Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Jan 19, 2011

Jayarāśi Bhaṭṭa, who most likely flourished between 800–840 probably in Southern India, was an Indian philosopher, a sceptic loosely affiliated to the materialist Cārvāka / Lokāyata school of thought, the author of one of most extraordinary philosophical works in India, the Tattvôpaplava-siṁha (‘The Lion of the Dissolution of [all] Categories’). His main claim is that it is not possible to arrive at true knowledge, because one should first properly define basic criteria of validity for valid cognitive procedures, which is not possible without a prior true knowledge of reality against which we could test the procedures for validity etc. Clearly, our knowledge of reality and of objects depends on valid cognitive procedures. However, all valid cognitive procedures are either fundamentally flawed and ultimately unreliable or they require further valid cognitive procedures, and these stand in the same need etc. Therefore, we can neither formulate proper definitions of valid cognitive procedures nor define what reality is and what basic categories are. This is at least the case, he claims, with all the cognitive tools and epistemological categories which are now at our disposal.

1. Life, Works, and Philosophical Affiliation

1.1 The Dating of Jayarāśi Bhaṭṭa

The first serious attempt to date Jayarāśi Bhaṭṭa was undertaken by Sukhlāljī Saṁghavī and Rasiklāl C. Pārīkh, who brought the Tattvôpaplava-siṁha to light, in their 1940 edition (p. iv-xi) of the treatise, assign the work to 8th century (p. x). This dating was slightly modified by Sukhlāljī Saṁghavī (1941) who placed Jayarāśi's Tattvôpaplava-siṁha between 725-825, which, in turn, is accepted by Eli Franco (1987: 12–13). However, the latter, in the ‘Preface to the second edition’ of 1994, modifies the date of Jayarāśi Bhaṭṭa and assigns him to the period of 770–830 on the basis of what he thinks are Jayarāśi's indirect references (primarily terminological grounds) to the Buddhist philosopher Dharmottara (ca. 740–800).

In fact, that dating of the Tattvôpaplava-siṁha could be slightly modified to perhaps 800–840. I would place Jayarāśi Bhaṭṭa after the Digambara Jaina philosopher Akalaṅka Bhaṭṭa (c. 720–780) and before Vidyānanda Pātrakesarisvāmin (c. 850), a philosopher in the same tradition who commented on Akalaṅka. As Franco (1994: XI) himself notices, the Buddhist Kamalaśīla (c. 740–795) nowhere refers to Jayarāśi in his encyclopaedic commentary of the Tattva-saṅgraha. Further, we find no mention of Jayarāśi in the oeuvre of Akalaṅka Bhaṭṭa, although he was very well acquainted with current ideas of his contemporaries. It would be especially surprising in the case of Akalaṅka Bhaṭṭa not to mention an author who greatly influenced the way Jaina thinkers argued and formulated their thoughts, because both of them seem to belong to South India. On a few occasions Akalaṅka did have a chance to either allude or even directly refer to such an original thinker as Jayarāśi certainly was, but he nowhere does it. A good instance is Akalaṅka's work Aṣṭa-śatī ‘In Eight Hundred Lines’ (itself a commentary on the work Āpta-mīmāṁsā, ‘An Examination of An Authoritative Person’) of Samantabhadra, c. 580–640). In it, (the commentary on verse 1.3 of Āpta-mīmāṁsā, AṣŚp.2 = AṣS 29.20), Akalaṅka refers to a materialist argument: ‘[The opponent]: “For this reason it has been said that there is no omniscient person, because truth claims [of various teachers competing for primacy] turn out to be wrong cognitive criteria, inasmuch as there is no difference between them (i.e., all are equal in their convincing force). Since one accepts that [it is not possible to decide for or against a view among a few competing ones], there is nothing wrong [in rejecting the idea of an omniscient person].” [Akalaṅka:] Ergo this decision of some [thinkers, i.e., materialists] is itself void of any rational basis. For, as we know, the scope of perception [which could prove the materialist's rejection of an omniscient person] cannot itself demonstrate that there cannot be any other proof of an omniscient person, because this would have too far-reaching consequences. Neither can [the materialist prove that an omniscient person cannot exist] with the help of inference, because it has no validity [for him]’. Akalaṅka clearly has in mind a typical materialist philosopher who rejects the idea of omniscience, but at the same time accepts perception (pratyakṣa) as the only valid instrument of knowledge, while rejecting the validity of inference (anumāna). That is a standard account of a materialist (Cārvāka / Lokāyata) thinker in India and there is really nothing to suggest that what Akalaṅka had here in mind as the target of his criticism was a sceptic (like Jayarāśi) who rejected the ultimate validity also of perception.

