate restricts the class of models in which we interpret the fragment to only those models in which the relation for find is the (classical) relation between individuals.

As a consequence of this strategy, Montague's paper has many meaning postulates. Nowadays semanticists often prefer to express the semantic properties of individual lexical items directly in their lexical meaning. Then find is directly interpreted as a relation between individuals. Nowadays meaning postulates are mainly used to express structural properties of the models (for instance the structure of time axis), and to express relations between the meanings of words. For a discussion of the role of meaning postulates, see Zimmermann (1999).

2.2 Noun Phrases and Generalized Quantifiers

Noun phrases like a pig, every pig, and Babe, behave in many respects syntactically alike: they can occur in the same positions, can be conjoined, etc. But a uniform semantics seems problematic. There were proposals which said that every pig denotes the universally generic pig, and a pig an arbitrary pig. Such proposals were rejected by Lewis (1970), who raised, for instance, the question which would be the color of the universal pig, all colors, or would it be colorless?

Montague proposed the denotation of a descriptive phrase to be a set of properties. For instance, the denotation of John is the set consisting of properties which hold for him, and of every man the set of properties which hold for every man. Thus they are semantically uniform, and then conjunction and/or disjunction of arbitrary quantifier phrases (including e.g. most but not all) can be dealt with in a uniform way.

This abstract approach has led to generalized quantifier theory, see Barwise and Cooper (1981) and Peters and Westerståhl (2006). By using generalized quantifier theory a remarkable result has been achieved. It concerns ‘negative polarity items’: words like yet and ever. Their occurrence can be licensed by negation: The 6:05 has arrived yet is out, whereas The 6:05 hasn't arrived yet is OK. But there are more contexts in which negative polarity items may occur, and syntacticians did not succeed in characterizing them. Ladusaw (1980) did so by using a characterization from generalized quantifier theory. This was a great success for formal semantics! His proposal roughly was as follows. Downward entailing expressions are expressions that license inferences from supersets to subsets. No is downward entailing because from No man walks it follows that No father walks. A negative polarity item is acceptable only if it is interpreted in the scope of a downward entailing expression, e.g. No man ever walks. Further research showed that the analysis needed refining, and that a hierarchy of negative polarity items should be used see Ladusaw (1996).

2.3 Logic and Translating

An expression may directly be associated with some element from the model. For instance, walk with some set of individuals. Then also the operations on meanings have to be specified directly, and that leads to formulations such as:

G3 is that function f ∈ ((2I)A×A)Aω such that, for all xAω, all u,tA and all iI : f(x)(t,u)(i) = 1 if and only if t = u. (Montague 1970a, 194)

Such descriptions are not easy to understand, nor convenient to work with. Montague (1973, 256) said: ‘it is probably more perspicuous to proceed indirectly’. For this purpose he introduced a language, called ‘intensional logic’. The operation described above is then represented by λtλu[t = u]. The λt says that it is a function that takes t as argument, likewise for λu. So λtλu[t = u] is a function which takes two arguments, and yields true if the arguments are equal, and otherwise false. The preceding says that we consider a function from possible worlds and moments of time to the thus defined function.

Two features of the Montague's ‘intensional logic’ attracted attention.

  1. It is a higher order logic. In those days, linguists, philosophers and mathematicians were only familiar with first order logic (the logic in which there are only variables for basic entities). Since in Montague semantics the parts of expressions must have meaning too, a higher order logic was needed (we have already seen that every man denotes a set of properties).
  2. The logic has lambda abstraction, which in Montague's days was not a standard ingredient of logic. The lambda operator makes it possible to express with higher order functions, and the operator made it possible to cope differences between between syntax and semantics. For instance, in John walks and he talks there is only one occurrence of John, whereas in the logic John should occur with the predicate walk and with the predicate talk. The use of lambda-operators enables us to plug in the meaning of John at several positions. The importance of lambdas is expressed by Partee at a talk on ‘The first decade of Montague Grammar’: ‘Lambdas really changed my life’ (Partee 1996, 24). Nowadays lambdas are a standard tool in all papers in semantics. In section 4.1 an example will be given that illustrates the power of lambdas.

This motivation for using translations (a tool for obtaining perspicuous representations of meanings) has certain consequences.

