Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Margaret Lucas Cavendish

First published Fri Oct 16, 2009; substantive revision Thu May 24, 2012

Margaret Lucas Cavendish was a philosopher, poet, scientist, fiction-writer, and playwright who lived in the seventeenth century. Her work is important for a number of reasons. One is that it lays out an early and very compelling version of the naturalism that is found in current-day philosophy and science. It also offers important insights that bear on recent discussions of the nature and characteristics of intelligence and the question of whether or not the bodies that surround us are intelligent or have an intelligent cause. Another reason that the work of Cavendish is important is that it anticipates some of the central views and arguments that are more commonly associated with figures like Thomas Hobbes and David Hume. She also anticipates discussions in the work of contemporary philosophers, such as David Chalmers and Colin McGinn, about whether or not our ability to understand how matter thinks is relevant to the question of whether it does think.

1. Introduction and Biography

Margaret Lucas was born in 1623 in Colchester, Essex. She did not receive a formal education in disciplines such as mathematics, history, philosophy, and the classical languages, but she had access to scholarly libraries and was an avid reader. She began to put her own ideas to paper at a very early age, and although it was regarded as unseemly at the time for a woman to be publicly intellectual, she was able to be an intellectual in private in regular conversations with her middle-brother John. This is noteworthy because John was already a well-established scholar: a student of law, philosophy, and natural science, he was fluent in Hebrew, Latin and Greek, and would eventually become a founding member of the Royal Society (Whitaker 2002, 11–12). In 1643, seeking a life of independence, Lucas applied to be a maid of honor at the court of Queen Henrietta Maria. When the queen was exiled to France in 1644, Lucas accompanied her and shortly thereafter met William Cavendish. They married in 1645, and would remain in exile (in Paris, then Rotterdam, then Antwerp) until the restoration of the crown in 1660 (Battigelli 1998, 1–10).

There are two reasons why it is important to mention the marriage of Margaret Lucas and William Cavendish. One is that in the mid-seventeenth-century it was unusual for a publisher to print the philosophical and scientific work of a woman. Cavendish was a sufficiently brilliant and impressive writer that she was able to publish some of her work without assistance (Whitaker 2002, 154), including her very first work [Poems and Fancies, 1653], but many of her writings were published with the help of her well-connected husband. The second reason why it is important to mention the marriage of Lucas to Cavendish is that through the “Cavendish Circle” meetings that he had organized in the 1640s, she interacted with such figures as Thomas Hobbes, Rene Descartes, Marin Mersenne, Pierre Gassendi, and Kenelm Digby (Hutton 1997a, 422–3; Whitaker 2002, 92–4; Clucas 1994, 256–64). But these philosophers would not engage with her directly. Unfortunately and sadly for her and for us, she had no written philosophical correspondence with any of these philosophers. When they would not critically correspond with her in print, she engaged their views critically in the form of a correspondence between herself and a fictional third person.[1]

Cavendish lived and wrote in the thick of the mechanistic revolution of the seventeenth century, though many of her views—about thinking matter, the nature of scientific explanation, and the intelligibility of the divine—seem almost contemporary. In her own age, she was regarded alternately as mad, pretentious, a curiosity, and a genius. She finally received some much-wanted recognition from her male peers in 1667, when she was offered an extremely rare invitation to participate in a meeting of the Royal Society, though to be sure she was regarded as a spectacle by many in attendance (Whitaker 2002, 291–306). She died in December 1673 and was buried at Westminster Abbey. Over the course of her short life she produced a number of important works in philosophy. These include Philosophical and Physical Opinions (1656), Orations of Divers Sorts, Philosophical Letters (1664), Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy (1666), The Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World (1666), and Grounds of Natural Philosophy (1668).

The central tenet of Cavendish's philosophy is that everything in the universe—including human beings and their minds—is completely material. Her commitment to this tenet is reflected throughout her corpus:

Nature is material, or corporeal, and so are all her Creatures, and whatsoever is not material is no part of Nature, neither doth it belong any ways to Nature….[2]

According to Cavendish, none of the achievements of bodies are to be traced to immaterial agents such as God, immaterial finite minds, or substantial forms, because bodies have the resources to bring about everything that they do on their own. Bodies are ubiquitous, because there is no vacuum, as extensions of space cannot be extensions of nothing but must be extensions of matter.[3] Every body is infinitely divisible (Cavendish 1668a, 125, 263; Cavendish 1668b, 239), and all of the bodies in nature, at every level of division, are intelligent and perceptive (Cavendish 1668a, 16, 156; Cavendish 1668b, 7). As we will see, one of Cavendish's motivations for accepting the latter view is that it makes sense of the order that we encounter in the natural world.

Cavendish is aware that she is writing in a tradition in which the prospect of thinking matter is not going to be taken seriously. In the eyes of many of her contemporaries and predecessors, matter is not only unintelligent, but also inert and utterly worthless. She writes,

I perceive man has a great spleen against self-moving corporeal nature, although himself is part of her, and the reason is his ambition; for he would fain be supreme, and above all other creatures, as more towards a divine nature: he would be a God, if arguments could make him such….[4]

Cavendish does not accept a conception of matter according to which matter is low-grade being. Her view that minds are corporeal is not the view that minds are

composed of raggs and shreds, but it is the purest, simplest and subtillest [sic] matter in Nature. (Cavendish 1664, 180)

Cavendish will argue that the processes that are traditionally identified as material are wondrous and impressive and that the processes that she would identify as material, but that others would identify as immaterial, are even more so.

2. Intelligent Matter in the History of Philosophy

Cavendish is working within a philosophical tradition in which the doctrine that matter is self-moving and intelligent is almost completely unintelligible. To those of her opponents who allow that the doctrine can be entertained, it is unlikely at best, and if true it is a terrible disappointment.

For example, in Plato we find the view that “the philosopher frees the soul from association with the body as much as possible” (Plato, 64e-65a). For Plato, souls are invisible and intangible and hence indivisible and divine, and bodies are their complete opposite (78b-80b). We know from an analysis of our concept of body, and from our presumably related observation of the sudden inactivity of things that die, that animated bodies have a soul and that bodies on their own are inert (105c-e). A soul is obviously what activates and enlivens a body, and the opposite of a soul, its body, is “death” (105e). Our embodiment and our resulting physical needs incline us to pursue sensible objects, but these are not worthy of our attention, and they interfere with our ability to attend to things that are.

We find a similar contempt for the body in prominent philosophers of later ancient philosophy and in medieval and early modern philosophers as well. In “On Beauty,” Plotinus speaks to “the darkness inherent in matter” (Plotinus, I.6, 37). He praises the sensible, but only to the extent that it imitates immaterial ideas and minds:

This is why fire glows with a beauty beyond all other bodies, for fire holds the rank of idea in their regard. Always struggling aloft, this subtlest of elements is at the last limits of the bodily. …It sparkles and glows like an idea. (Ibid.)

Fire is still material, of course, and material things are no substitute for things that are immaterial and (hence) divine (40). Plotinus continues,

[A]n ugly soul… is friend to filthy pleasures, it lives a life abandoned to bodily sensation and enjoys its depravity. …If someone is immersed in mire or daubed with mud, his native comeliness disappears; all one sees is the mire and mud with which he is covered. Ugliness is due to the alien matter that encrusts him. If he would be attractive once more, he has to wash himself, get clean again, make himself what he was before. Thus we would be right in saying that ugliness of soul comes from its mingling with, fusion with, collapse into the bodily and material…. (39)

In a word, Plotinus thinks that we should do all that we can to mitigate the unfortunate fact of our embodiment and instead engage in philosophical reflection. A hundred years later Augustine repeats the same view exactly:

How highly do you value th[e] will? You surely do not think it should be compared with wealth or honours or physical pleasures, or even all of these together. …Then should we not rejoice a little that we have something in our souls—this very thing that I call a good will—in comparison with which those things we mentioned are utterly worthless…? (Augustine, 19)

For Augustine, body is so bad that sin consists in turning our attention away from eternal things to things that are temporal and corporeal (27).