However, the account changes in what Vidyānanda (c. 850) has to say on Akalaṅka's passage. Vidyānanda is, to our knowledge, the first Indian philosopher to know of and to directly refer to Jayarāśi. In his Aṣṭa-sahasrī ‘In Eight Thousand Lines’, Vidyānanda (AṣS 29.20-36.6) takes the passage ‘“Since one accepts that [it is not possible to decide for or against a view among a few competing ones], there is nothing wrong [in rejecting the idea of an omniscient person].” [Akalaṅka:] Ergo this decision of some [thinkers, i.e., materialists] is itself void of any rational basis’ (tathêṣṭatvād adoṣa ity ekeṣām aprāmāṇikaivêṣṭiḥ) as explicitly implying two kinds of approaches to the same question. First (AṣS 29.20 ff.), he says some nihilistic thinkers (eke) are the Laukāyatika (the followers of Lokāyata, the materialist school), who do not admit any instrument of knowledge which would could go beyond the perceptible world, i.e., they accept perception as the only cognitive criterion. Second, Vidyānanda says (AṣS 31.2 ff.), there are also ‘those who propound the dissolution of [all] categories’ (tattvôpaplava-vādin), a term which could hardly be more univocal in its clearly referring to Jayarāśi. Had Akalaṅka known of Jayarāśi, his scepticism and rejection of the validity of perception also, he would have included him among those who rejected the idea of an omniscient being.

1.2 Native Place of Jayarāśi Bhaṭṭa

As little as we know of the exact dates of his life even less we know about the place where he flourished, and we are actually left to speculations, for no hard evidence, such as inscriptions etc., can be found to help us. There are three points that might suggest Jayarāśi was of South India, all being rather weak. The strongest evidence is the circulation and reception of the Tattvôpaplava-siṁha: the first mention of the work is made by South Indian Digambara authors Vidyānanda (c. 850) and Anantavīrya (turn of 10th and 11th centuries). Another equally weak piece of evidence is that Jayarāśi's critical method of argument (see below), which the Jainas adopt, first penetrates the works of South Indian Digambara authors, incidentally the same who are the first to make reference to Jayarāśi. This method of critique becomes the standard one among Gujarati Jainas only at a later stage. The third argument in favour of South Indian origin of Jayarāśi (Saṁghavī–Pārīkh 1940, xi), even weaker that the two above, is his title Bhaṭṭa, regularly appended to the names of a number of South Indian philosophers and often used as an official title of South Indian Digambara high rank clerics (bhaṭṭa, bhaṭṭāraka). Jayarāśi's title might suggest he was both South Indian and a Brahmin by social class (varṇa). However, the title Bhaṭṭa is not exclusively used by Brahmins or exclusively in South India, though there is indeed a certain tendency of this kind. However, since there seems nothing at all to suggest that Jayarāśi was born in North India, even such slight hints gain some evidential weight.

1.3 Works of Jayarāśi Bhaṭṭa

The only preserved work of Jayarāśi is the Tattvôpaplava-siṁha (‘The Lion of the Dissolution of [all] Categories’). Its palm leaf manuscript was discovered in 1926 in a manuscript library at Patan by Sukhlāljī Saṁghavī and Rasiklāl C. Pārīkh, and the text remained virtually unknown until its publication in 1940.

The work was quite well known in mediaeval philosophical milieu, both in the South and North of India, but hardly ever treated in a way a serious and original philosophical treatise deserves: Indian philosophers of established traditions do not, as a rule, refer to the work directly or refute its contents, not to mention any attempt at the providing a genuine appraisal of the work or entering into discussion with its author. They simply ignored it.

Two reasons might be mentioned for such a situation. First, Indian philosophers did not principally engage in discussions with representatives of the materialist school, except for standardised dismissive refutations of a few basic materialist theories, which are mentioned by Indian philosophers in their works in order to render a ‘complete’ picture of the philosophical spectrum. These standardised, habitually repeated refutations were not applicable to Jayarāśi, who was not a typical representative of the Cārvāka / Lokāyata school. New powerful philosophical machinery would have to be applied to engage in a discussion with Jayarāśi. And that is precisely the second reason: the arguments Jayarāśi consistently applies, his rigid and coherent lines of argumentation proved to be an extremely hard piece of cake to swallow for those whose views he criticised. It seems, therefore, that the general approach of Indian philosophers vis-à-vis Jayarāśi was that of disregard and failure to notice the weight of his work. He is occasionally mentioned in a positive light when Indian authors acknowledge Jayarāśi's powerful method of critical analysis, and these are primarily, or even exclusively, Jaina authors. Sometimes they even refer to Jayarāśi as an expert in some fields, e.g. by Malliṣeṇa (c. 1229), who says: ‘A refutation of all cognitive criteria in details should be consulted from the Tattvôpaplava-siṁha’ (SVM, p.118.1-2).