  1. Translation is a tool to obtain formulas which represent meanings. Different, but equivalent formulas are equally acceptable. In the introduction of this article it was said that Montague grammar provided a mechanical procedure for obtaining the logical translation. As a matter of fact, the result of Montague's translation of Every man runs is not identical with the traditional translation, although equivalent with it, see the example in Section 4.1.
  2. The translation into logic should be dispensable. So in Montague semantics there is nothing like ‘logical form’, which plays such an important role in the tradition of Chomsky.
  3. For each syntactic rule which combines one or more expressions there is a corresponding semantic rule that combines the corresponding representations of the meanings. This connection is baptized the rule-to-rule hypothesis Bach (1976). Maybe it is useful to emphasize that (for rules with one argument) it is not forbidden that the corresponding semantic rule is the identity mapping (in case the syntactic operation is meaning preserving).
  4. Operations depending on specific features of formulas are not allowed. Janssen (1997) criticized several proposals on this aspect. He showed that proposals that are deficient in this respect are either incorrect (make wrong predictions for closely related sentences), or can be corrected and generalized, and thus improved.

The method of using a logic for representing meanings has a long history. One might point to philosophers such as Dalgarno and Leibniz who developed formal languages in order to express philosophy clearly. In the 19th century there were several proposals for artificial languages in order to make mathematical argumentation more transparent, for instance by Frege and by Peano. Frege's ‘Begriffsschrift’ Frege (1879) can be seen as the birth of predicate logic: he introduced quantifiers. His motivation came from mathematical needs; he did not use his Begriffsschrift in his papers on natural language. Russell (1905) used logic to represent the meanings of natural language. A classical example in his paper is the analysis of The king of France is bald. Syntactically it has the form subject-predicate, but if it would be constructed logically as a subject-predicate, then the king of France, which denotes nothing, cannot be the subject. So there is a difference between the syntactic form, and the logical form: natural language obscures the view of the real meaning. This became known as the ‘misleading form thesis’. Therefore philosophers of language saw, in those days, the role of logic as a tool to improve natural language. An interesting overview of the history of translating is given in Stokhof (2007).

Note, however, that Montague semantics has nothing to do with the aim of improving natural language or providing its logical form.

2.4 Intensionality and Tautologies

Montague defined the denotation of a sentence as a function from possible worlds and moments of time to truth values. Such a function is called an ‘intension’. As he said (Montague 1970a, 218), this made it possible to deal with the semantics of common phenomena such as modifiers, e.g. in Necessarily the father of Cain is Adam. Its denotation cannot be obtained from the truth value of The father of Cain is Adam : one has to know the truth value for other possible worlds and moments of time. The intensional approach also made it possible to deal with several classical puzzles. Two examples from Montague (1973) are: The temperature is rising, which should not be analyzed as stating that some number is rising. And John wishes to catch a fish and eat it should not should be analyzed as stating that John has a particular fish in mind, but that he wants to eat the fish he will catch.

Intensional semantics has been criticized for the fact that all tautologies get the same meaning (are synonymous). Indeed, a tautology as John is ill or he is not ill gets as intension the function that constantly yields true, and the same for other tautologies. If one is interested in discriminating semantically between tautologies, then a refinement of the notions ‘meaning’ and ‘equivalence’ is needed: ‘meaning’ should see distinctions between tautologies, and ‘equivalence’ should be sensitive for the thus refined notion of meaning.

There are several proposals to account for this problem. The oldest is by Lewis (1970): propositions are structured by including in their meaning the meanings of their parts. Then indeed Green grass is green and White snow is white have different meanings. However, lexical synonyms pose a problem for this approach. Since woodchuck and groundhog are names for the same species, John believes that Phil is a groundhog is, under this view, equivalent with John believes that Phil is a woodchuck. However, since John might not be aware of the synonymy between woodchuck and groundhog, the two sentences should not be equivalent. One could consider belief contexts a separate problem, but most authors see it as part of the problem of equivalence of all tautologies. The literature provides several proposals for dealing with this. Bäuerle and Cresswell (2003) give an overview of the older proposals, and Fox and Lappin (2005) of more recent ones. The latter authors explain that there are two strategies: the first is to introduce impossible worlds in which woodchuck and groundhog are not equivalent, and the second to introduce entailment relation with the property that identity does not follow from reciprocal entailment. Their own proposal follows the second strategy.