This kind of thinking finds its way into the seventeenth century as well. In the Cartesian (and very Augustinian and Platonic) philosopher Nicolas Malebranche, we find the view that bodies are “inferior things” that are essentially passive and inert (Malebranche 1674–5, VI.ii.3, 447, 448). He brings together the whole spectrum of themes that are advanced by his body-hating predecessors. In Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion, his spokesperson Theodore says to his opponent Aristes that our embodiment is a burden and that we should neutralize it to whatever extent we can:

You are now ready to make thousands and thousands of discoveries in the land of truth. Distinguish ideas from sensations, but distinguish them well…. Your modalities are only darkness, remember that. Silence your senses, your imagination and your passions, and you will hear the pure voice of inner truth, the clear and evident responses of our common master. Never confound evidence, which results from the comparison of ideas, with the vivacity of the sensations which affect and disturb you. The more vivid our sensations, the more they spread darkness. …In a word, avoid all that affect you and quickly embrace all that enlightens you. We must follow Reason despite the seductions, the threats, the insults of the body to which we are united, despite the action of the objects surrounding us. (Malebranche 1688, III.viii, 36)

For Malebranche, the search for truth is very literally a matter of retreating to the study, where the possibility is minimized that we will be distracted by the lures of the sensible world. In Malebranche's (and Cavendish's) contemporary Ralph Cudworth we find a similar disgust for the body. Cudworth argues that there is a hierarchy of being that applies to creatures and that minds are at the top. Bodies are dead and lowly, and are squarely at the bottom:

There is unquestionably, a Scale or Ladder of Nature, and Degrees of Perfection and Entity, one above another, as of Life, Sense, and Cogitation, above Dead, Sensless and Unthinking Matter; or Reason and Understanding above Sense, &c.[5]

Cudworth is certainly aware that the bodies that surround us are active and engage in behaviors that are orderly and (at least apparently) teleological, but none of this is evidence that matter is not dead. Cudworth concludes that because matter is dead, its orderly and purposive behavior can only be explained on the assumption that it is accompanied by a (necessarily immaterial) guide (Cunning 2010).

There are other philosophers in the seventeenth century who agree that matter is a detestable sort of being, but conclude that it does not exist, or at least that it does not exist as conceived by the tradition. In Anne Conway we find the view that God would not, and did not, create it:

how can any dead thing proceed from him or be created by him, such as mere body or matter…? It has truly been said that God does not make death. It is equally true that he did not make any dead thing, for how can a dead thing come from him who is infinite life and love? Or, how can any creature receive so vile and diminished an essence from him (who is so infinitely generous and good)…? (Conway 1690, 45)

For Conway, God creates only beings that are alive, and so the everyday objects that surround us are something other than what Plotinus, Malebranche and Digby had thought. There exists nothing that is brute, inert, and unthinking, and instead there is a continuum of creatures that exist on a spectrum from highly intelligent and active to largely dim and dull. Cavendish agrees with Conway that nothing answers to the traditional conception of matter, but unlike Conway she is happy to say that matter surrounds us. Cavendish and Conway are for the most part in agreement; she [Cavendish] simply rejects the traditional conception of matter as inadequate, and then proceeds to argue that the things that our concept of matter has always picked out—the things that our language has designated as ‘material’—are something more. Unlike many of her opponents, she is not disappointed by the result that minds are material. She thinks on the contrary that it is a source of hope. For example, if we appreciate that minds are corporeal, we will be able to come up with better and more systematic and less groping treatments of mental illness.[6] As evidence for her view, Cavendish points to the obvious facts that a person's mood and energy are affected by nutrition (Cavendish 1663, 431–2), and that old age and injury to the brain can neutralize some of our cognitive functions (Cavendish 1668b, 85–6, 113; Cavendish 1663, 334–5). Cavendish is breaking with her tradition and arguing that the fulfillment of a person is not a matter of turning away from the body but understanding all of its dynamics and embracing it.[7]

3. Arguments for Materialism

An important strand in Cavendish's argument for materialism is her defense of the view that matter thinks. If she can successfully defend this view, then the fact of the existence of thinking will not be evidence against the view that everything is material. One of her arguments for the doctrine of thinking matter begins with the assumption that our minds are housed in our bodies. She assumes that we are being serious when we say that our thinking takes place in the head, and concludes that to the extent to which we are speaking literally our thoughts must have a location:

I would ask those, that say the Brain has neither sense, reason, nor self-motion, and therefore no Perception; but that all proceeds from an Immaterial Principle, and an Incorporeal Spirit, distinct from the body, which moveth and actuates corporeal matter; I would fain ask them, I say, where their Immaterial Ideas reside, in what part or place of the Body? …[I]f it [the spirit] have no dimension, how can it be confined in a material body?[8]

Since “[p]lace [is] an attribute that belongs onely to a Body” (Cavendish 1664, 8), minds and their ideas are material.

A related reason that Cavendish offers in favor of the view that thinking is material is that
Though Matter might be without Motion, yet Motion cannot be without matter; for it is impossible (in my opinion) that there should be an Immaterial Motion in Nature.[9]

Cavendish takes it to be obvious that ideas are located in the brain, and she is thereby committed to the view that when a person travels from one place to another, the person's mind changes location as well. Cavendish is appealing to the premise that there is no immaterial motion as further support her view that minds are material, and she is implicitly assuming the premise that when a person travels from one place to another, so do the thoughts that the person has along the way. She is anticipating a line of argumentation that we later find in Locke:

No Body can imagine, that his Soul can think, or move a Body at Oxford, whilst he is at London; and cannot but know, that being united to his Body, it constantly changes place all the whole Journey, between Oxford and London, as the Coach, or Horse does, that carries him; and, I think, may be said to be truly all that while in motion…. (Locke 1689, 307)

Here Locke only hints at the conclusion that minds are material, but Cavendish by contrast is not concerned to pull any punches.[10] The thesis that matter thinks is an unrevisable element of her philosophical system. It is not an unwelcome appendage but instead is a straightforward consequence of tenets that she takes to be obvious.

Pulling the two arguments together, modifications like motion and location pertain only to bodies, and because our minds travel with our bodies and are housed in them, they are material. Cavendish is in effect trying to corner her opponent into explaining what the sense is in which minds move or have a location if they are not material. A figure like Leibniz is comfortable elucidating the nature of (immaterial) minds in terms of the language of windows, dizziness, ponds and spatial perspective (Monadology, sections 7, 21, 67, 57). Cavendish is insisting that the language of location and dimension applies to bodies alone.

Another argument that Cavendish puts forward for the view that thinking is material is from mind-body interaction. First, she presupposes a standard materialist premise: that nothing can interact with or come into contact with a body but a body. She writes,

In fine, I cannot conceive, how a Spirit … can have the effects of a body, being none it self; for the effects flow from the cause; and as the cause is, so are its effects…. (Cavendish 1664, 197)

it is, in my opinion, more probable, that one material should act upon another material, or one immaterial should act upon another immaterial, then that an immaterial should act upon a material or corporeal. (Cavendish 1664, 207)

This is a standard kind of argument that we find in philosophers ranging from Lucretius to Gassendi to Spinoza to Searle: that things cannot stand in causal relations with bodies unless they are material themselves.[11] But Cavendish aims to extend the argument. Our bodies interact with our minds, and so our minds must be material; but anything that our minds detect must be material as well. Anything that we know, anything that we try to explain, anything that we theorize about, anything that we encounter, anything of which we can become aware—these are all material. Cavendish writes,

Wherefore no part of nature (her parts being corporeal) can perceive an immaterial; because it is impossible to have a perception of that which is not perceptible, as not being an object fit or proper for corporeal perception.[12]

[N]atural reason cannot know nor have naturally any perception or idea of an Incorporeal being. (Cavendish 1668a, 78)

Our minds are material, but the only things that they can come into contact with and detect are things that are material as well. Even if there happen to be immaterials in our environment, we cannot perceive or form ideas of them, and hence the entities that we do conceive and discuss are not these immaterials but something else. Cavendish writes,

there may be supernatural spiritual beings or substances in Nature, without any hinderance to Matter or corporeal Nature. The same I may say of the natural material, and the divine and supernatural Soul; for though the divine Soul is in a natural body, and both their powers and actions be different, yet they cause no ruine or disturbance to each other….[13]

Nature is a corporeal substance, and without a substance Motion cannot be, and without Motion opposition cannot be made, nor any action in Nature…. (Cavendish 1664, 242)

Instead of trying to circumscribe every single existent and then offer an account of each in turn, Cavendish assumes the existence of the material objects in our local surroundings and argues that because our minds detect them, our minds are material, as is everything else that we come to encounter. Immaterial things might exist, Cavendish is certainly conceding, but if so they are nothing to us, and are not included in the domain of inquiry when we do metaphysics or science.