The text of Tattvôpaplava-siṁha was preserved without any commentary and it seems that its was never commented upon. We cannot say with absolute certainty whether he had any followers or whether he established an independent school, but that is not unlikely because we occasionally come across the expression tattvôpaplava-vādin in the plural: ‘those who propound the dissolution of [all] categories’ in philosophical literature, and across the single term Tattvôpaplava used as if it denoted a separate school.

It is not certain whether Jayarāśi composed any other work. He himself refers to a treatise entitled Lakṣaṇa-sāra (‘The Quintessence of the Definition [of Cognitive Criteria (pramāṇa)]’) on one occasion, while refuting the usage of the term ‘non-verbal’ (avyapadeśya) in the definition of the cognitive criterion (pramāṇa, or ‘veridical instrument of knowledge’) of the Nyāya school. There, he says that the inapplicability of the term has already been shown in the Lakṣaṇa-sāra and one should consult that work. It is highly probable that he indeed refers to his own text for the simple reason that he generally does not mention any works of any other authors either in support of his own views or in favourable light, except for the materialist teacher Bṛhaspati and his Bṛhaspati-sūtra. Still, it is not impossible that the text he referred to under the title Lakṣaṇa-sāra might have been penned by another representative of the Cārvāka / Lokāyata school who had been held in esteem by Jayarāśi, e.g. his own guru.

1.4 Philosophical Affiliation of Jayarāśi Bhaṭṭa

There has been some controversy concerning whether Jayarāśi could at all be ranked among the representatives of the Indian materialist school, i.e., among the Cārvākas / Lokāyatas. Until the publication of the Tattvôpaplava-siṁha, Jayarāśi was considered a typical representative of the materialist school. It all changed when the publication of the work in 1940 made the text available to scholars. The publication revealed that Jayarāśi's view are far from what one considered materialism and hardly compatible with what we so far knew about the schools of the Cārvākas / Lokāyatas.

Nonetheless, Sukhlāljī Saṁghavī and Rasiklāl C. Pārīkh (1940: xi-xii) take the text as ‘a work of the Lokāyata or Cārvāka school, or to be more precise – of a particular division of that school’, emphasising that Jayarāśi ‘is developing the doctrine of the orthodox (!) Lokāyata’. The tradition of ascribing the view to Saṁghavī and Pārīkh that the Tattvôpaplava-siṁha is ‘a genuine Cārvāka work’ relies rather on the misreading of what both the authors say: they are well aware that Jayarāśi develops an original and independent school within what he himself considered a materialist tradition. This view, adopted also by Ruben (1958), is somewhat modified by Franco (1987: 4–8).

Another line of researchers disagree that Jayarāśi belonged to the materialist tradition at all, typical proponents of this opinion being Debiprasad Chattopadhyaya (1959), (1989) and Karel Werner (1995). Chattopadhyaya (1989) argues that since Jayarāśi criticises all philosophical views and schools, he cannot be reckoned as an adherent of the Cārvāka / Lokāyata tradition, because one can either be a materialist or sceptic; and clearly Jayarāśi's philosophical views do not fit into the typical materialist framework. Karel Werner (1995) seems to support such an approach, although with some reservations, but without any solid rational argument, except for an subjective impression.