2.5 Scope and Derivational History

A well known example of scope ambiguity is Every man loves a woman. Is there only one woman involved (e.g. mother Mary), or does every man love a different woman? The sentence has no lexically ambiguous words, and there are no syntactic arguments to assign them more than one constituent structure. How to account for the ambiguity?

In Montague (1973) the scope ambiguity is dealt with by providing for the sentence two different derivations. On the reading that every has wide scope, the sentence is produced from every man and loves a woman. On the reading that only one woman is involved, the sentence is obtained from Every man loves him1. The him1 is an artifact, a placeholder, or, one might say, a syntactic variable. A special kind of rule, called a ‘quantifying-in rule’, will replace this him1 by a noun phrase or a pronoun (in case there are more occurrences of this placeholder). The placeholder corresponds with a logical variable that becomes bound by the semantic counterpart of the quantifying-in rule. For the sentence under discussion, the effect of the application of the quantifying-in rule to a woman and Every man loves him1 is that the desired sentence is produced and that the quantifier corresponding with a woman gets wide scope. When we would depict its derivation as a tree, this tree would be larger than the constituent structure of the sentence due to the introduction and later removal of him1.

This quantifying-in rule is used by Montague for other phenomena as well. An example is coreferentiality: Mary loves the man whom she kissed is obtained from He1 loves the man whom he1 kissed. And the de re reading of John seeks a unicorn is obtained from a unicorn and John seeks him1.

Many researchers did not like this analysis in which powerful rules and artificial symbols (him1) are used. Two strategies to remedy this can be discriminated.

The first strategy was to eliminate the ambiguity. Some linguists have argued that the scope order is the same as the surface order; this is known as ‘Jackendoff's principle’ (Jackendoff 1972). Others said that such sentences have only one reading, viz. its weakest reading (every wide scope), and that the stronger reading is inferred when additional information is available. These two approaches work well for simple sentences, but they are challenged by more complicated sentences in which the surface order is not a possible reading, or where the different scope readings are logically independent.

The second strategy was to capture the ambiguity in another way than by the quantifying-in rules. Historically the first method was to put the interpretations of the noun phrases in a store from which these interpretations could be retrieved when needed: different stages of retrieving correspond with differences in scope. One might see this as a grammar in which the direct correspondence between syntax and semantics has been relaxed. The method is called ‘Cooper Store’, after the author who proposed this Cooper (1983). A later proposal is DRT (=discourse representation theory), where representations are used to account for such ambiguities van Eijck and Kamp (1997). A recent method is by means of ‘lifting rules’ (see Sect. 3.3): the meaning of a noun-phrase is ‘lifted’ to a more abstract level, and different levels yield different scope readings Hendriks (2001). A radical position is taken by Jacobson (1999) who does not use free variables at all: a pronoun like he is interpreted as the identity function on individuals, and sentences with unbound pronouns as functions from entities to truth values. This works well for pronoun binding, but for the treatment of scope one of the other methods has to be used.

Even if the role of derivational history can be avoided for scope and coreferentiality, other phenomena remain for which derivational histories have a role. An example is John wondered when Alice said she would leave. This is ambiguous between John asking for the time of leaving, or for the time of saying. So the sentence is ambiguous, even though there are no arguments for assigning to it more than one constituent structure. Pelletier (1993) presents this sentence and others, and says: ‘In order to maintain the Compositionality Principle, theorists have resorted to a number of devices which are all more or less unmotivated (except to maintain the Principle): Montagovian “quantifying-in” rules, traces, gaps, […].’ Pelletier's objection can be appreciated if one assumes that meaning assignment is directly linked with constituent structure. But, as explained in Section 1.2, this is not the case. The derivation specifies which rules are combined in which order, and this derivation constitutes the input to the meaning assignment function. The constituent structure is determined by the output of the syntactic rules, and different derivation processes may generate one and the same constituent structure. In this way, semantic ambiguities are accounted for. One should not call something ‘constituent structure’ if it is not intended as such, and next refute it because it does not have the desired properties.

The distinction between a derivation tree and a constituent tree is made in various theories of grammar. In Tree Adjoining Grammars (TAG's) the different scope readings of the sentence about loving a woman differ in the order in which the noun-phrases are substituted in the basic tree. A classical example in Chomskyan grammar is The shooting of the hunters was bloody, which is ambiguous between the hunters shooting, or the hunters being shot at. The two readings come from two different sources: one in which the hunters is the subject of the sentence, and one in which it is the object.