Sometimes Cavendish comes close to saying something even stronger: that material things are the only things that exist or are real. For example, she writes,

[Immaterial things are] Non-beings, for they are the weakest of all, and can do her [Nature] the least hurt, as not being able to obstruct real and corporeal actions of Nature…. (Cavendish 1664, 242)

If Cavendish holds that the only things that are real are things that have a location and can come into contact with bodies, she is not alone. Her contemporary Thomas Hobbes argued along the same lines:

The World, (I mean no the Earth onely, that denominates the Lovers of it Worldly men, but the Universe, that is, the whole masse of all things that are) is Corporeall, that is to say, Body; and hath the dimensions of Magnitude, namely, Length, Breadth, and Depth: also every part of Body, is likewise Body, and hath the like dimensions; and consequently every part of the Universe, is Body; and that which is not Body, is no part of the Universe: And because the Universe is All, that which is no part of it, is Nothing; and consequently no where. Nor does it follow from hence, that Spirits are nothing: for they have dimensions, and are therefore really Bodies…. (Hobbes 1651, xlvi.15, 463)

Cavendish does subscribe to the view that only material things are real and substantial,[14] but she is not thereby committed to the view that the only existents are material. She might hold that our word ‘real’ picks out things that are tangible and spatial, but that there are other existents as well. Cavendish suggests as much when she says that we might be surrounded by immaterials, but that we cannot detect them. She also emphasizes that when she denies the existence of immaterials, she is merely denying the existence of natural immaterials — she is saying that the ideas and minds that we detect and know are a part of nature and hence are material. She writes,

all that is called Immaterial, is a Natural Nothing, and an Immaterial Natural Substance, in my opinion, is non-sense…. (Cavendish 1664, 321)

Cavendish is committed to saying that the ideas and minds that we encounter are a part of nature and are material. She is not thereby denying the existence of immaterials simpliciter. She is committed to the view that there are no natural immaterials.

A problem that arises, however, is that Cavendish also appears to be committed to saying that human minds cannot perceive or detect immaterials and that we cannot form ideas of them. For example, she says that “when we name God, we name an Unexpressible, and Incomprehensible Being” (Cavendish 1664, 315). She adds that “God is a spiritual, supernatural, and incomprehensible infinite…” (Cavendish 1668a, 220). Cavendish suggests (very strongly) that we can think and speak of immaterials in her remark that they might in fact surround us; she says that even if they did, we would be none the wiser. But still the question remains about how Cavendish can allow that we are able to think or talk about immaterials at all, if we are not able to perceive or detect or have ideas of them.

There are a number of ways that Cavendish might maneuver here. One would be to defend the thesis that although our natural (and hence material) minds can form no conception of an immaterial, there is another aspect of our minds — an aspect that is not material — and it can form conceptions of immaterials. Cavendish hints at the thesis when she states that natural reason cannot have an idea of an incorporeal being, leaving open that non-natural reason could have an idea of an incorporeal being. A problem of course is that Cavendish does not seem to be able to allow that natural reason can have an idea of non-natural reason or that it can put forward the thesis that non-natural reason can form conceptions of immaterials.

Another maneuver would be to make a distinction between knowledge and faith and argue that although our minds cannot detect immaterials or have any evidence for their existence, there must be some way in which our minds are able to conceive of immaterials (such as God), or else we would not even be capable of faith. Cavendish writes for example that

the rational [component of the mind] perceives some effects of the omnipotent power of God; which effects are perceptible by finite creatures, but not his infinite nature, nor essence, nor the cause of his infiniteness and omnipotency. (Ibid., 90).

A problem of course is that if Cavendish is committed to the view that natural reason can form no conception of an immaterial, then she can allow that we have ideas of things that are the effect of an immaterial cause, but it is difficult to see how we could have an idea of that immaterial cause itself.

A third maneuver that Cavendish could make is to say that when she talks in the language of immaterials, she is using terms that she does not take to be referential, but that are still serving an important communicative role. For example, when she speaks of the immaterial souls that might surround us, and the way in which they would be nothing to us, she might be trying to make a point in the language of her opponents. They speak in terms of immaterials, and Cavendish might want to attempt to engage them. A problem for the view that Cavendish is making this third maneuver is that the view is not supported by textual evidence, but just by systematic evidence — for example, that Cavendish holds that natural reason cannot have an idea of an immaterial.

A final interpretive proposal is that in some cases Cavendish might be using the language of immaterials to exhibit piety and devotion. There is a further discussion of this proposal, and also the third maneuver, in section six below.

For Cavendish, philosophical inquiry is not a matter of attempting to converge on an understanding of all that there is. It is instead a matter of satisfying our curiosity as to the details of those things that have already gotten (or that are capable of getting) our attention. It is a matter of attempting to converge on what our language has designated as ‘real’. There may be things that are not material, but these cannot be the subject of investigation (at least not by us). We cannot speak or think or theorize about them. It would appear that strictly speaking we cannot even make the assertion that these things might exist, as we do not have any ideas of them. Cavendish speaks of them nonetheless, and we are left with the interpretive question of why.

A final argument that Cavendish offers for the view that matter thinks and is intelligent is from the orderly behavior of bodies. One of the longstanding puzzles of seventeenth-century philosophy and science was how to explain this behavior. Cudworth lays out the puzzle very neatly. First, he offers a trilemma:

since neither all things are produced Fortuitously, or by the Unguided Mechanism of Matter, nor God himself may reasonably be thought to do all things Immediately and Miraculously; it may well be concluded, that there is a Plastick Nature under him, which as an Inferior and Subordinate Instrument, doth Drudgingly Execute that Part of his Providence, which consists in the Regular and Orderly Motion of Matter. (Cudworth 1678, 150)

Cudworth settles on the third horn of the trilemma after ruling out the other two. Bodies are dumb and dead, and so are not the source of their own order, and it would be beneath God to attend to bodily affairs Himself (Cunning 2003, 348–50). Cudworth also considers a fourth option—that the orderly behavior of bodies is secured by the existence of laws of nature.[15] He concludes that it is not an additional option after all but is subsumed by the other three:

These men (I say) seem not very well to understand themselves in this. Forasmuch as they must of necessity, either suppose these their Laws of Motion to execute themselves, or else be forced perpetually to concern the Deity in the Immediate Motion of every Atom of Matter throughout the Universe, in Order to the Execution and Observation of them… we cannot make any other Conclusion than this, That they do but unskillfully and unawares establish that very Thing which in words they oppose; and that their Laws of Nature concerning Motion, are Really nothing else, but a Plastick Nature… (Cudworth 1678, 151)

Here Cudworth is pointing out, and Cavendish will agree, that we do not account for the orderly behavior of bodies by positing laws of nature if we do not know what a law of nature is or how it operates. On Cudworth's view, the orderly behavior of bodies is secured by immaterial minds (or plastic natures) that attach to bodies and work to keep them on the rails. In something like the way that our (immaterial) minds intelligently guide our bodies, plastic natures intelligently guide the bodies that compose the plant and animal and mineral world. Cavendish agrees with a [highly modified] version of this last statement. She will raise the objection, though, that minds that move and come into contact with and attach to bodies must be material themselves.

Like Cudworth, Cavendish generates her view on the orderly behavior of bodies from a rejection of the Epicurean doctrine that the order that we encounter in nature arises by chance. She writes,

[T]hough the Opinion of Atoms is as Old as from the Time of Epicurus, yet my Conceptions of their Figures, Creating and Disposing, are New, and my Own. ...It is not probable that the Substance of Infinite matter is only Infinite, Small, Senseless Fibres, Moving and Composing all Creatures by Chance, and that Chance should produce all things in such order and Method, unless every Single Atome were Animated Matter, having Animated Motion, which is Sense and Reason, Life and Knowledge.[16]

Something is keeping bodies in line, according to Cavendish, and to do its job it must be active and knowledgeable and perceptive. It cannot be immaterial, however, and so

If nature were not Self-knowing, Self-living, and also Perceptive, she would run into Confusion: for there could be neither Order, nor Method, in Ignorant motion….[17]

Cavendish rejects the view that matter is not capable of engaging in orderly behavior on its own. It does not require the assistance of a plastic nature, for example, and it is not clear how such a thing could be of any help anyway. Cavendish is indeed shocked at the temerity of those who think that we can speak intelligibly of an immaterial divine being but then allow that some of its creatures would be dead and barren. She writes,

I cannot imagine why God should make an Immaterial Spirit to be the Proxy or Vice-gerent of his Power, or the Quarter-master General of his Divine Providence, as your Author is pleased to style it, when he is able to effect it without any Under-Officers, and in a more easie and compendious way, as to impart immediately such self-moving power to Natural Matter, which man attributes to an Incorporeal Spirit. (Cavendish 1664, 215)

Cavendish does not appear to allow that we can speak intelligibly of God (or other immaterials), and so perhaps she is making the point that if we could, we would conclude that whatever He would pack into such a proxy He would have packed into bodies in the first place.[18] They would be knowledgeable of the order that they are supposed to realize, and they would know the details of the bodies in their vicinity.[19]

