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Future Contingents

First published Thu Jun 9, 2011

Future contingents are contingent statements about the future — such as future events, actions, states etc. To qualify as contingent the predicted event, state, action or whatever is at stake must neither be impossible nor inevitable. Statements such as “My mother shall go to London” or “There will be a sea-battle tomorrow” could serve as standard examples. What could be called the problem of future contingents concerns how to ascribe truth-values to such statements. If there are several possible decisions out of which one is going to be made freely tomorrow, can there be a truth now about which one will be made? If ‘yes’, on what grounds could something which is still open, nevertheless be true already now? If ‘no’, can we in fact hold that all logically exclusive possibilities must be untrue without denying that one of the possible outcomes must turn out to be the chosen one?[1]

In point of fact, ‘future contingents’ could also refer to future contingent objects. A statement like “The first astronaut to go to Mars will have a unique experience” could be analyzed as referring to an object not yet existing, supposing that one day in the distant future some person will indeed travel to Mars, but that person has not yet been born. The notion of ‘future contingent objects’ involves important philosophical questions, for instance the issue of ethical obligations towards future generations, quantification over ‘future contingent objects’ etc. However, this entry is confined to the study of future contingent statements.

The problem of future contingents is interwoven with a number of issues in theology, philosophy, logic, semantics of natural language, computer science, and applied mathematics. The theological issue of how to reconcile the assumption of God's foreknowledge with the freedom and moral accountability of human beings has been a main impetus to the discussion and a major inspiration to the development of various logical models of time and future contingents. This theological issue is connected with the general philosophical question of determinism versus indeterminism. Within logic, the relation between time and modality must be studied and various models satisfying various assumptions with respect to the structure of time must be developed and investigated. The project of formal semantics for natural languages also has to address the problem of how to ascribe a correct semantics to statements about the future. Finally, it should be mentioned that temporal logic has found a remarkable application in computer science and applied mathematics. In the late 1970s the first computer scientists realised the relevance of temporal logic for the purposes of computer science (see Hasle and Øhrstrøm 2004).

In the present context the issue of future contingents will be approached from the viewpoint of philosophical logic with due consideration to philosophical-theological origins.

1. The Discussion of Future Contingency and Its Background in Ancient and Medieval Logic

Future contingents appear to hold a strange quality when compared with present or past tense statements, such as “it is raining” or “Napoleon lost at Waterloo”, whose truth-value does not depend on future states or events. For it seems straightforward to claim that the latter two sentences are true if and only if the states or events in question correspond with reality. But can it make sense to claim that the truth or falsity of a contingent future statement, such as “The first human being to set foot on Mars will be a woman”, depends on the future reality in a similar manner? Clearly, this can only make sense if we can meaningfully refer to the future reality in the same way as we can refer to the past reality. However, if the future is open such a reference will certainly be very problematic.

The philosophical and logical challenge to which the future contingency discussion gives rise is two-fold. First of all, anyone who wants to maintain some kind of indeterminism regarding the future, may be confronted with some standard arguments in favor of logical determinism, i.e., arguments designed to demonstrate that there are no future contingents at all. In addition, anyone who holds that there are future contingents can be challenged to establish a reasonable truth-theory compatible with the idea of an open future. Such a theory should provide answers to questions like: Can one meaningfully regard future contingents as true or false now, if the future is open? And if so, how? Can assertions about the contingent future make any sense at all? And if so, how? Some logicians have held that no future contingent is true. However, other logicians have found that this is unacceptable. Instead, they have looked for a theoretical basis on which we might hold that a future contingent is true (or false).

Already Aristotle (384–322 B.C.E.) was aware of the problem of future contingents. Chapter IX of his work, On Interpretation, is without doubt the philosophical text which has had the greatest impact on the debate about the relations between time, truth, and possibility. The discussion in this text certainly bears witness to the fact that Ancient philosophy was highly conscious of tense-logical problems. Central to the discussion in this famous Aristotelian text is the question of how to interpret the following two statements:

“Tomorrow there will be a sea-battle”
“Tomorrow there will not be a sea-battle”

Aristotle considered questions like: Should we say that one of these statements is true today and the other false? How can we make a clear distinction between what is going to happen tomorrow and what must happen tomorrow? (See On Interpretation, 18 b 23 ff.).