3. Philosophical Aspects

3.1 From Frege to Intensions

Frege (1892) introduced the distinction between ‘sense’ and ‘reference’. It has been said that Montague followed this distinction, and that ‘intension’ coincides with ‘sense’. But that is not correct. Let us first consider Frege's argumentation. It concerns The Greeks did not know that the morning star is the evening star. During classical antiquity, it had not yet been discovered that both the morning star and the evening star are the planet Venus. We would, however, not like to analyze the sentence as stating that the Greeks did not know that Venus is the same as Venus, i.e. that they did not recognize an obvious truth. Frege's theory is that in ordinary contexts the expression the morning star denotes its referent (a celestial object), but in indirect contexts it denotes something different that is called ‘its sense’. This notion includes not only the referent, but also the way in which one refers to an object. Since referring to a celestial object by the morning star differs from referring to it by the evening star, the sentence The morning star is the evening star does not express an analytic truth.

Frege's approach was abandoned because it was not really satisfactory. The phrase the morning star is not what one would call a lexical ambiguity: there is no sentence that has different readings due to that phrase. Nevertheless, Frege associated with that expression two denotations. The situation gets even worse: Carnap (1947) noted that under Frege's approach we would also need the ‘sense of a sense’ etc. Consequently, Frege's approach requires an infinite hierarchy of semantic denotations (and that for an expression which never gives rise to the ambiguity of a sentence). Carnap proposed another formalization of the same idea, but in which with one expression only one denotation is associated. His solution, however, had problems, caused by the fact that he identified possible worlds with models. For these reasons Montague (1970c, 233) introduced his ‘intensional logic’, in which the problems do not arise. The difference with Frege (one denotation for an expression, instead of infinitely many) was possible due to two novelties (see Montague 1970a, 217–218): ‘descriptive phrases do not denote individuals’, and ‘the denotation of a sentence is not a truth value, but a proposition’. He explains: ‘Frege's argument that sentences cannot denote propositions of course depends on the assumption that descriptive phrases denote individuals.’

For an elaborated discussion, see Janssen (2001) and Janssen (2011); for information on the history of intensional logic, see Montague (1970b, 145).

3.2 Compositionality

For Montague the principle of compositionality was not a subject of deliberation or discussion, because for him, as a mathematical logician, it was the only way to proceed. He describes his method in side remarks with phrases like ‘following Tarski’, or ‘following Frege’, without ever calling it a principle. Later authors identified the Principle of Compositionality as the cornerstone of Montague's work. The reason was that discussions arose, and an investigation of the foundations of Montague grammar was asked for.

It has been claimed that Montague himself did not work compositionally in the case of pronouns. This is, however, not the case. In order to explain the compositional nature of his treatment of pronouns, both Janssen (1997) and Dowty (2007) explain how variables are interpreted in logic; we follow their explanations. Consider the following clauses from the traditional Tarskian interpretation of predicate logic.

  1. ⟦ϕ ∧ ψ⟧g = 1 if and only if ⟦ϕ⟧g = 1 and ⟦ψ⟧g = 1
  2. ⟦∀xϕ⟧g = 1 if and only if for all hxg holds ⟦ϕ⟧h = 1

The first clause says: ϕ ∧ ψ is true when using assignment g if and only if ϕ and ψ are true when the assignment g is used. In the second clause assignments h are introduced (by ∼x g) which are equal to g except maybe for the value they assign to variable x. Montague uses the same format, with the difference that besides g he also has i, the time of reference and j, the possible world, as superscripts.

In the formulation of the clauses there is nothing which can be pointed at as ‘the meaning’, in fact it is a definition of truth with g and h as parameters. So how is it possible that this (and Montague's work) are compositional?

The answer requires a shift in perspective. The meaning of a formula ϕ, shortly M(ϕ), is the set of assignments for which the formula is true. Then the first clause says that M(ϕ ∧ ψ) = M(ϕ) ∩ M(ψ), so a simple set-theoretic combination on the two meanings is performed. And M(∀xϕ) = {hxggM(ϕ)}, which can be described as: extend the set M(ϕ) with all x-variants. Likewise, in Montague semantics the meaning of an expression is a function which has as domain the triples <moment of time, possible world, assignment to variables>.