There are some potential problems with Cavendish's argumentation for the view that matter thinks. For example, her argument that it is inconceivable that minds should have location and not be material might seem to contradict another argument that features prominently in her system (and that is considered more fully in section 4). The latter argument (in brief) is that most of the things that occur in the natural corporeal world are incomprehensible to us in the sense that we do not understand why bodies have the brute capacities by which they do all that they do. Cavendish considers the example of magnetic attraction, and familiar Humean examples like the ability of certain foods to nourish, and argues that although we do not understand how or why bodies have the capacities that they do, bodies have them nonetheless. She offers all of these examples in defense of her view that matter thinks: we do not understand how it thinks, but that is just a fact about us and what we are in a position to find intelligible. To return to the issue of potential objections to Cavendish's argumentation for materialism, she appears to leave herself open to the objection that although we may not understand how minds could be immaterial and also have a location and move, minds might in fact be immaterial movers. Cavendish might reply to this objection by making a distinction between things that are inconceivable in the sense that there is a contradiction in our conception of them, and things that are inconceivable in the weaker sense that we lack the cognitive resources to understand them. If she can argue that as a matter of conceptual fact motion is a matter of changing locations, and that only bodies have location, then there would be a contradiction in saying that a thing moves but is not material. A similar objection applies to Cavendish's argument that we do not understand how immaterial minds and bodies could interact with each other, and presumably she would respond along the same lines. She might insist that interaction is just a matter of making contact, but contact is the kind of thing that can only occur between bodies.

Another potential objection is in effect a reductio response to Cavendish's argument that the bodies that surround us need to be intelligent if they are to exhibit the order that they do. The objection is simply that bodies are not intelligent, and so there must be some other explanation for that order. Here I think that Cavendish might just bite the bullet, and insist that in fact it is not a bullet, and respond that a number of the predications that we make of the objects that surround us presuppose that those objects are intelligent. We notice that ants and spiders engage in behaviors that are smart and sophisticated, or to use an example that Cudworth likes, that the fingers of an “exercised lutonist” are able to create beautiful music without being conscious, and without the lutonist thinking about fingers at all (Cudworth 1678, 157). We might point to other examples of expert behavior that are more mundane and reflect on how we can get tripped up if we attempt to bring that behavior to the level of attention. Cavendish would grant that some of us might squirm at using expressions like “muscle memory”, but she would worry that when we do (squirm), we are in the grip of a theory, and a theory that has us denying the obvious.

A different objection that Cavendish faces is that there is something odd in saying that minds move or that they are spatial. There are plenty of figures in the history of philosophy who have posited the existence of entities that are not in space, even though these entities still in some way apply to, or are a part of, everyday objects. Most famously, perhaps, is Plato's positing of the existence of numbers, perfect geometrical figures, and other universal entities. Here Cavendish and her opponents are presumably at loggerheads. There may be something odd about saying that minds move, she would insist, but there is something even more odd about saying that the entirety of person can move from one location to another without being accompanied by their mind. Perhaps our minds exist in a non-spatial Platonic realm, or are otherwise non-spatial, but Cavendish is asking that we take seriously the possibility that the language of moving minds might only be unusual against the background of an impoverished conception of matter.

4. The Intelligibility of the Capacities of Matter

One of the objections that Cavendish has to address, courtesy of her seventeenth-century opponents, is that the prospect of thinking matter is unintelligible and thus that it is false that all of reality is material. For example, Descartes insists that something is not a property of a body unless there is a conceptual tie between it and the essence of body:

[E]xtension in length, breadth and depth constitutes the nature of corporeal substance; and thought constitutes the nature of thinking substance. Everything else which can be attributed to body presupposes extension, and is merely a mode of an extended thing; and similarly, whatever we find in the mind is simply one of the various modes of thinking. For example, shape is unintelligible except in an extended thing; and motion is unintelligible except as motion in an extended space; while imagination, sensation and will are intelligible only in a thinking thing. (Descartes 1644, I.53, 210–1)

For Descartes, shape is a property of bodies because something cannot be a shape unless it is the shape of an extended thing. Motion is a property of bodies because something cannot have motion unless it has a location and so cannot have motion unless it is extended (Descartes 1644, II.25–27). Our thoughts and volitions, however, cannot be conceived as having length, breadth, or depth. We find a similar argument in the work of Malebranche:

Can a thing extended in length, width, and depth reason, desire, sense? Undoubtedly not, for all the ways of being of such an extended thing consist only in relations of distance; and it is evident that these relations are not perceptions, reasonings, pleasures, desires, sensations—in a word, thoughts. Therefore this I that thinks, my own substance, is not a body, since my perceptions, which surely belong to me, are something entirely different from relations of distance. (Malebranche 1688, 6)

For Malebranche, “the ways of being” of a body are restricted to what can be understood as bearing relations of distance to other things. It is impossible to conceive of a thought as having a size, or as being a certain distance from another thought or from a body, so a thought is not a body or the property of a body (Cunning 2006).

Cavendish could not disagree more. In tackling the question of the nature of mind, her first order of business is to establish that matter thinks. Only then does she consider the question of whether or not we can understand how it thinks. She argues that we do not and that it is not surprising that we do not, given that we do not know the answer to hardly any of the how and why questions about the things that we encounter in nature. For example,

we have only found that Effect of the Load-stone, as to draw Iron to it, but the Attracting motion is in obscurity, being Invisible to the Sense of Man, so that his reason can only Discourse, and bring Probabilities to Strengthen his Arguments, having no Perfect Knowledge in that, nor in any thing else; besides, that Knowledge we have of several things, comes as it were by Chance, or by Experience, for certainly, all the Reason man hath, would never have found out that one Effect of the Load-stone, as to draw Iron, had not Experience or chance presented it to us, nor the Effect of the Needle…. (Cavendish 1663, 191)

For Cavendish, the fact that we do not understand how matter thinks is not evidence that matter does not think. If it was, then we would have evidence against the occurrence of many of the phenomena that we encounter on a daily basis. Anticipating Hume, Cavendish is arguing that particular causal relations are not known a priori, and that if we did not have the relevant experience, every causal connection would seem just as arbitrary as any other (Hume 1748, 112). There is “Natural Magick” (Cavendish 1664, 299), according to Cavendish, even in the case of things that we take to be wholly unmysterious:

the Load-stone may work as various effects upon several Subjects as Fire, but by reason we have not so much Experience of one as the other, the Strangeness creates a Wonder, for the Old saying is, that Ignorance is the Mother of Admiration, but Fire, which produces greater Effects by Invisible motions, yet we stand not at such Amaze, as at the Load-stone, because these Effects are Familiar unto us.[20]

Cavendish is again pre-figuring Hume. The attraction of a magnet is mysterious, she insists, but so is the power of fire, and the “Knowledge we have of several things” is on a par. This is a sustained theme throughout her corpus.[21]

For example, we do not understand why the bodies that are involved in digestion would work together to digest, rather than to do something else (Cavendish 1664, 358–9). Nor do we know why the bodies that compose water and ice are transparent, when the bodies that come together to form other beings are not (Cavendish 1664, 472). We can speculate on these, but in the end

Natures actions are not onely curious, but very various; and not onely various, but very obscure….[22]

Thinking matter is no exception:

you might as well enquire how the world, or any part of it was created, or how the variety of creatures came to be, as ask how Reason and sensitive corporeal Knowledg [sic] was produced.[23]

Bodies in the natural world clearly have capacities, Cavendish is maintaining, and it is by such capacities that they do what they do. We do not understand why a particular body or configuration of bodies would have the particular capacities that it does, and there is no special problem posed by the fact that we cannot understand how matter thinks (Cunning 2006).

As we saw in section III, Cavendish's metaphysics is circumscribed insofar as it does not aim to constitute a complete account of all that there is. In addition, it will provide only limited accounts of the things whose existence it does capture. Cavendish is fully aware of the limits of her project, and indeed part of that project is to motivate the view that we do not understand nearly as much as we ordinarily presume (Clucas 2003, 202–4; Broad 2007, 496–7). Anticipating Hume yet again, and also Locke, she is supposing that once we identify the line beyond which philosophical inquiry is no longer productive, we will devote our energies elsewhere, and to better effect. She writes,

there are none more intemperate than Philosophers; first, in their vain Imaginations of nature; next, in the difficult and nice Rules of Morality: So that this kind of Study kils [sic] all the Industrious Inventions that are beneficial and Easy for the Life of Man, and makes one fit onely to dye, and not to live. But this kind of Study is not wholly to be neglected, but used so much, as to ballance [sic] a Man, though not to fix him; for Natural Philosophy is to be used as a Delight and Recreation in Mens Studies, as Poetry is, since they are both but Fictions, and not a Labour in Mans Life. But many men make their Study their Graves, and bury themselves before they are dead.[24]

Many of the sharpest minds are engaged in the pursuit of goals that are in fact a dead end. These individuals could be working on down-to-earth projects that benefit mankind generally; and by expressing their nature in a more sustainable way, they would be happier themselves.