There could hardly be a better source of information on the true affiliation of Jayarāśi than the author himself. He nowhere states in his work that he is a Cārvāka / Lokāyata, in which he does not differ from all other Indian authors who nowhere mention their philosophical affiliations in the form: ‘The author of the present work is Buddhist’ or ‘I am a follower of the Nyāya school’. In most cases, such affiliations are communicated through the opening sections, e.g. in the introductory verses (maṅgalâcaraṇa), or in the colophons, but usually an indirect manner, e.g. by paying homage to the Awakened One (buddha) or to a guru or Mahêśvara, or through some other hint, but it is hardly ever done directly, in an unequivocal manner. Unfortunately, the preserved text of Tattvôpaplava-siṁha does not contain any introductory verses (probably there were none), and the colophon contains no hints. The only concealed information in the opening section of the work could be found the first verse that occurs in the very beginning which says: ‘The worldly path (laukiko mārgaḥ) should be followed…/ With respect to everyday practice of the world (loka-vyavahāra), the fool and the wise are similar’ (TUS, p.1.9–10 = Franco (1987: 68–6-7)), quoted from some other source, taken as authoritative by Jayarāśi. The expression ‘the worldly path’ (laukiko mārgaḥ) often occurs as a reference to the Lokāyata (‘the followers of the worldly [practice]’), e.g. by Haribhadra in his ŚVS1.64. Most importantly, however, Jayarāśi on several occasions quotes verses of Bṛhaspati in order to either support his own opinion or to show that there is no disagreement between the Tattvôpaplava-siṁha and the tradition of Bṛhaspati. Further, he explicitly mentions the materialist teacher by name and refers to him with reverence ‘Honourable Bṛhaspati’ (bhagavān bṛhaspatiḥ, TUS, p.45.10–11 = Franco (1987: 228.10)), the reverential term occurring only once in the whole work. This is rather unique, for Jayarāśi does not seem to follow any authorities or to quote passages and opinions which he unreservedly views in favourable light. There can hardly be any doubt, that Jayarāśi placed himself within that tradition and apparently acknowledged that he was originally trained within it.

Further, Jayarāśi criticises basically all philosophical schools with two exceptions: the Advaita Vedānta of Śaṅkara and the Cārvāka / Lokāyata school. The reason for being silent on the tradition of Śaṅkara was that the latter was either contemporaneous or posterior to Jayarāśi, but there would have been no reason not to formulate any criticism against the Cārvāka / Lokāyata school, if that had not been Jayarāśi's own tradition.

Jayarāśi is generally very cautious not to express his own positive views and theories. But there may be an exception, it seems. On one occasion (in the Buddhist section, TUP, p.57–88 = Franco (1987: 269–271)), while refuting the view that ‘the first moment of consciousness [of the newly born], immediately after the exit from the mother's womb, is preceded by another moment of consciousness’, he concludes that ‘the first moment of consciousness in the womb etc. [i.e., of the newly born], must come from the combination of the elements’, which is a typically materialist view. It is however not quite clear how far this conclusion is brought up merely to dismiss the theory of consciousness as a principle independent of the matter or the theory of the personal conscious continuum (santāna), and how far the view is Jayarāśi's own.

There is also an external evidence corroborating to a certain degree the thesis about Cārvāka / Lokāyata affiliation of Jayarāśi. Vidyānanda who first mentions Jayarāśi brings some interesting details to light (alluded to above). In his Aṣṭa-śatī (AṣS 29.20-36.7), he explicitly indicates a category of nihilistic thinkers who reject a number of vital principles and claim that ‘There is no [reliable] omniscient authority (tīrtha-kāra), there is no [reliable] cognitive criterion (pramāṇa), there is no [reliable] authoritative doctrine (samaya) or [reliable] Vedas, or any kind of [reliable] reasoning (tarka), because they contradict each other,’ and he quotes a popular verse: ‘Reasoning is not established, testimonies differ, there is no sage whose words are a cognitive criterion (i.e., authoritative), the essence of the moral law (dharma) is concealed in a secret place (i.e., is not available). The [proper] path is that taken by the majority of people’[1]. Whether the verse comes from an unidentified Lokāyata source, which is not impossible, or not, it is echoed by Jayarāśi in the above mentioned verse at the beginning of his work and the expression ‘the worldly path’ (laukiko mārgaḥ). Interestingly, the verse has an obvious sceptical underpinning. The category of such ‘nihilists’ includes (1) the followers of the Lokāyata school (laukāyatika, AṣS 29.26), also known as the Cārvāka (AṣS 30.25), who are associated with the view that there is just one cognitive criterion, i.e. perception, and (2) the category of ‘those who propound the dissolution of [all] categories’ (tattvôpaplava-vādin, AṣS 31.2). Vidyānanda (AṣS 31.2 ff.) explains who the latter are: ‘Some who are those who propound the dissolution of [all] categories take (1) all the categories of cognitive criteria such as perception etc. and (2) all the categories of the cognoscibles as dissolved (i.e., not established)’. Throughout his text, Vidyānanda keeps these two traditions – the Lokāyata and the Tattvôpaplava - separate, although he does acknowledge that they are genetically related, the main difference between them being whether one recognises at least one cognitive criterion (Cārvāka / Lokāyata) or none (Jayarāśi).