The interpretative problems regarding Aristotle's logical problem about the sea-battle tomorrow are by no means simple. Over the centuries, many philosophers and logicians have formulated their interpretations of the Aristotelian text (see Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995, p. 10 ff.). In the following we shall present an interpretation of the text from the scholastic period and a modern interpretation based on a three-valued semantics.

In the generation after Aristotle, Diodorus Cronus (ca. 340–280 B.C.E.) analysed similar problems using his so-called Master Argument. This argument was a trilemma. According to Epictetus, Diodorus argued that the following three propositions cannot all be true:

(D1) Every proposition true about the past is necessary.
(D2) An impossible proposition cannot follow from (or after) a possible one.
(D3) There is a proposition which is possible, but which neither is nor will be true.

Diodorus used this incompatibility combined with the plausibility of (D1) and (D2) to argue that (D3) is false. Assuming (D1) and (D2) he went on to define the possible as “that which either is or will be true” and the necessary as “that which, being true, will not be false”. In this way his argument seems to have been designed to demonstrate that there cannot be any future contingency at all. However, little is known about the way in which Diodorus used his premises in order to reach the conclusion. The reconstruction of the Master Argument certainly constitutes a genuine problem within the history of logic. Various philosophers and logicians have tried to reconstruct the argument as it might have been. It is very likely that the main structure of the argument was close to the argument presented in the next section. (See (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995, p. 15 ff.) and (Gaskin 1995) for references to the literature on the Master Argument.)

The discussion took on a particularly interesting form in the Middle Ages. During the Middle Ages logicians related their discipline to theology. One of the most important theological questions was the problem of the contingent future in relation to Christian doctrine. According to Christian tradition, divine foreknowledge comprises knowledge of the future choices to be made by men and women. But this assumption apparently gives rise to a straightforward argument from divine foreknowledge to the necessity of the future: if God already now knows which decision I will make tomorrow, then a now-unpreventable truth about my choice tomorrow is already given. My choice, then, appears to be necessary, not free. Hence, there seems to be no basis for the claim that I have a free choice between genuine alternatives. This conclusion, however, violates the idea of human freedom and moral accountability presupposed in much theology (though not all).

The medieval discussion regarding the logic of divine foreknowledge is, from a formal point of view, very close to the classical discussion concerning future contingency. If we add the assumption that necessarily, something is true if and only if it is known to God, then it is easy to see how the discussion regarding the logic of divine foreknowledge is, from a formal point of view, essentially the same discussion as the classical discussion concerning future contingency. This was clearly realised by the medieval logicians.

In his treatise De eventu futurorum, Lavenham (c. 1380) gave a succinct overview over the basic approaches to the problem within scholasticism (see Øhrstrøm 1983, Tuggy 1999). Lavenham considered a central argument leading from God's foreknowledge to the necessity of the future and the lack of proper human freedom. In fact, the various positions on future contingency may be presented as possible reactions to this argument. The main structure of this argument is very close to what is believed to have been the Master Argument of Diodorus Cronus (see Gaskin 1995). It is clear from Lavenham's text that he had some knowledge of this old Stoic or Megaric argument, probably through his reading of Cicero's De Fato. The main idea is to transfer the assumed necessity of the past to the future. In order to make things clearer one might state the argument in terms of yesterday and tomorrow, instead of past and future in general (as Lavenham tends to do). A non-theological version of the argument can be presented in the following way. In this sequence E is some event, which may or may not take place tomorrow (e.g. a sea-battle). Non-E is just a state of affairs without E occurring. E and non-E are supposed to be mutually exclusive.