5. Occasional Causation and the Orderly Behavior of Bodies

An interesting wrinkle in Cavendish's view of the orderly behavior of bodies is her insistence that when bodies interact they do not transfer motion to each other.[25] Instead, the bodies communicate with each other about how to coordinate their behavior, and each is then the source of its own motion. On the assumption that properties cannot literally slide or hop from one body to another, cases in which one body does take on the motion of another body would be cases in which the second body also takes on the matter that has that motion. But we do not observe a body to become more massive when it is moved as a result of its contact with another body. As Cavendish explains in her description of a hand that moves a bowl,

I cannot think it probable, that any of the animate or self-moving matter in the hand, quits the hand, and enters into the bowl; nor that the animate matter, which is in the bowl, leaves the bowl and enters into the hand. (Cavendish 1664, 445)

Cavendish adds that “if it did, the hand would in a short time become weak and useless, by losing so much substance….”[26] She instead proposes that when one body appears to move another, it is simply an occasion or prompt for the second body to move on its own. The second body moves in the right way in response to the first body (and the other bodies in its vicinity), but only because all bodies are intelligent and perceptive and (for the most part) agreeable, and they communicate with each other about how to proceed.[27]

Bodies are not only the source of their own motion, according to Cavendish. They have enough packed into them that there is a sense in which they are even the cause of their own perceptions. A potentially counter-intuitive view, Cavendish would argue that the available alternative accounts of perception make no sense at all and that her own view is a close and more coherent cousin of the prevailing (mechanist) view of her time. First, she rejects the scholastic doctrine that perception of an object is a matter of receiving from that object an immaterial image or species or form of itself.[28] Such a thing would have to travel from one object to another, and so it would have to be material. Cavendish also rejects the mechanist view according to which perception is a matter of light or other microscopic media travelling from one body to another and then producing an image of the first body in the mind of the second. She worries that

this opinion is like Epicurus' of atoms; but how absurd it is to make senseless corpuscles, the cause of sense and reason, and consequently of perception, is obvious to everyone's apprehension, and needs no demonstration. (Cavendish 1668a, 147)

The absurdity of the opinion needs no demonstration, but fortunately Cavendish elaborates. The opinion is absurd because, at the point of interaction or contact with the perceiver, the material media are completely severed from the perceived object, and if they are not themselves copies of that object, and if they do not carry within themselves any image of it, they do not bring along the resources to produce a perception of it specifically, or to produce any perception at all. In her own words, Cavendish says that it is unlikely that

a substanceless and senseless motion, should make a progressive journey from the object to the sentient, and there print, figure, and colour upon the optic sense, by a bare agitation or concussion, so that the perception or apparition (as they call it) of an object, should only be according to the stroke the agitation makes…. (Ibid.)

Cavendish instead argues that when one body perceives another, the second body by its own power generates an image or “pattern” of the first body. She writes,

By prints I understand the figures of the objects which are patterned or copied out by the sensitive and rational corporeal figurative motions; as for example, when the sensitive corporeal motions pattern out the figure of an exterior object, and the rational motions again pattern out a figure made by the sensitive motions, those figures of the objects that are patterned out, I name prints … Thus by prints I understand patterns, and by printing patterning. … [It is] not that the exterior object prints its figure upon the exterior sensitive organs, but that the sensitive motions in the organs pattern out the figure of the object. (Cavendish 1664, 539–40)

For Cavendish, perception is an almost entirely active process. Although the objects that we sense put constraints on the images that we produce of them, we produce those images in their entirety.[29] Her mechanist opponents might raise the objection, and we might object as well, that the power by which we produce such images is mysterious and occult, and not at all explanatory. Cavendish has a ready reply. According to the view of her opponents, the microscopic bodies that affect our senses do not have qualities like color or taste or smell, but they somehow are able to make us have sensations of these. On this view, the color- and taste- and odor-less microscopic bodies might serve as a kind of trigger, but the production of the relevant sensations is due in large part to dispositions and capacities that are found on the side of the perceiver.

Cavendish holds that when one body appears to transfer motion to another, the second body moves of its own accord, but does so in the light of its communication with the first body. Part of the story is that the “moved” body forms informational images of the body that “moves” it and of the other bodies in its environment. Commentators have worried that even if we allow Cavendish the view that bodies are active and vital and the source of their own motion, she has no way to account for how it is that bodies communicate so successfully with each other if nothing is transmitted between them. Bodies seem to “suggest” (Detlefsen 2007, 168), or “induc[e]” (O'Neill 2001, xxx), or perhaps they transmit “a sort of signal that triggers the self-motion” of the body that moves (Michaelian 2009, 47), but the question is how they do this. As Detlefsen writes,

Although it is true that there is no transfer of motion between bodies in cases of interaction by occasional causation, there is still some sort of causal interaction [when the first body induces the second body to act]…. How is this possible if nothing is physically transferred? (Detlefsen 2007, 168)

O'Neill points the way to an answer. First, she points out that even though (for Cavendish) a body never transfers its motion to a second body, it still serves as a partial cause of its movement (O'Neill 2001, xxx-xxxi). Cavendish says,

I do not say, that the motion of the hand does not contribute to the motion of the ball; for though the ball has its own natural motion in itself … nevertheless the motion of the ball would not move by such an exterior local motion, did not the motion of the hand, or any other exterior moving body give it occasion to move that way; wherefore the motion of the hand may very well be said to be the cause of that exterior local motion of the ball, but not to be the same motion by which the ball moves. (Cavendish 1664, 447–8)

In line with the results of section III, Cavendish is applying the view that bodies must come into contact with each other in order to interact. She does not think that bodies transfer any motion to each other, but she does think that motion is a precondition for interaction: “and without Motion opposition cannot be made, nor any action in Nature…” (Cavendish 1664, 242). She thus appears to hold that at the point of mutual contact one body triggers the perceptual activity and self-motion of another, but we are still left with the question of how the first body does this. That is, we are left with the question of how the second body comes to acquire all of the information that it needs to act in a coordinated and orderly way. Cavendish does not make clear the process by which this occurs (Detlefsen 2006, 232), but she gives us enough material to allow us to speculate. She says that the second body forms a pattern of the first body; it makes a “copy” of it (Cavendish 1668a, 187). If the second body makes a copy of the first, and if it does so at the point of interaction, then one obvious proposal is that the first body presents an image of itself at that point of interaction. The second body then copies it at that location. Cavendish says nothing that rules out this proposal, and in addition she is clear that ideas often move from one location to another. She is also clear that part of what it is for a body to think and be intelligent is for it to have self-knowledge,[30] which other bodies would presumably be able to copy if they were properly situated. Cavendish has to be able to offer an account along these lines if she is going to be able to reject as less plausible the views of her scholastic and mechanist opponents. She herself thinks that qualities like color and smell and taste literally exist in objects and that a perceiving body patterns all of these.[31] If microscopic bodies are not able to literally produce the resulting perception, and if they simply prompt the perceiver to produce the perception on its own, they also make available to the perceiver an image of the perceived body that allows for a comprehensive copy.

6. God

We have seen that Cavendish holds that natural reason cannot perceive or have an idea of an immaterial being. She says in particular that “when we name God, we name an Unexpressible, and Incomprehensible Being” (Cavendish 1664, 315). One way to reconcile her view that we cannot have ideas of immaterials with her numerous attempts to speak of God is to say that she is attempting to speak in the language of her opponents. A problem, however, is that there are passages in which she seems to want to be doing a lot more. For example, she writes that,

I Sent you word in my last, I would not meddle with writing any thing of the Divine Soul of Man, by reason it belongs to Faith and Religion, and not to Natural Philosophy; but since you desire my opinion concerning the Immortality of the Divine Soul, I cannot but answer you plainly, that first I did wonder much you made me question of that, whose truth, in my opinion, is so clear, as hardly any rational man will make a doubt of it; for I think there is almost no Christian in the world, but believes the Immortality of the Soul, no not Christians onely, but Mahometans and Jews: But I left to wonder at you, when I saw Wise and Learned Men, and great Divines, take so much pains as to write whole Volumes, and bring so many arguments to prove the Immortality of the Soul, for this was a greater Miracle to me, then if Nature had shewed me some of her secret and hidden effects, or if I had seen an Immaterial Spirit. Certainly, Madam, it seems as strange to me to prove the Immortality of the Soul, as to convert Atheists; for it is impossible, almost, that any Atheist should be found in the World: For what Man would be so senceless as to deny a God? Wherefore to prove either a God, or the Immortality of the Soul, is to make a man doubt of either: for as Physicians and Surgeons apply strengthening Medicines onely to those parts of the body which they suppose the weakest, so it is with proofs and arguments, those being for the most part used in such subjects, the truth of which is most questionable.