Jayarāśi can be therefore taken as a genuine representative of an offshoot of the Cārvāka / Lokāyata tradition, primarily because he himself thought he was a follower of Bṛhaspati's materialist tradition, and probably because he had originally been trained in the materialist system. It also seems very likely that the representatives of the Cārvāka / Lokāyata system occasionally had sceptical inclinations prior to Jayarāśi, which helped him to abandon typically materialist claims and undertake his sceptical project. However, neither he nor his work can be taken as typical representatives of the Cārvāka / Lokāyata school or a first-hand source of information about that tradition. Despite this, the work remains the only authentic, albeit not ‘orthodox’ treatise of the Cārvāka / Lokāyata tradition that has come down to us.

2. The Method and Philosophy of Jayarāśi

Jayarāśi can be classified as a sceptic, or even a methodological sceptic, who consistently avails himself of a particular method to analyse theories and the contents of propositions.

2.1 Use of Reductio Arguments

The point of departure of his methodology is a sophisticated and highly elaborated reductio type of argument (prasaṅga), developed earlier within the Madhyamaka school of Buddhism and its prominent adherent Nagārjuna (c. 150 CE).

In his method, Jayarāśi analyses a particular thesis T of his opponent by, first, listing all logical implications or all doctrinally possible conclusions C1, C2, C3, … Cn, admissible within the opponent's system, that follow from thesis T. Then he demonstrates how and why each of such conclusions C1, C2, C3, … Cn either leads to an undesired consequence (logically problematic or unwelcome within the opponent's system) or contradicts the initial thesis T:

(1) T → C1 ∨ C2 ∨ C3 ∨ … ∨ Cn
(2) |C1| = 0
|C2| = 0
|C3| = 0

|Cn| = 0
(3) |T| = 0

where ‘0’ stands not simply for ‘false’ (logically), but may also stand for ‘not admissible within the opponent's specific set of beliefs’, or ‘not compatible with the opponent's specific set of beliefs’. To analyse the truth value or admissibility of each of the conclusions C1, C2, C3, … Cn, if their structure is complex, Jayarāśi analyses the conclusions in their turn using exactly the same method.

What may look like a well-known logical law that underlies the reductio ad absurdum argument, i.e.,


or like other typical laws of the proof by contradiction, i.e.,

[~(pq) ∧ (~p→~q)] → p,

[~p → (q∧~q)] → p, or

[~p → (q≡~q)] → p ,

seems at first closely mirrorred by Jayarāśi. However, his approach is significantly different in one particular aspect. First, Jayarāśi analyses positive theses in order to disprove them. Secondly, the reductio or the proof by contradiction, whereby p is rejected, does not commit one to admitting ~p in the sense of accepting a positive state of affairs contrary to p. Jayarāśi is satisfied merely with a rejection of a thesis, without postulating his own solution to a problem. In other words, when Jayarāśi disproves thesis T by demonstrating that its conclusions C1, C2, C3, … Cn are all wrong (either false or doctrinally inadmissible), he does not commit himself to the contrary thesis ~T with some kind of ontological entailment. The better way to describe his method would be the following patterns:

[(pq) ∧ ~q] → ~p,

[~(~pq) ∧ (p→~q)] → ~p,

[p → (q∧~q)] → ~p, or

[p → (q≡~q)] → ~p ,

To give an example, Jayarāśi first skilfully demonstrates that the universal cannot exist by mentioning three possible conclusions: If (T) the universal exists, then (C1) the universal is different from the individuals in which it is instantiated, (C2) it is not different from the individuals, or (C3) it is different from the individuals in some aspects and it is not different from the individuals in other aspects. Each of these options is then analysed into further options, all being eventually shown as wrong or impossible. Since all the three conclusions C1, C2 and C3 are rejected, the initial thesis T (‘the universal exists’) is also rejected. However, he does not say what at all exists, if there are no universals.

In his method, Jayarāśi does not mention all logically conceivable conclusions entailed by a thesis he wants to disprove. In most cases, he limits himself just to those implications which are relevant to the discussion with a particular philosophical school, and all other logical or thinkable implications of which we know that the opponent would never admit for a variety of reason are simply ignored.

Interestingly, the critical method of analysis of the reductio type (prasaṅga) which Jayarāśi so amply uses is basically absent in the works of the Digambara philosopher Akalaṅka, whereas the method is regularly used by his commentator Vidyānanda and all subsequent Jaina thinkers, which may have its historical relevance and suggest that Jayarāśi was posterior to Akalaṅka.