  1. Either E is going to take place tomorrow or non-E is going to take place tomorrow. (Assumption).
  2. If a proposition about the past is true, then it is now necessary, i.e., inescapable or unpreventable. (Assumption).
  3. If E is going to take place tomorrow, then it is true that yesterday it was the case that E would take place in two days. (Assumption).
  4. If E is going to take place tomorrow, then it is now necessary that yesterday E would take place in two days. (Follows from 2. and 3.).
  5. If it is now necessary that yesterday E would take place in two days, then it is now necessary that E is going to take place tomorrow. (Assumption).
  6. If E is going to take place tomorrow, then E is necessarily going to take place tomorrow. (Follows from 4. and 5.).
  7. If non-E is going to take place tomorrow, then non-E is necessarily going to take place tomorrow. (Follows by the same kind of reasoning as 6.).
  8. Either E is necessarily going to take place tomorrow or non-E is necessarily going to take place tomorrow. (Follows from 1., 6. and 7.).
  9. Therefore, what is going to happen tomorrow is going to happen with necessity. (Follows from 8.).

Lavenham accepted the validity of this argument, and he pointed out that one should consider four possible reactions to it. He presented this classification in a theological context, but it can be translated into non-theological language. Assuming that necessarily, something is true if and only if it is known to God, the four possible reactions in Lavenham's analysis can be listed in the following way:

(a) Accept the above argument (including its premises). Grant that there are no future contingents, i.e., statements about the future are either impossible or necessary.
(b) Deny that if a certain event is going to occur, then it is true that it has always been the case that it would occur.
(c) Deny the following: For any possible event, which might occur at a certain time in the future, either it will be that the event takes place at that future time, or it will be that the event does not take place at that time.
(d) Deny that the past in general is necessary.

Clearly, if we don't want to accept the deterministic conclusion of the above argument, and if the argument is accepted as valid, then we have to question at least one of the premises. Not taking premise 5 into consideration, this leaves us with the premises 1, 2, and 3. According to the reaction (b), premise 3 is rejected. Reaction (c) implies the rejection of premise 1 in the argument. Reaction (d) implies the rejection of premise 2.

Lavenham took option (a) to imply that there is no human freedom. In his understanding (b) would mean that God does not know future contingents. He rejected both (a) and (b) as contrary to the Christian faith.

It seems that Lavenham, like William of Ockham (c. 1287–1347), took Aristotle to hold that propositions about the contingent future are neither true nor false. A number of scholastic logicians favored this Aristotelian view (c), for instance Peter Aureole (c.1280–1322). Lavenham, however, rejected this view. He insisted that future contingents are either true or false now, and that God knows the truth-values of all future contingents. He preferred (d), and he argued that by rejecting the necessity of the past as a general principle the doctrines of free will and God's foreknowledge of the contingent future can be united in a consistent manner. This solution was first formulated by Ockham, although some of its elements can already be found in Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109). It is also interesting that Leibniz (1646–1711) much later worked with a similar idea as a part of his metaphysics. (See Øhrstrøm 1984.)

The most characteristic feature of Lavenham's solution is the concept of the true future. The view is that God possesses certain knowledge not only of the necessary future, but also of the contingent future. This means that among the possible contingent futures there must be one which has a special status, namely that it corresponds to the course of events which is going to happen or take place in the future. This line of thinking may be called the medieval solution, even though other approaches certainly existed. Its justification is partly the observation that the notion of the true future is the specifically medieval contribution to the discussion, and partly that leading medieval logicians regarded this solution as the best one. Lavenham himself called it ‘opinio modernorum’, i.e., the opinion of the modern people. Lavenham argued that the notion of the true future can be maintained together with indeterminism, if the assumption of the necessity of the past is rejected. This will be explained in more detail in sections 2 and 5.