Here Cavendish is stating quite straightforwardly that we can have faith in the existence of immaterials, and in particular in the existence of God, but that immaterials are not within the province of natural reason. If so, Cavendish is reflecting the view that our best and only interface with God is via faith; she is reflecting her commitment to fideism.

A problem, of course, is that it would seem that a person would need to have an idea of God in order to have faith that God exists. Cavendish is clear that we can have an idea of the effects of God's omnipotence, but she does not think that natural reason can have an idea of an immaterial itself. We can have an idea that there is a cause of these effects, but not an idea of what the cause is, or what it is that makes that idea and idea of God as opposed to something else. Cavendish might posit that we have supernatural and immaterial souls and that these can have an idea of God, but the question again is how she would be entitled to make suppositions about immaterial souls. One of her aims in circumscribing the limits of natural philosophy is presumably to make room for faith, but there is a worry that she has gone too far in holding that we cannot have ideas of immaterials. As Descartes remarks,

…[I]f someone says of himself that he does not have any idea of God,… he is making the most impious confession he could make. He is saying that he does not know God by natural reason, but also that neither faith nor any other means could give him any knowledge of God. For if one has no idea, i.e. no perception which corresponds to the meaning of the word ‘God’, it is no use saying that one believes that God exists. One might as well say that one believes that nothing exists, thus remaining in the abyss of impiety and the depths of ignorance. (Descartes 1641, 273)

God is not to be conceived or understood, according to Cavendish, but “is rather to be admired, adored and worshipped.” We do not have any idea of Him, however, and so it is difficult to make sense of how our intentional states could ever point specifically in His direction.

Cavendish appears to be committed to the view that the only things of which we can think or speak are the mundane things which surround us, or things that can come into contact with them and us but that are further off. In some passages, she refers to God and His infinitude in order highlight the limits of human understanding. In these passages, Cavendish might be speaking of God in ways that are in tension with her view that we do not have ideas of immaterials. An alternate explanation is that she might instead be attempting to rein in the ambitions of natural reason. She writes,

Shall or can we bind up Gods actions with our weak opinions and foolish arguments? Truly, if God could not act more then [sic] Man is able to conceive, he were not a God of an infinite Power; but God is Omnipotent, and his actions are infinite, supernatural, and past finding out; wherefore he is rather to be admired, adored and worshipped, then to be ungloriously discoursed of by vain and ambitious men, whose foolish pride and presumption drowns their Natural Judgment and Reason…. (Cavendish 1664, 527)

Cavendish is clear in this passage that if a finite mind is able to subsume a being under its necessarily limited ideas and categories, then whatever that being is, it is not God. Our attempts to investigate the ways and nature of God are hopeless, and accordingly, we should restrict our faculties to a subject matter to which they are appropriately fitted.[32] But we should still be appropriately humble and fallibilistic. Cavendish's criticism of the scientist William Harvey is a case in point:

he doth speak so presumptuously of Gods Actions, Designs, Decrees, Laws, Attributes, Power, and secret Counsels, and describes the manner, how God created all things, and the mixture of the Elements to an hair, as if he had been Gods Counsellor and Assistant in the work of Creation; which whether it be not more impiety, then to say Matter is Infinite, I'le let others judg [sic]. Neither do I think this expression to be against the holy Scripture; for though I speak as a natural Philosopher, and am unwilling to cite the Scripture, which onely treats of things belonging to Faith, and not to Reason; yet I think there is not any passage which plainly denies Matter to be infinite, and Eternal, unless it be drawn by force to that sense…. [A]lso the Scripture says, That Gods ways are unsearchable, and past finding out. (Cavendish 1664, 462)

Cavendish is not the most humble philosopher herself, but she is assuming that there is a difference between the domains that our minds are capable of investigating and the domains that piety suggests are not accessible to us. Infallibilism with respect to either domain is inappropriate, but it is especially so with respect to the second.[33]

In some passages Cavendish speaks of God to say that He is inconceivable and inexpressible. In other passages she speaks of God to say that our knowledge of His existence has to be via faith and not natural reason. In other passages she speaks of God to highlight the ways in which a finite mind should not expect to understand matters that are beyond it. In other passages she speaks of God to offer positive evidence for her view that everything in nature is material. For example, she says that it follows from the premise that God is good and just that He would make sure that all of His creatures would be able to worship Him, and so would make sure that all of His creatures had knowledge and perception (Cavendish 1664, 518–9). She also speaks of God's creation of everything, including the intellectual and perceptual capacities of matter, as a way of making sense of the teleology that we find (and that, given God's features, we would expect to find) in nature.[34]

Cavendish is not entitled to offer these arguments, it would seem. If she is not contradicting her view that we do not have ideas of immaterials, or her view that God is outside the province of natural reason, she might just be attempting to speak in the language of her opponents to show that their own (putative) commitments entail that her view is to be accepted instead. We know from her views on occasional causation that causal interaction is not a matter of an agent literally doing something to a patient, but of an “agent” communicating with a “patient” and the “patient” actively responding. In the case of some of the arguments that she offers, she might be assuming that the only way that she can get through to her opponents is to speak in terms with which they identify. If so, she would have to discount the arguments in question, as they could not be considered a part of natural philosophy. The overall defensibility of her views would not be affected so long as she had plenty of other arguments to offer — arguments of the sort that can be thought and expressed.

For all of its apparent problems, one of the reasons that it is important to remark upon Cavendish's view on our ability to conceive of God is to highlight that even though she thinks that the orderly behavior of bodies is due to intelligence, she does not subscribe to any version of a theory of intelligent design. There is a difference between the thesis that the orderly behavior of bodies is due to the intelligence and perceptual capacities of the bodies themselves and the thesis that it is due to the intelligence of a designer. Cavendish is assuming, though, that either thesis has to posit the existence of intelligent and perceptive matter. If God had created matter that was not equipped with the resources to detect the matter around it and act in ways that are coordinated, chaos would ensue almost immediately. Cavendish is forced to admit that if matter is intelligent and perceptive, there is no further explanation as to why it is intelligent and perceptive, or at least not one that can be known by natural reason. Intelligence and perceptive matter just is. It is something that has always existed (Cavendish 1664, 14, 462) and that has the resources within itself to bring about all the things that we observe it to bring about on a daily basis. She would side with Hume on the question of whether or not it is more likely that the only beings that exist with such resources are immaterial:

…when it is asked, what cause produces order in the ideas of the supreme Being, can any other reason be assigned by you, anthropomorphites, than that it is a rational faculty, and that such is the nature of the Deity? But why a similar answer will not be equally satisfactory in accounting for the order of the world, without having recourse to any such intelligent Creator as you insist on, may be difficult to determine. It is only to say, that such is the nature of material objects, and that they are all originally possessed of a faculty of order and proportion. (Hume 1779, dialogue 4, p. 65)

For Cavendish, matter has a tremendous number of resources built into it. If it is eternal, then we can offer no account of its origin, but in this respect the competing thesis that God is the source of the order in the universe is on a par. The latter thesis has additional problems, however: if God is wholly immaterial, then it is not clear how He could produce matter, or how He would be able to interact with it once it was made (Cavendish 1668a, 199–200; Cavendish 1668b, 241; Detlefsen 2009, 430); and if God's supremacy is inversely proportional to our finite ability to conceive of Him, it is difficult to see how our confidence about His nature and operations could be anything more than arrogance. Cavendish thinks that the view that matter has always existed and is the source of its own order is not only a contender, but is really the only option.

7. Social and Political Philosophy

An issue of interpretation that arises in the attempt to reconstruct Cavendish's social and political philosophy is that for the most part the texts in which she addresses social and political questions are not formal philosophical treatises but works of fiction. What is regarded as her central work on political philosophy, Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World, is a novel, and in another central text, Orations of Divers Sorts, Cavendish presents a multiplicity of opposing perspectives on social and political topics: gender roles, virtue, war, and the proper form of government, among others. Cavendish is indeed the author of Blazing World, but she also makes an appearance as a character, and it is difficult to be certain that all of the conclusions and insights of the narrator are ones that Cavendish would identify as her own. The interpretive problem is even worse in the case of Orations, as there are as many as three or four speeches that are offered on any given subject, and the speeches are in some cases contradictory. Still, there are a few texts in which Cavendish puts forward claims about social and political matters and in which she is clearly speaking in her own voice — in particular, World's Olio. We can use these claims to determine which of the perspectives she is endorsing in her more fictional work and to get a concrete sense of how she might follow up on these (Boyle 2006, 253–254).