The reductionist tactics, which Jayarāśi shared with the Mādhyamika Buddhists, was traditionally classified by Brahmanic philosophers, e.g. the Naiyāyikas, as an eristical dispute or refutation-only debate (vitaṇḍā) and considered as a non-genuine argument, because the goal of an authentic debate was to strive for truth, understood of course in positive terms. Were such criticisms denying Jayarāśi a genuine argumentative value justified? Clearly not, and for a variety of reasons, the most important being that the main objective of Jayarāśi is indicated in the title of his treatise: the dissolution of all categories. How should we understand it? Was his approach purely negative, eristical, nihilistic or agnostic? His main objective, it seems, was not necessarily the strong claim that no truths can ever be known. Rather his intention was to show the fundamental dependence of our knowledge of reality on cognitive means and categories we accept more or less arbitrarily. The dissolution of all categories implies that the criteria on which all philosophical systems and theories of the world rest are in need of further evidence, which itself is not possible without adopting some of these categories or some other categories which again call for further evidence, but which categories and methods we chose is ultimately our arbitrary decision. To engage in what Brahmanic philosophers would call a ‘genuine debate’ (vāda) one would necessarily have to accept that such an arbitrary decision is ultimate and justified, thus giving up the further search for truth, even though the process would be infinite and doomed to terminate untimely. In other words, contradictions and inconsistencies are, in fact, inherently systemic in the sense that they are generated by a body of propositions each adopted arbitrary for this or other reason, and the systemic knowledge ultimately lacks reliable and coherent foundations. Just as with Pyrrhonism in Sextus' interpretation, Jayarāśi seems to be a perpetual investigator: he discards all theories and propositions that are neither consistent nor proof-tight, for which there is also no compelling evidence. But it would probably be far-fetched to claim that the idea of truth did not represent any value for him.

2.2 Scepticism and Definitions

Jayarāśi represents what has been once labelled epistemological scepticism, or ontological scepticism (Hankinson 1995, 13ff), i.e., the position in which one refuses to accept the truth of some proposition or to affirm the existence of something, without denying it, as distinguished from negative (ontological) dogmatism, i.e., the attitude in which one actually rejects the truth of some proposition and denies the existence of the alleged objects. Further, Jayaraśi's methodological scepticism should not be confused with what is covered by the term e.g. in the case of Descartes' approach to seek ultimately firm foundations after all beliefs liable to doubt have been successfully eliminated. Jayarāśi seeks neither ultimate foundations for his system or firm basis for his epistemology, ontology or ethics, because he never, even vaguely, intimates he would have any. He is satisfied with demonstrating that all we, the philosophers, have so far established, does not hold. But contrary to Decartes' methodological scepticism, Jayarāśi does not really cast doubt on what comes to us from the senses.

At the outset of his work (TUS 1), he points out the major deficiency of our knowledge: ‘To establish cognitive criteria (pramāṇa, instruments of knowledge) depends on proper definitions. Further, to establish objects of cognitive criteria depends on cognitive criteria. When proper definitions are absent, how is it possible that one would treat both the cognitive criteria and their objects as genuinely real?’ To adopt certain definitions we first have to adopt certain definitions and criteria of validity. That has to be done vis-à-vis the external reality and tested for validity with respect to phenomena that have all the appearance of real, for Indian philosophers en bloc accepted the correspondence theory of truth. To test the definitions, criteria of validity and cognitive criteria with respect to real objects, we should first know what these real objects really are. To know that we have to have reliable instruments of knowledge (cognitive criteria) and criteria of validity at our disposal. We land in vicious circle: we can neither know cognisable real objects nor determine what genuine cognitive criteria are, nor be actually able to define them without having the idea of validity first. Without it we cannot even properly distinguish between valid cognitive procedures and invalid ones.

Since it is vital to have a proper definition of a cognitive criterion, or a valid cognitive procedure and criterion of truth for philosophical enterprise, Jayarāśi analyses such definitions which were formulated within most important philosophical schools in India. The cognitive criteria whose various definitions are one by one examined are perception (pratyakṣa), inference (anumāna), presumption (arthāpatti), reasoning based on analogy (upamāna), negative proof based on absence (abhāva), equivalence (sambhāva), tradition (aitihya), and verbal or scriptural testimony (śabda, āgama). In terms of argumentative structure and nature, they all can be reduced to three: perception, inference and testimony. The philosophical schools which Jayarāśi most frequently refers to and criticises their definitions of the cognitive criteria are the Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Sāṁkhya, Mīmāṁsā as well as Buddhist and Jaina schools.