A later contribution by the Jesuit Luis Molina (1535–1600) is relevant for a modern interpretation of the concept of the true future. Molina's ideas have been thoroughly discussed in (Craig 1988). Molina's special contribution is the idea of (God's) middle knowledge, “by which, in virtue of the most profound and inscrutable comprehension of each free will, He saw in His own essence what each such will would do with its innate freedom were it to be placed in this or that or indeed in infinitely many orders of things — even though it would really be able, if it so willed, to do the opposite” (quoted from Craig 1988, p. 175). Craig goes on to explain it as follows: “… whereas by His natural knowledge God knows that, say, Peter when placed in a certain set of circumstances could either betray Christ or not betray Christ, being free to do either under identical circumstances, by His middle knowledge God knows what Peter would do if placed under those circumstances” (Craig 1988, p. 175).

As Lavenham knew, William of Ockham had discussed the problem of divine foreknowledge and human freedom in his work Tractatus de praedestinatione et de futuris contingentibus. (See William of Ockham 1969.) Ockham asserted that God knows the truth or falsity of all future contingents, but he also maintained that human beings can choose between alternative possibilities. In his Tractatus he argued that the doctrines of divine foreknowledge and human freedom are compatible. Richard of Lavenham made a remarkable effort to capture and clearly present the logical features of Ockham's system as opposed to (what was assumed to be) Aristotle's solution, i.e., (c).

In the following section a formal version of the medieval argument for determinism will be presented without theological references. It will be demonstrated that at least two of the premises used in the argument may be questioned. In section 3 we shall present a particularly important framework for the discussion of future contingents known as branching time and its semantics. In sections 4 and 5 we shall see how these possible reactions to the classical argument may be turned into modern truth-theories corresponding to the medieval positions listed above.

2. A Formalisation of the Classical Argument

The argument can be reformulated using the modern (metric) tense logic suggested by A.N. Prior (1914–69) with

F(x) in x time units it will be the case that …”
P(x) x time units ago it was the case that …”
“it is necessary that …”

It should, however, be noted that Prior also often used tense-operators without any reference to time units. He used F for “it will be the case that …” and P for “it has been the case that …”. In terms of these non-metric tense-operators he defined the operators, G and H, as ~F~ and ~P~ respectively. G may be read “it will always be the case that …”, and H may be read “it has always been the case that …”. Using these non-metric tense-operators Prior (1967, p. 32 ff.) even formulated a reconstruction of the Diodorean Master Argument which comes rather close to the classical argument which we shall present in the following.

It is essential to notice that the necessity at stake in the classical argument is a historical necessity. This means that what is not necessary at one moment may become necessary at another moment. Instead of speaking about what is necessary we might – as already hinted at – talk about what is now settled, inevitable, inescapable, or unpreventable.

The argument may be understood as based on the following five principles, where p and q represent arbitrary well-formed statements within the logic:

(P1) F(y)pP(x)F(x)F(y)p
(P2) □(P(x)F(x)pp)
(P3) P(x)p ⊃ □P(x)p
(P4) (□ (pq) ∧ □p) ⊃ □q
(P5) F(x)pF(x)~p

(P1) and (P2) are basic tense-logical claims which can serve as crucial elements in a formalization of the argument mentioned in section 1. (P3) may be labeled the ‘necessity of the past’. (P4) is a theorem well-known from standard modal logic. (P5) may be read as a version of the principle of the excluded middle (‘tertium non datur’), although it does not take the exact form of p ∨ ~p. In order to avoid confusion, we shall use the modified name, ‘future excluded middle’, for (P5).

Let q stand for some atomic statement such that F(y)q is a statement about the contingent future. Formally, then, the argument goes as follows:

(1) F(y)qP(x)F(x)F(y)q (P1)
(2) P(x)F(x)F(y)q ⊃ □P(x)F(x)F(y)q (from (P3))
(3) F(y)q ⊃ □P(x)F(x)F(y)q (from (1) & (2))
(4) □(P(x)F(x)F(y)qF(y)q) (from (P2))
(5) F(y)q ⊃ □F(y)q (from (3), (4), (P4))

Similarly, it is possible to prove

(6) F(y)~q ⊃ □F(y)~q

The second part of the main proof is carried out in the following way:

(7) F(y)qF(y)~q (from (P5))
(8) F(y)q ∨ □F(y)~q (from (5), (6), (7))

Remember now that q may stand for any atomic proposition, including statements about human actions. Therefore, (8) is equivalent to a claim of determinism, i.e., that there are no future contingents. So if one wants to preserve indeterminism, at least one of the above principles (P1–5) has to be rejected.