Is it possible to achieve compositionality for natural language? Obvious candidates for counterexamples are idioms, because their meanings seem not to be built from their constituting words. However, Westerståhl (2002) presents a collection of methods, varying from compound basic expressions, to deviant meanings for constituting parts. Janssen (1997) refutes several other counterexamples that are put forward in the literature.

How strong is compositionality? Mathematical results show that any language can be given a compositional semantics, either by using an unorthodox syntax (Janssen (1986) and Janssen (1997)) or by using an unorthodox semantics Zadrozny (1994). However their proofs are not helpful in practice. Hodges (2001) showed how a given compositional semantics for a fragment can be extended to a larger language.

Among formal semanticists one can find the following attitudes towards compositionality (about the same list is given by Partee (1996)):

  1. It is a methodological principle. Any proposal should obey it. Janssen (1997) is an advocate of this position.
  2. It is a good method. Compositionality by itself has no special status, but it is an example how a systematic relation between syntax and semantics could be given. Other methods are acceptable as well, such as using representations essentially (as in DRT Kamp (1981)), or allowing a few systematic exceptions to compositionality.
  3. It is a kind of goal, but fulfilling it can be put aside. A description of the meaning of phrases exhibiting a certain phenomenon is given, and a remark is added that it is assumed that the results can be achieved in a compositional way.
  4. It is an empirical principle. It is a claim about the organization of the grammar, and formal semantics is an enterprise that investigates how far this can be maintained. Maybe there are situations where the price would be too high, or where it would not be possible at all (see e.g. Dowty (2007)).

An extensive discussion of compositionality is given in Janssen (1997) and, in this encyclopedia, in the contribution by Szabó (2007).

3.3 Syntactic Categories and Semantic Types

According to Montague the purpose of syntax is to produce the input for the semantics:

I fail to see any interest in syntax except as a preliminary to semantics. (Montague 1970c, 223)

Although the syntax was in his eyes subordinate, he was fully explicit in his rules. He used all kinds of ad hoc solutions, but did not use sophisticated tools, such as syntactic features. Moreover his rules produce flat strings.

In Montague (1970a) the relation between syntactic categories and semantic types is given by a list, but in Montague (1973) a systematic relation is defined, which amounts to the same relation as one would have in categorial grammar. However, his syntax is not a categorial syntax because the rules are not always category driven and because some of the rules are not concatenation rules.

For each of these two aspects, there have been proposals put forward. One direction was to stay closer to the ideals of categorial grammar, with only type driven rules, sometimes allowing for a restricted extension of the power of concatenation rules. Typical examples are Morrill (1994) and Carpenter (1998). The other approach was to incorporate in Montague grammar as much as possible the insights from syntactic theories, especially originating from the tradition of Chomsky. A first step was made by Partee (1973), who let the grammar produce structures (labelled bracketings). A syntactically sophisticated grammar (with Chomskyan movement rules) was used in the Rosetta translation project Rosetta (1994).

In order to cover linguistic generalizations, it is proposed to relax the relation between an expression and its semantic type (and therefore with its meaning). Montague had to introduce the and in John wants to catch and eat a fish by a different rule than the and in John walks and Mary sings, because syntactically the second one is a conjunction of sentences and the first is between verb phrases. However, the two meanings of and are closely related and usually one does not make a distinction in the syntax. As a general solution it was proposed to use rules (or general principles) that ‘lift’ the type of an expression to another category, corresponding with semantic rules that change the meaning. For instance, the meaning of and as a connective between verb phrases is obtained by lifting the sentence connective ∧ to λPλQλx[P(x) ∧ Q(x)]. Classical papers about the approach with lifting rules are Partee and Rooth (1983), Partee (1987), Hendriks (2001) and a monograph in which the whole complex of conjoined phrases is considered, is Winter (2001).

Nowadays the syntactic side usually plays no important role in publications on Montague semantics. One rather focuses on a semantically interesting phenomenon, suggesting rules which are only explicit concerning the semantic side. Whether and how the phenomenon fits together with the treatment of other phenomena is not considered. Montague's method to present fragments with a fully explicit syntax has been abandoned.