Cavendish disagrees with Hobbes on a number of questions of natural philosophy. For Hobbes, thoughts and sensations are motions in the brain (Hobbes 1651, 27–28), and if he is right there is little difficulty making sense of how bodies think. There is just as much difficulty as there is explaining how bodies have motion. For Cavendish, it is a mystery how bodies think, and like a lot of the things that happen around us it is ultimately a matter of magic. Nor would Hobbes accept that when bodies interact their rational elements communicate with each other and co-ordinate their behavior. But on questions of social and political philosophy Cavendish and Hobbes to a significant degree align. Like Hobbes, Cavendish holds that human beings are primarily motivated by self-interest:

Self-love is the ground from which springs all Indeavours and Industry, Noble Qualities, Honourable Actions, Friendships, Charity, and Piety, and is the cause of all Passions, Affections, Vices and Virtues; for we do nothing, or think not of any thing, but hath a reference to our selves in one kind or other. (Cavendish 1655, 145)

She adds that self-love is “the strongest Motion of the Mind” (Ibid.). Also like Hobbes, Cavendish thinks that life outside of civil society is so dangerous and chaotic that it does not allow us to pursue our self-interest in a stable and consistent way. Outside of civil society, we cannot secure food or shelter without threat that they will be taken; we do not have, and we cannot create and sustain, the infrastructure that enables commerce; we cannot make plans; and the bulk of our energy is expended on security and safety in the moment. Orations offers multiple perspectives on social and political issues, but the emphasis on social stability is a constant (Boyle 2006, 258 and 282–286):

If [there is] no safety [there is] no propriety, either of goods, wives, children nor lives, and if there be no propriety there will be no husbandry and the lands will lie unmanured; also there will be neither trade nor traffic, all which will cause famine, war, and ruin, and such a confusion as the kingdom will be like a chaos. (Cavendish 1662a, 70)

As for Hobbes, for Cavendish the stability of civil society is not an end in itself; it is instead a necessary condition for us to pursue our self-interested projects and goals. If we remained in a state of nature, we would be in perpetual fear. We would not be likely to live very long, and we would not live well. We would not be healthy. We would not be able develop our latent skills and abilities, and we would not be able to engage in the activities of which those skills and abilities are an expression.

Cavendish also agrees with Hobbes that civil society is most stable and secure when it is ruled by a single individual who has absolute power and sovereignty (Lewis 2001, 345; Boyle 2006, 282). She writes,

This Commonwealth to be governed by one Head or Governour, as a King, for one Head is sufficient for one Body: for several Heads breed several Opinions, and several Opinions breed Disputations, and Disputations Factions, and Factions breed Wars, and Wars bring ruin and Desolation; for it is more safe to be governed, though by a Foolish Head, than a Factious Heart. (Cavendish 1655, 205–206)

If a sovereign is to have absolute power, there is some risk of course that they might use that power unwisely and in a way that does not optimally promote peace and stability. Cavendish is worried however about all of the alternatives. For example, democracy is not a sustainable option:

the common people is not only Insolent, when they have Power, Commanding Imperiously, Condemning Unjustly, Advancing Unworthily, but they are so Inconstant, as there is no Assurance in them, and so Foolish, as they Know not what to Choose. (Cavendish 1662a, 278)

If the security and order of civil society is left in the hands of the majority, or in the hands of a person who is selected by the majority, there is too high a risk that society will return to chaos. Cavendish also holds that power should not be in the hands of a smaller but very talented and intelligent and sophisticated minority: she appears to think that the likelihood is high that such a body will become divided and govern ineffectively, perhaps because “It is the nature of most of Mankind … to be Ungratefull, Malicious, Revengefull, and Inhumane” (Cavendish 1662a, 259). The members of such a body might be in perpetual conflict as a result of honest disagreement or as a result of their ambition to have more power for themselves. Cavendish concludes that the best prospect for security and stability though to be sure this is not a guarantee — is to have all power in the hands of a single individual.[35]

Cavendish does not get into a lot of detail about how the sovereign should best bring about peace and security, but she does offer a number of suggestions. In Blazing World, she depicts a scene in which the Empress returns to her home world (from the Blazing World) and saves her people from an enemy attack. The Empress is depicted as possessing super-human abilities, as having the all-encompassing breadth and reach and power of a god:

Which sight, when her countrymen perceived at a distance, their hearts began to tremble; but coming something nearer, she left her torches, and appeared only in her garments of light, like an angel, or some deity, and all kneeled down before her, and worshipped her with all submission and reverence: but the Empress would not come nearer than at such a distance where her voice might be generally heard, by reason she would not have that of her accoutrements anything else should be perceived, but the splendour thereof. … But, good Lord! what several opinions and judgments did this produce in the minds of her country-men; some said she was an angel; others, she was a sorceress; some believed her a goddess; others said the devil deluded them in the shape of a fine lady. (96)

While still on Blazing World, the Empress had received intelligence that her people were under attack and that their kingdom was likely to be destroyed (90). The clear suggestion is that peace and security are best secured and maintained if a country is governed by a sovereign who is and is believed to be capable of the extraordinary. The sovereign should not be selected by democracy, and ideally the sovereign will be one of the few who is naturally born with the talents that are requisite to do the job:

Let me Advise you to Choose one that is Born a King, and Bred a King, who will Rule and Govern Magnificently, Majestically, Heroically, as a King ought to Do. (Cavendish 1662b, 283)

It is difficult to resist the thought that Cavendish is writing in part with an eye to Hobbes and the problem of the fool (Hobbes 1651, 90). To the subject who thinks that it is rational to break the covenants of civil society, and who thinks that he can get away with it, Cavendish is suggesting that a capable sovereign would make sure that subjects have reason to believe that the eyes and ears of the sovereign are ubiquitous and that situations in which a subject concludes that is he under the radar are likely to be situations that the sovereign has had skillfully and majestically staged. Perhaps Cavendish is also suggesting that there is no good Hobbesian response to the problem of the fool in that she is fleshing out what a sovereign would have to be to make the behavior of the “fool” count as irrational, and how a sovereign cannot realistically be anything close to that.

Cavendish also does not speak in a lot of detail about how a sovereign is established or about the formation of a commonwealth. She appears to assume that a sovereign will emerge from the among the most powerful and talented and that the majority of people will come to see subjugation as in their overall interest. She does however sketch some parameters that she thinks a wise sovereign will keep in mind, and these parameters tend to be in keeping with her occasionalist view that things or persons have power not as a function of what they force onto their objects but as a function of whether or not these objects respond to the person or thing as requested. For example, Cavendish says that a wise sovereign will be fair and consistent in the application and enforcement of laws (Cavendish 1655, 112). The sovereign will also be a model of virtue, and in a way that allows his or her subjects to register that the highest forms of happiness and pleasure do not in fact accompany the life of vice. (Cavendish 1664b, 114) A wise sovereign will also make sure that subjects have access to letters and to education more generally — to poetry that softens our animalistic and reactive side (Cavendish 1655, 64); to plays and other representations that not only articulate and defend but also exhibit the virtues and joys that come with enacting them; and also philosophy and history (Cavendish 1655, 6). Cavendish writes,

the mind will be Wild and Barbarous, unless it be inclosed with Study, Instructed by Learning, and Governed by Knowledg and Understanding, for then the Inhabitants of the Mind will live Peaceably, Happily, Honestly, and Honourably, by which they will Rule and Govern their associate Appetites with Ease and Regularity. (Cavendish 1664b, 51)

One of the benefits of an education is that our minds become more filled with information that helps us to navigate the world — not only to achieve our local aims but to work toward the more global result of peace and security (Boyle 2006, 285–287). Cavendish does not think that we can achieve these aims blindly and by a brute act of will. We need knowledge and familiarity with the ways of the world, and we cannot come up with these by a brute act of will either. Here it appears that Cavendish's view on occasional causation is making a systematic appearance yet again. Ecosystems and other collections of bodies are able to sustain themselves in existence, in large part because of the skillful communication that takes place between their members. A commonwealth will have a better chance of surviving for the long haul if its members are prepared to listen to each other and if they are in synchrony with respect to a larger aim and if they have the wherewithal to respond to each other intelligently and without resistance.