A.N. Prior constructed two systems showing how that can be done, namely the Peircean system (in which (P1) and (P5) are rejected) and the Ockhamist system (in which (P3) is rejected). Formally, each of these systems offers a basis for the rejection of the claim of determinism as expressed in (8). As we shall see in the next section the same can be said about Jan Łukasiewicz' three-valued semantics, which Prior himself investigated further (see Prior 1953), and which also involves a rejection of (P5). Since Prior, several philosophers have discussed which one of these systems should be accepted, or whether other and more attractive systems dealing with the problem can be constructed. In sections 4 and 5 we shall see how the various solutions to the problem of future contingents can be grouped according to their consequences with respect to (P3) and (P5).

3. Branching Time Semantics

Since Prior's time, it has become a standard to study tense-logical systems in terms of semantical models based on the idea of branching time. This idea was not realised in Prior's early works on temporal logic. Indeed it had not yet been formulated in his Time and Modality (1957), which otherwise marked the major breakthrough of the new logic of time. As an explicit (or formalised) idea, branching time was first suggested to Prior in a letter from Saul Kripke in September 1958. This letter contains an initial version of the idea and a system of branching time, although it was not worked out in details. Kripke, who was then only 17 years old, suggested that we may consider the present as a point of Rank 1, and possible events or states at the next moment as points of Rank 2; for every such possible state in turn, there would be various possible future states at the next moment from Rank 3, the set of which could be labelled Rank 4, and so forth. Kripke wrote:

Now in an indetermined system, we perhaps should not regard time as a linear series, as you have done. Given the present moment, there are several possibilities for what the next moment may be like – and for each possible next moment, there are several possibilities for the next moment after that. Thus the situation takes the form, not of a linear sequence, but of a “tree”… [Letter from Saul Kripke to A.N. Prior, dated September 3, 1958, kept in the Prior Collection at Bodleian Library, Oxford, Box 4]

In this way it is possible to form a tree structure representing the entire set of possible futures expanding from the present (Rank 1) – indeed a set of possible futures can be said to be identified for any state, or node in the tree. In this structure every point determines a subtree consisting of its own present and possible futures. Kripke illustrated this idea in the following way:

Figure 1

In the letter Kripke wrote:

The point 0 (or origin) is the present, and the points 1, 2, and 3 (of rank 2) are the possibilities for the next moment. If the point 1 actually does come to pass, 4, 5, and 6 are its possible successors, and so on. The whole tree then represents the entire set of possibilities for present and future; and every point determines a subtree consisting of its own present and future.

In Prior's opinion the notion of branching time is certainly not unproblematic. After all it is a representation of time in terms of space. The notion seems to involve the idea that the ‘Now’ is moving through the system. Several authors have argued that the picture of a moving point within the branching time system is rather problematic. In fact, this problem of the ‘Now’ as a moving point goes back to Jack Smart (1949). Later it has been debated by Storrs McCall (1976, p. 348, 1995) and Graham Nerlich (1995). Recently MacFarlane has pointed out that there is nothing such a motion could represent, since we have already represented time as one of the spatial dimensions of the tree (MacFarlane 2008, p. 86).

It seems that Prior right from the beginning was aware of the basic conceptual problems involved in the notion of branching time. However, he certainly found this notion useful as long as it is applied carefully. During the 1960s he substantially developed the idea. He worked out the formal details of several different systems, which constitute different and even competing interpretations of the idea of branching time, as we shall see below.