3.4 Pragmatics

The meaning of sentences is sometimes determined by factors from the context of use; e.g. whether I am happy is true, depends on who the speaker is. Other examples are here and this. Montague writes about these factors in his paper ‘Pragmatics’ Montague (1968) and in Montague (1970b), and he indicates how this could be done by introducing additional parameters (besides the time and the possible world). His papers focus on the formal apparatus, and he works it out only for the pronoun I.

Several authors followed Montague's approach, and extended, when needed, the list of parameters. A classical example is given by the approach of Kaplan (1989) for dealing with demonstratives and indexicals. He uses ‘context’ as a parameter, which consists at least in agent, moment of time, location, and possible world. The content of a sentence, with respect to a context, is a proposition, and the linguistic meaning, or character, of an expression is a function from contexts to contents. This difference between content and meaning is exploited to develop his (influential) theory of demonstratives (she, her, that) and indexicals (I, today).

Cresswell (1973, 111) has another opinion. He argues that the approach with parameters requires that a finite list of contextual features is given in an advance. He considers that to be impossible and provides an alternative. His proposal is not followed by other authors.

Presuppositions and implicatures are often considered as belonging to pragmatics. The aim of a recursive approach to presupposition was always in the air, for the practical reason that it seems the only way to deal with presuppositions for infinitely many sentences. An example of a compositional treatment is Peters (1979). But the phenomena are complex, and later treatments are not always completely compositional, several correcting factors have to be taken into consideration, see Beaver (1997).

Finally, there is pragmatics in the sense of using a language in practical situations. Declarative sentences can be used to ask questions, and to give orders, and sometimes sentences are not used literally, but metaphorically. On this aspect of pragmatics not much has been written, but Cresswell (1973) explains that formal semantics has all the ingredients to cope with it.

3.5 Ontology

Montague's ‘intensional logic’ is a higher order logic. This aspect provoked a very critical attack by Hintikka:

It seems to me that this is the strategy employed by Montague Grammarians, who are in fact strongly committed to compositionality. […]. There is a price to be paid however. The higher order entities evoked in this “type theoretical ascent” are much less realistic philosophically and psycholinguistically than our original individuals. Hence the ascent is bound to detract from the psycholinguistic and methodological realism of one's theory. (Hintikka 1983, 20)

He also says:

Moreover, the first order formulations have other advantages over higher order ones. In first-order languages we can achieve an axiomatization of logical truths and of valid inferences. (Hintikka 1983, 285)

And he proposes his own game theoretical semantics.

Some comments (the first two originate from Groenendijk & Stokhof, personal communication).

  1. If first-order analysis is so natural and psychologically realistic, it would be extremely interesting to have an explanation why it took more than two thousand years since Aristotle before the notion ‘first order’ was introduced by Frege.
  2. It is difficult to see why the first-order notation matters. If there are ontological commitments, then the notions used in the interpretation of the logic, in the metatheory, are crucial, and not the notation itself. It is, for instance difficult to understand why a winning strategy for a game is more natural than a function from properties to truth values.
  3. If it is a point of axiomatizability, it would be interesting to have an axiomatization of game theoretical semantics. As concerns intensional logic, one might use generalized models; with respect to these models there is an axiomatization Gallin (1975).

Hintikka's criticism has not found supporters. Ironically, Hintikka's alternative (game theoretical semantics), is encapsulated in the traditional Tarskian approach (see Hodges (1997) or Caicedo et al. (2009)); they define the meaning of a formula as a collection of sets of assignments.

In Montague's approach possible worlds are basic objects without internal or external structure. Phenomena having to do with belief, require external structure, such as an accessibility relation for belief-alternatives. Counterfactuals require a distance notion to characterize worlds which differ minimally from each other. Structures on possible worlds are used frequently.

Sometimes an internal structure for possible worlds is proposed. A possible world determines a set of propositions (those propositions which are true with respect to that world), and in Fox and Lappin (2005) the reverse order is followed. They have propositions as primitive notions, and define possible worlds on the basis of them. Also Cresswell (1973) provides a method for obtaining possible worlds with internal structure: he describes how to build possible worlds from basic facts. None of these proposals for internal structure have been applied by other authors than the proposers.

The philosophical status of certain entities is not so clear, such as pains, tasks, obligations and events. These are needed when evaluating sentences like e.g. Jones had a pain similar to the one he had yesterday. In ‘On the nature of certain philosophical entities’, Montague (1960) describes how these notions can be described using his intentional logic; they are properties of moments of time in a possible world. Of these notions, only events occur in papers by other authors, albeit not in the way Montague suggested. They are seen as basic, but provided with an algebraic structure allowing for e.g. subevents, (Link 1998, ch. 10–12 and Bach 1986a).