He demonstrates that no one so far has offered an irrefutable definition of perception (which does not have to mean that perception as such has to be completely unreliable). All definitions of perception are seriously flawed and we cannot rely on it in the way it is defined: we do not have even a reliable method or a dependable criterion to distinguish a genuine perception from a mirage, optical illusion or a mental image (e.g. in hallucination, reminiscence or dream). However, Iit is not the case that Jayarāśi argues that ‘there is simply no way … to know that our sense-perceptions are true’ (King 1999: 19). What he is up to is to demonstrate that, given our present definitions of perception and categories on which our epistemology rests, there is no way to determine which of our sense-perceptions are true.

Inference relies on data provided by perception which makes inference doubtful. But inference the way it has so far been defined is flawed for a number of other reasons. There is no reliable way to relate properties or facts in a truth-conducive way. For instance, to infer the cause from the effect one would have to first to define what causality is, which as Jayarāśi demonstrates cannot be done with the categories we have at our disposal: there is actually no reliable way to relate A and B as cause and effect. Further, what do we relate in inference: universals with universals, universals with a particular, or a particular with a particular? Since universals do not exist, inferences which are based on such notions are intrinsically flawed. We are left with the idea that inferences depend on particular-to-particular relation. That being the case, there is no method to establish any kind of valid relationship between two particulars which could allow us to draw any sound inferences from single-instantiated cases. Further, inferences will have to rely on cases of inductive reasoning which are logically not valid and cannot be demonstrated to be universally valid. Also testimony of an authority cannot be a legitimate source of knowledge because, first, such testimony would have to rely on other cognitive criteria and, second, we would have no means to determine what a reliable testimony is or who an authoritative person can be. Therefore, given all available definitions and criteria, nothing can be known for certain.

Jayarāśi's undertaking is not restricted to the examination of valid cognitive procedures and their definitions. In the course of his work, he analyses a number of fundamental ideas and demonstrates that their definitions are inadequate and they cannot exist as understood and defined by philosophers. These include such notions as validity and nonerroneousness, sublation of previous knowledge by a subsequent experience, universals, the relation of composite wholes to their parts, production of cognitions, ontological categories such as inherence of properties in their substrata, the nature of illusion, the definition of what exists (e.g. the real object's ability to execute causally efficient action, artha-kriyā), the nature of sense-object contact, memory and recollection, momentariness and permanence, conceptuality or conceptual state of mind, relation of the conceptual image in cognition to the external thing represented, the nature of consciousness (rejection of non-material character), rebirth and karmic retribution, causality, visible and invisible objects, absences, rules of inference etc. All these ideas, as Jayarāśi demonstrates, stand in need of proper definition and as long as we do not have them cannot be maintained in their present form.

2.3 Positive Views

Jayarāśi, as we noted, is cautious not to affirmatively state anything, and nowhere does he use such expressions as ‘thus it was established that’ (iti sthitam) or similar expressions typical of all other philosophical works. Despite this, can we reconstruct any positive views he affirms or is his scepticism all-embracing? It seems there a few such views. His clear rejection of karmic retribution, afterlife and the supernatural (‘human actions do no bring otherworldly results, such as rebirth in heaven etc.’) and the claim the ultimate reality for us is what we experience and what surrounds us concerns both metaphysics and ethics. Metaphysically, there is no supernatural reality of any relevance to us. Ethically, the only criterion to determine what is right and wrong is what people agree to accept as such (‘the worldly path should be followed’). Quite frequently, he uses examples of non-existent entities such as demons (piśāca), atoms (paramāṇu) and god (mahêśvara), taking their fictitious character for granted, which indicates that he apparently rejected invisible reality which is intrinsically beyond our senses.

He plainly states that ‘universals do not exist’ (TUP, 4.5 ff.), which does not seem to be a mere thesis which he rejects just for the sake of argument, because throughout his work he will refer to this claim (‘we have already shown that universals do not exist’). Does his denial of universals mean that he was a nominalist? If so, in what sense? On another occasion (TUS 24) he criticises the view that composite macroscopic wholes cannot exist, and what exists instead are their parts only (a typical Buddhist nominalist position). He concludes there is no way to demonstrate that composite wholes are non-existent. Interestingly, he nowhere links the idea of composite wholes (and the paradox of the whole and its parts), which he seems to accept, to idea the universal (and the paradox of the universal and the particulars as its instantiations), which he clearly rejects. These two concepts, the wholes and universals, were generally analysed in India jointly as two aspects of the same problem: just as the whole exists (or does not exist) through its parts, in the very same way also the universal exists (or does not exist) through its particulars. Interestingly, Jayarāśi never links these two issues, precisely because, it seems, he admitted the existence of macroscopic objects of our experience (i.e., composite wholes) whereas he rejected the existence of universals. Being a sceptic, he does seem to accept a ‘commonsensical view’ of the world that consists of such macroscopic objects, but not of invisible atoms or universals, demons and god. In line with this approach, he seemed also to maintain that consciousness is a product or combination of the four elements (see above). It should not come as a surprise to discover that all these views he shared with genuine materialists of the Cārvāka / Lokāyata tradition.