A tense-logical model (TIME,≤,C,TRUE) based on a branching time system is a structure, where (TIME,≤) is a partially ordered set of moments of time, and C is a set of so-called histories or chronicles i.e., maximally ordered linear subsets in (TIME,≤). It is standard procedure how to define ‘=’ and ‘<’ in terms of ‘≤’. The before/after relation, <, is supposed to be irreflexive, asymmetric, transitive and backwards linear. Backwards linearity means “no backwards branching” i.e.

(t1 < t0 ∧ t2 < t0) ⊃ (t1 < t2 ∨ t2 < t1 ∨ t2 = t1)

for all moments of time t0, t1, and t2.

In addition, historical connectedness may be considered as an axiom, i.e., it may be assumed that c1c2 ≠ ∅, for any two chronicles c1 and c2 in the branching time system.

In many branching time models C will just be the set of all maximally ordered linear subsets in (TIME,≤). In such cases C will not be an independent parameter of the model. In other cases, however, there will be some additional restrictions on C, i.e., it will be a proper subset of the set of all maximally ordered linear subsets in (TIME,≤). In some branching time models there will also be introduced a relation of (counterfactually) co-temporaneous moments. Given that such a relation is an equivalence relation, it may give rise to the definition of instants as equivalence classes of co-temporaneous moments.

For any propositional constant, p, and any moment in TIME, t, there is a truth-value, TRUE(p,t). This means that the truth-value of a propositional constant does not vary with the chronicles. The truth-value of a propositional constant depends only on the moment. On this basis the truth-value of any well formed formula (wff) has to be defined recursively. In the following sections we shall see that this can be done in several different ways.

It may, however, be objected that it is problematic to operate with two different kinds of propositions: 1) propositional constants with truth-values that do not vary with the chronicles and 2) other wffs with truth-values that may vary with the chronicles. Thomason (1970, p.280) has pointed out that this distinction means that substitution of propositions in the system will have to be restricted, since we will not be allowed to substitute a propositional constant with an arbitrary wff. Prior was aware of this, but he argued that it is in fact possible to handle a system with restrictions on the substitution-rules. (See Prior 1967, p. 122 ff.)

4. The Solutions Based on Rejection of the Principle of Future Excluded Middle

A truth-theory may involve the rejection of the principle of future excluded middle, (P5), for at least two different reasons:

  1. The theory may imply that future contingents are neither true nor false, but undetermined (typically conceived as a third truth-value).
  2. The theory may be based on the idea that all future contingents are false.

A possible third position would be to maintain that all future contingents are true. Strictly speaking, such a claim does not contradict (P5) as mentioned in section 2, although it does in fact contradict a version of (P5) formulated in terms of an exclusive disjunction. However, from a philosophical point of view, such a claim has had no serious role to play in the debate, even though the assumption of all future contingents being true is in fact what holds in the early tense-logical systems, Kt and Kb, introduced in (Prior 1967, p. 187) and in (Rescher and Urquhart, p. 68 ff.). The problem is that it is highly counter-intuitive to accept both “Tomorrow there will be a sea-battle” and “Tomorrow there will not be a sea-battle” as true now. It seems that if one of these propositions is true now, then the other has to be false. On these grounds, we shall not consider this possibility any further in this context.

In the two following subsections, we shall briefly consider some solutions corresponding to the possibilities 1 and 2 mentioned above.

4.1 Jan Łukasiewicz' Three-valued Semantics

In a series of articles during the 1920s and 30s the Polish logician Jan Łukasiewicz (1878–1956) advocated a particular interpretation of Aristotle's discussion of the status of sentences about the contingent future, as developed in his sea-battle example. Łukasiewicz' interpretation crucially rests on a rejection of the principle of bivalence. In fact, this kind of interpretation was not new, but had been formulated already by the Epicureans. However, Łukasiewicz presented this position more clearly than had ever been done before, and developed it with the aid of modern symbolic logic. He used his interpretation of Aristotle and the status of sentences about the contingent future as an argument against logical determinism and in favor of logical indeterminism, for which he declared his wholehearted support. In order to avoid determinism, he found it necessary to restrict the validity of bivalence by introducing a third truth-value. This truth-value, ‘undetermined’, is applied to contingent propositions regarding the future (McCall 1967, p. 64). For instance, a proposition stating that there will be a sea-battle tomorrow can be assigned the truth-value undetermined today. This is because today it is not given or definitely determined whether the sea-battle is actually going to take place tomorrow or not.