The set E may include whatever one would like to consider as basic entities: numbers, possible objects, and possible individuals. Whether an individual is considered to be really living or existing at a certain moment of time or in a certain possible world is not given directly by the model; one has to introduce a predicate expressing this. Normally the set E has no internal structure, but for mass nouns (which have the characteristic property that any part of water is water), a structure is needed, see Pelletier and Schubert (2003). Also plurals might need a structure on the set E, e.g. when sum-individuals are used, see Link (1983), Link (1998, ch. 1–4), and Bach (1986a). Also when properties (loving John) are considered as entities for which predicates may hold (Mary likes loving John) structure is needed: property theory gives the tools to incorporate them, see Turner (1983).

3.6 Psychology

When Montague grammar emerged, the leading theory about syntax was Chomskyan grammar. That approach claimed that it revealed processes that went on in the brain, and that linguistics was a branch of biology. In those days it was experimentally shown that the passive transformation was a real process in the brain. Chomskyan grammar still is a leading theory, and although most of the theory has changed considerably (there is no passive transformation anymore), it still considers itself to be revealing psychologically real processes. Montague had no psychological claim for his theory; on the contrary, he considered linguistics as a branch of mathematics and not of psychology (Thomason 1974, 2). But the scientific context caused that the issue could not be avoided.

Partee (1977) explained to a meeting of psychologists that the theory cannot be applied directly to psychology because of the huge numbers of entities in the models (infinite numbers of functions from functions to functions). Partee (1979) argues that there is a deep gap between the mathematical view and the psychological view, especially concerning propositional attitude verbs and the behavior of proper names in such contexts, and she says that this gap has, somehow, to be bridged.

An argument often put forward in defense of compositionality concerns its psychological motivation. The principle explains how a person can understand sentences he has never heard before. This motivation for compositionality is attacked by Schiffer (1987). On the one hand he argues that compositionality is not needed in an explanation of that power, and on the other hand that a compositional approach does not work. His argumentation is illustrated by Tanya believes that Gustav is a dog. Schiffer considers several compositional theories and argues that none of these theories offers a plausible account for the proposition that is supposed to be the content of Tanya's belief. So there is nothing from which the meaning of the sentence can be formed compositionally. Hence compositionality cannot hold. Partee (1988) discusses Schiffer's arguments against compositionality, and explains that Schiffer does not make a sufficient distinction between semantic facts and psychological facts. There is a fundamental difference between semantic facts concerning belief contexts (as implication and synonymy), and questions that come closer to psychological processes (how can a person sincerely utter such a sentence?). What Schiffer showed was that problems arise if one attempts to connect semantic theories with the relation between human beings and their language. Partee points out the analogy between these problems with belief and those with the semantics of proper names (how can one correctly use proper names without being acquainted with the referent). The latter is discussed and explained by Kripke (1972). Partee proposes to solve the problems of belief along the same lines. Her paper is followed by a reaction of Schiffer (1988). However, he does not react to this suggestion, nor to the main point: that a semantic theory is to be distinguished from a psychological theory.

An extensive discussion of the relation between Montague semantics and psychology is given in the last chapter in Dowty (1979). He starts his chapter with a description of the situation. ‘Contemporary linguists, unlike many philosophers of language, almost invariably profess to be concerned with the “psychological reality” of the theoretical concepts they postulate in semantics analysis’ Dowty (1979). He works out this point and then describes his own position. ‘To get the point right away, let me confess that I believe that the model theoretic intension of a word has in principle nothing whatsoever to do with what goes on in a person's head when he uses a word.’ Nevertheless, he tries to show that the notion of intension is a fundamental and indispensable concept from the point of view of ‘psychological semantics’. There are three reasons. The first is that semantics provides a theory that explains entailment (and synonymity, validity contradiction etc.’), all notions that must somehow be part of a theory of language understanding. Secondly, the theory of truth and reference must be a bottom line in any general account of ‘meaning’ in natural language. And thirdly, when certain ways of compositionally deriving the meanings from their parts can be shown to be necessary in a theory of truth and reference, then it may be concluded that the same compositional analysis is necessary in a theory of language understanding.