A truly sceptical thesis Jayarāśi entertained was his assumption that all philosophical claims are always made within a particular set of beliefs, i.e., within a particular system which is based on arbitrarily accepted criteria, definitions and categories. His pragmatic, ‘commonsensical attitude’ is highlighted in a verse he quotes: ‘with respect to everyday practice of the world, the fool and the wise are similar’ (see above), because ultimately we all have to rely on our experience and defective and partial knowledge of reality.

The conclusion of his work: ‘Thus, when all categories are completely dissolved in the above manner, all practical actions (which entails thought, speech and activity) can be enjoyable, without being reflected upon’, is quite meaningful. On the one hand it could be taken to imply some kind of a carpe diem attitude: given our limitations and intrinsic inability to know with certainty, the only option we are left with is to enjoy the world the way it appears to us. On the other hand, the statement could also suggest that what Jayarāśi had in mind was that for all our practical activities, including thinking, verbal communication, behaviour or ordinary life, the world of our actions — as long as it is relevant to us — is ‘here and now’ and retains its ultimate validity, even though we are incapable of its proper philosophical analysis.


Primary Literature

Sanskrit Works

[SVM] Malliṣeṇa-sūri: Syād-vāda-mañjarī. A.B. Dhruva (ed.), Syād-vāda-mañjarī of Malliṣeṇa with the Anya-yoga-vyavaccheda-dvātriṁśikā of Hemacandra. Bombay Sanskrit and Prakrit Series 83, Bombay 1933.
[AAV] Abhisamayâlaṁkara-vṛtti. Tripathi, Ram Shankar (ed.), Abhisamayâlaṁkara-vṛtti sphuṭârtha. Central Institute of Higher Tibetan Studies, Sarnath 1977.
[ŚVS] Haribhadra-sūri: Śāstra-vārtā-samuccaya. K.K. Dixit: The Śāstravārtāsamuccaya of Ācārya Haribhadrasūri with Hindi Translation, Notes and Introduction. LD Series 22, Lalbhai Dalpathai, Bharatiya Sanskriti Vidyamandira, Ahmedabad 1969.
[MBh] Sukthankar, Vishnu S.: Āraṇyakaparvan (Part 2). Being the Third Book of the Mahābhārata, the Great Epic of India. Bhandrakar Oriental Research Institute, Poona 1942.
[AṣS] Vidyānanda Pātrakesarisvāmin: Aṣṭa-sahasrī. (1)Vaṁśīdhar (ed.): Aṣṭa-sahasrī tārkika-cakra-cūḍā-maṇi-syādvāda-vidyāpatinā śrī-Vidyānanda-svāminā nirākṛta. Nirṇaya-sāgara Press, Bombay 1915. (2)Darbārī Lāl Koṭhiyā; Brahmacārī Sandīpa Jain (eds.): Tārkika-śiromaṇi ācārya vidyānanda-kṛtra Aṣṭa-sahasrī. Jaina-vidyā Saṁsthāna, Digambara Jaina Atiśaya Kṣetra, Śrīmahāvīrajī (Rājasthān) 1997.
[AṣŚ] Akalaṅka: Aṣṭa-śatī. Nagin Shah (ed., tr.): Samantabhadra's Āptamīmāṁsā. Critique of an Authority [Along with English Translation, Introduction, Notes and Akalaṅka's Sanskrit Commentary Aṣṭaśatī]. Sanskrit-Sanskriti Grantha-mālā 7, Dr. Jagruti Dilip Sheth, Ahmedabad 1999.

Critical Editions of Primary Texts

[TUP] Saṁghavī, Sukhlāljī; Pārīkh, Rasiklāl C. (eds.): Tattvopaplavasimha of Shri Jayarasi Bhatta. Edited with an introduction and indices. Gaekwad Oriental Series 87, Oriental Institute, Baroda 1940 [Reprinted: Bauddha Bharati Series 20, Varanasi 1987]. [The edition of the complete Sanskrit text].

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Secondary Literature

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Early Modern India, analytic philosophy in | Madhyamaka | perception: the problem of | physicalism | skepticism | truth