It is an important property of Łukasiewicz' three-valued logic that the truth-value of the disjunction of two undetermined propositions is undetermined, i.e., (pq) is undetermined for p undetermined and q undetermined. This may be based on the observation that since p ≡ (pp), a disjunction of two undetermined propositions has to be undetermined. If p is undetermined, ~p is also undetermined. It follows that (p ∨ ~p) is undetermined for p undetermined. This problem also occurs for future contingents such as F(x)q and F(x)~q. According to Łukasiewicz' trivalent logic: if F(x)q and F(x)~q are two future contingents, i.e., if they are both undetermined, then the same will be the case for the disjunction of the two statements, F(x)qF(x)~q. This means that the theory leads to the rejection of the principle of (P5).

In general, it does not seem possible to solve the problem of future contingents in terms of three-valued semantics in a satisfactory manner if the logic is truth-functional, i.e., if the truth-value of any proposition used in the logic is determined by the truth-values of its parts. As argued by Prior (1953, p. 326) it will not help to change the truth-tables to something different from Łukasiewicz' model. As long as the model or theory is truth-functional, it is obvious that the two disjunctions (F(x)q ∨ ~F(x)q) and (F(x)qF(x)q) will have the same truth-value. From an intuitive and common sense point of view, this is not satisfactory, since (F(x)q ∨ ~F(x)q) is clearly true, whereas (F(x)qF(x)q) is undetermined, given that F(x)q is undetermined.

Łukasiewicz' interpretation of the Aristotelian text was disputed by Prior (1962, p.240 ff.), who pointed out that there is a significant difference between Łukasiewicz' trivalent logic and Aristotle's text. Prior pointed out that according to Aristotle it is true already today, that either there will or there will not be a sea-battle tomorrow, whereas this disjunction, as just mentioned, is undetermined according to Łukasiewicz' trivalent logic.

4.2 The Peircean Solution

The solution Prior himself favored is based on so-called Peircean models. Prior demonstrated that the semantics of these models can be presented in two different ways. In the following we shall concentrate on the first of these possibilities, but also comment briefly on the other possible approach to the Peircean solution.

In order to define the Peircean models according to Prior's first attempt, it is assumed that there is a valuation function, TRUE, which gives a truth-value (0 or 1) for any propositional constant at any moment in TIME. On this basis, the valuation function of a Peircean model, Peirce(t,c,p) can be defined recursively for any wff p, any moment of time t and any chronicle c with tc:

(a) Peirce(t,c, p) = 1 iff TRUE(p,t) = 1, where p is any propositional constant.
(b) Peirce(t,c, pq) = 1 iff both Peirce(t,c,p) = 1 and Peirce(t,c,q)  = 1
(c) Peirce(t,c,~p) = 1 iff not Peirce(t,c,p) = 1
(d) Peirce(t,c,Fp)  = 1 iff for all c′ with tc′ there is some t′ ∈ c′ with t < t′ such that Peirce(t′,c′,p) = 1
(e) Peirce(t,c,Pp) = 1 iff Peirce(t′,c,p) = 1 for some t′ ∈ c with t′ < t
(f) Peirce(t,c,◊p) = 1 iff Peirce(t,c′,p)  = 1 for some c′ with tc

Strictly speaking, (a) – (f) do not define the function Peirce. These conditions only explain when Peirce has the value 1. However, here and in all models below we assume that the valuation function has the range {0,1}. The value is 0, if it does not follow from the recursive definition that it is 1.