Cavendish would also recommend that a sovereign hold constant the extent to which human beings are driven by the pursuit of public recognition and fame. Cavendish herself thinks that our material minds do not live on after we die and that, if we have immaterial souls that continue to exist, we have absolutely no notion of these or how or why we would identify with them. She thinks that the rest of us are suspicious as well:

perceiving … that their after-life cannot be the same as their present life is, they endeavour … that their Society may remain in remembrance amongst the particular and general Societies of the same sort of Creatures, which we name Mankind: and this design causes all the Sensitive and Rational Parts, in one Society, to be industrious, to leave some Mark for a lasting Remembrance, amongst their fellow-Creatures: which general resemblance, Man calls Fame. (Cavendish 1668b, 75–76)

Cavendish is very astute to point out the extent to which human beings are motivated by a desire for public recognition. She saw the evidence in her own day, and we can clearly see it in our own.[36] She can then argue that if generally speaking people are interested in the promotion of peace and stability, one of the ways that an individual will have a good chance at achieving fame is by engaging in activities and projects that help to secure peace and stability. These would include inventions, infrastructure, and the construction of schools and libraries (Boyle 2006, 264). A wise sovereign will make sure that such behavior is encouraged and that it is also acknowledged. Not everybody is noble and exalted and impressive by birth, and not everybody has all of the same talents (Cavendish 1655, 69; Cavendish 1662a, 27, 37–38), but there are still a number of ways that any human being can contribute to peace and stability. Society can be structured so that people can work to their own talents and be acknowledged for what they do well — whether they be scientists, philosophers, laborers, members of the military, or something else — and a wise sovereign would recognize all of these achievements so that a person would not be motivated to secure fame in ways that are more unseemly. We are remembered well if we do our part to promote peace and social stability. And it is only if society lives on, and is stable and orderly and civilized, that there will be people who might remember us.

Another issue that comes up in interpreting Cavendish's social and political philosophy is whether or not she is a feminist. It is tempting again to look to her view on occasional causation to shed light on her view of the proper roles for females and males. Cavendish herself wanted to be a practicing scientist and philosopher, but whether or not she could be so was a function not only of her decisions but also of the receptivity of the surrounding world. She could decide to be a scientist, but whether or not she would be a scientist is up to a lot of additional factors — whether her results are disseminated and discussed, whether they are published, and whether she is part of a larger scientific community. Alternately, she (or a Cavendish in a nearby possible world) might decide to open a business, or be a constable or barrister, but whether or not she is successful would depend only in part on what she decides to do. To be a businessperson she would need to have a customer base, and to be an attorney she would need to be authoritative and believable in front of those who deliver a verdict. Cavendish was not a prominent scientist in her time; nor was she a prominent philosopher. She attempted to correspond with Hobbes and others, but unlike the bodies that interact in constituting the ecosystems of nature and other organic units, these philosophers were not cooperative.

In her natural philosophy Cavendish argues that the behavior of bodies is due in part to messages that are signaled from the “agent” body and in part to the response of the “passive” body and to whether or not the “passive” body is appropriately hospitable. Some of the texts suggest very strongly that her social and political philosophy is informed by her view of the normal operations of nature. In Blazing World, the Empress is transported from her home planet and is pleased to find that the beings on the Blazing World will interact with her and respect her authority. In real life, the human males on earth would not engage with Cavendish, but the worm-men and bear-men and bird-men and fish-men and ape-men have extensive conservations with the Empress about the cosmos, the nature of matter and mind, chemistry, and mathematics (29–42). At one point the Empress seeks counsel from “the soul of one of the most famous modern writers, as either of Galileo, Gassendus, Descartes, Helmont, Hobbes, H. More, etc.” (67–68). She is informed, however, that “they would scorn to be scribes to a woman” (68). The atmosphere of the Blazing World is quite different from the atmosphere on earth, and whether or not a person is a scientist or philosopher or other authority is only in part dependent on what is happening on her end.

Cavendish presents women as accomplished and successful in other texts as well. In Bell in Campo, Cavendish has a group of women form an army for the sake of showing men that women should be “co-partners” in government, and “help rule the World” (588–589). The women submit to a powerful generalless, and together they defeat the enemy and save the male army at the same time. The events in Bell in Campo are fairly straightforward, but there might remain a question about Cavendish's own attitude toward those events, and in particular about her attitude toward the achievements of the female army. On the one hand, it is reported in Bell in Campo that men take women to be “a trouble in the Commonwealth” (588). In addition, the members of the female army are rewarded for their achievements — rewarded by the men in power — with the right to control their family finances, and the freedom to wear whatever they choose. On the other hand, Cavendish depicts the female army as being capable of doing what a male army is normally commissioned to do, and as capable of doing even more. Furthermore, she is depicting how males in power would in fact respond (or how the males in her own world have responded) to a circumstance in which a female army sweeps in to save the day. On one reading, Cavendish herself is suggesting that men and women are not equal in terms of the roles that they should perform and that men are in important ways superior. On another reading, Cavendish is reflecting that men are not superior to women but that the achievements of women have always occurred in an atmosphere in which men have the power to decide their worth.

Some commentators have suggested that Cavendish leaves open the question of whether or not women are inferior by training and education or if they are inferior by nature (for example Boyle 2006, 278–281). It seems unlikely that Cavendish thinks that women are inferior by nature if she depicts women as capable of the highest levels of achievement in alternative possible worlds. Cavendish herself was a remarkable person, as was the Empress and the generalless of Bell in Campo. It is true that women are depicted as exceptional only in Cavendish's fictional work (McGuire 1978, 198; Boyle 2006, 279), but that may be because (as per her view on occasional causation) what it is for an agent to be successful is in part due to what the agent signals and in part to how its larger environment is responsive. Cavendish might have thought (with Spinoza) that an individual is not an island and that what it can do and cannot do is to some degree a part of its physical and psychological constitution and to a large degree a part of the lay of the land on which the individual would act.

Cavendish does however encourage a very conservative set of behaviors for women to perform, and again the question arises of whether she is basing her view on some assumptions about the nature of women more generally or if she has an eye to the environment in which women have happened to find themselves. In World's Olio she emphasizes the importance of the virtue of chastity, and also patience, humility and being fashionable and constant (73). The list is expanded by one of the speakers of Orations:

Modest, Chast, Temperate, Humble, Patient, and Pious; also to be Huswifely, Cleanly, and of few Words, all which will Gain us Praise from Men, and Blessing from Heaven, and Love in this World, and Glory in the Next. (229)

Here Cavendish might be reflecting how women ought to behave in any possible world irrespective of the power and responses of the beings that surround them. If she thinks that the nature of women is such that women should be chaste and humble and quiet, then to the extent that she thinks that other characteristics are higher and more exalted she takes women to be an inferior part of the species. If she is instead reading off of her own world what behaviors are regarded as legitimate for women, then she is just describing the behavior that is adaptive to that environment. The generalless of Bell in Campo is not especially modest or temperate or quiet, but her behavior would not “gain us praise” or “love in this world” — the seventeenth-century environment in which Cavendish thinks we find ourselves. But perhaps Cavendish thinks that the generalless is operating counter to her own nature. Alternately, if Cavendish is reading off of her culture how women would be most wise to behave, then she might just be offering conservative advice about how women can best flourish in the short material life that has been allotted to them.

A final interpretive issue that arises for Cavendish is exactly how the sovereign is supposed to have so much power and authority if power and achievement are in large part a function of the responsiveness of the surrounding world. A sufficiently powerful sovereign would have to have full control of the military and other underlings, and these in turn would need to be able to control the larger populace (James 2003, xxv-xxvi). The sovereign would have to have enough power to force all of these people to act in accord with his or her will, but in the light of her view on occasional causation Cavendish is committed to the view that all that a sovereign would be able to do is send a signal or message to these beings in the hope that they would obey. The sovereign might try to take steps to increase the odds that underlings will abide by his message, but that would be a matter of sending another message still. A sovereign cannot simply decree that certain things happen: whether or not they happen is a function of the responsiveness of the members of the commonwealth. For Cavendish, an ecosystem holds together, but not because a single member imposes its will on the others. Instead, the members work together as a group, and if human beings are a part of nature, they would function under the same constraints. If Cavendish is right, a sovereign has to be extremely powerful to secure peace and stability, but what it is for a sovereign to have power is to be wise enough to figure out which are the messages that his subjects would accommodate.

8. Conclusion

Cavendish's work was not taken very seriously in the seventeenth century, but it is certainly relevant today. She is presumably right to warn about the inconsistency in insisting that God is utterly transcendent while being utterly confident in putting forward claims about His nature. She has also anticipated a contemporary emphasis on the study of the brain and body in addressing mental health. In addition, she has made a contribution to the current debate about whether or not our inability to understand how matter thinks is relevant to the question of whether or not it does think (McGinn 1999, 6–18; Chalmers 1996, 3–6; and Nagel 1974, 435–450). She is also important insofar as she anticipates the arguments and views of early modern thinkers who are firmly in the canon and who already secure a great deal of attention.


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I am inordinately grateful to Eileen O'Neill for her extensive comments on an earlier version of this paper.