These examples illustrate the general opinion that psychological reality can only very indirectly be associated with what is going on in Montague semantics; only a few articles discuss the connection.

4. Concluding Remarks

4.1 Legacy

Montague revolutionized the field of semantic theory. He introduced methods and tools from mathematical logic, and set standards for explicitness in semantics. Now all semanticists know that logic has more to offer than first order logic only. Finally, recall that Barbara Partee said: ‘lambdas really changed my life’; in fact lambdas changed the lives of all semanticists.

4.2 Example

A small example is presented below, it consists of the two sentences John is singing, and Every man is singing. The example is not presented in Montague's original way, but modernized: there is a lifting rule, the determiner is a basic expression, and intensional aspects are not considered.

The grammar has four basic expressions:
1. John is an expression of the category Proper Name. Its denotation is an individual represented in logic by John.
2. The Intransitive Verb sing denotes a set (the set of singers), and is represented by the predicate symbol sing.
3. The Common Noun man, which denotes a set, represented by man.
4. The Determiner every. Its denotation is λPλQx[P(x) → Q(x)]; an explanation of this formula will be given below.

The grammar has three rules.

1. A rule which takes as input a Proper Name, and produces a Noun Phrase. The input word is not changed: it is lifted to a ‘higher’ grammatical category. Semantically its meaning is lifted to a more abstract, a ‘higher’ meaning: the representation of the denotation of John as Noun Phrase is λP[P(John)]. An explanation of the formula is as follows. P is a variable over properties: if we have chosen an interpretation for P, we may say whether P holds for John or not, i.e. whether P(John) is true. The λP abstracts from the possible interpretations of P: the expression λP[P(John)] denotes a function that takes as input properties and yields true if the property holds for John, and false otherwise. So the denotation of John is the characteristic function of the set of properties he has.

2. A rule that takes as input a Noun Phrase and an Intransitive Verb, and yields as output a Sentence: from John and sing it produces John is singing. The corresponding semantic rule requires the denotation of the Noun Phrase to be applied to the denotation of the Intransitive Verb. This is represented as λP[P(John)](sing). When applied to the argument sing, the function represented by λP[P(John)] yields true if the predicate sing holds for John, so precisely in case sing(John) is true. So λP[P(John)](sing) and sing(John) are equivalent. The latter formula can be obtained by removing the λP and substituting sing for P. This is called ‘lambda-conversion’.

3. A rule that takes as inputs a Determiner and a Common Noun, and yields a Noun Phrase: from every and man it produces every man. Semantically the denotation of the Determiner has to be applied to the denotation of the Common Noun, hence λPλQx[P(x) → Q(x)](man). By lambda conversion (just explained) this is simplified to λQx[man(x) → Q(x)]. This result denotes a function that, when applied to property A, yields true just in case all man have property A.

The example given with the last rule helps us to understand the formula for every : that denotes a relation between properties A and B which holds in case every A has property B.

The next step is now easy. Apply the rule for combining a Noun Phrase and an Intransitive Verb to the last result, producing Every man is singing. The output of the semantic rule is λQx[man(x) → Q(x)](sing). By lambda conversion we obtain ∀x[man(x) →sing(x)], which is the traditional logical representation of Every man is singing.

Note the role of lambda-operators:
1. John and every man are interpreted in a similar way: sets of properties. These sets can be represented due to lambda-operators.
2. Every man and sing are syntactically on the same level, but semantically sing has a subordinated role: it occurs embedded in the formula. This switch of level is possible due to lambda-operators.

4.3 Further Reading

The standard introductory book for Montague semantics is Dowty et al. (1981). An overview of the development of Montague semantics, with special attention for linguistic aspects, is given by Partee and Hendriks (1997). Collections of the most important papers in the field are Partee (1976), Portner and Partee (2002) and Partee (2004). Articles about new developments are usually published in Linguistics and Philosophy and Natural language semantics.


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categories | compositionality | Davidson, Donald | events | Frege, Gottlob | generalized quantifiers | impossible worlds | intensional transitive verbs | intentionality | lambda calculus, the | logic: independence friendly | logic: intensional | logic: second-order and higher-order | logical atomism: Russell's | logical form | propositions: structured | rigid designators | semantics: dynamic | type theory