In the Peircean system another future operator corresponding to the notion of ‘possible future’ may also be defined, i.e.,

(g) Peirce(t,c,fp) = 1 iff Peirce(t′,c′,p) = 1 for some c′ with tc′ and some t′ ∈ c′ with t < t

In addition, G may de defined as ~f~ and g as ~F~. In this way the Peircean system comprises four different future-oriented operators (f, g, F, G).

It should also be mentioned that we can define the necessity operator, □, in the usual manner, i.e., as ~ ◊ ~.

Peirce(t,c,q) = 1 can be read ‘q is true at t in the chronicle c’. A formula q is said to be Peirce-valid if and only if Peirce(t,c,q) = 1 for any t in any c in any branching time structure (TIME,≤,C) and any valuation function TRUE.

To obtain a metric version of the Peircean system, a duration function has to be added. Let dur(t1,t2,x) stand for the statement ‘t1 is x time units before t2’, where t1 and t2 belong to the same chronicle, and were x is a positive number[2]. Using this function (d) and (e) above are replaced by:

(d′) Peirce(t,c,F(x)p) = 1 iff for all c′ with tc′ there is some t′ ∈ c′ with dur(t,t′,x) such that Peirce(t′,c′,p) = 1
(e′) Peirce(t,c,P(x)p) = 1 iff Peirce(t′,c,p) = 1 for some t′ ∈ c with dur(t′,t,x)

Given the truth clauses (a) – (e), the modality introduced in (f) is rather trivial. For instance it follows that

F(x)q ⊃ □F(x)q

is a Peirce-valid formula. This means that a statement about the future is true in the Peircean sense only if it is true in all possible futures, i.e., only if it has to be the case. It follows that if F(x)q is a future contingent, it will be false according to the theory. The same will be the case for F(x)~q. For this reason


will also be false. So the principle of future excluded middle, (P5), is not a thesis in the system.

It may be objected that the use of the parameter c is not really needed in the definition of the Peirce-function. Clearly, it has no role to play neither in (a) – (e) nor in (g). The parameter is in fact used in (f), but this may be said to be rather unimportant, since as indicated above necessity is in fact incorporated in the Peircean notion of future. Based on such considerations Prior (1967, p. 132 ff.) showed that the Peircean models may in fact be defined in terms of a simpler Peirce-function without any reference to the parameter c (i.e. the chronicles), if it is assumed that (f) can be left out of the Peircean system in question. The main advantage of keeping the extended formalism, is that it facilitates its comparison with the system to be presented in section 5.1.

According to the Peircean system the future should simply be identified with the necessary future. More precisely, to say something about the future is to say something about the necessary future. Although the identification of the future with the necessary future makes the position counter-intuitive, A.N. Prior and many of his followers favored this possibility. The reason is that Prior strongly believed in free choice and held that this freedom is essential for the understanding of the very notion of future. According to Prior nobody (not even God) can know what a person will freely choose, before the person has made his or her choice. So whatever could make a statement about a future choice by some free agent true now? From Prior's point of view, nothing. Hence, such statements must be false. In his Some Free Thinking about Time, Prior maintained that “if something is the work of a free agent, then it wasn't going to be the case until that agent decided that it was” (Copeland 1996, p.48).

Consider the consequences of (d′) and (e′) when applied to the following model:

Figure 2

In this case the Peircean position implies that F(y)p is true at t2, whereas F(x)F(y)p is false at t1 and P(x)F(x)F(y)p is consequently false at t2. This means that (P1) must be rejected in this system.

In general the formula


is not Peirce-valid.

It can be concluded that in the Peircean system both (P1) and (P5) must be rejected.

Many researchers have studied the formalities of the Peircean system. Axiomatizations of the non-metrical version of the system can be found in (Burgess 1980) and in (Zanardo 1990).

5. The Solutions Based on the Rejection of the Necessity of the Past

As argued for instance in (Gabbay et al. 2000, p. 65), the Peircean system has some obvious weaknesses, which make the system problematic as a satisfactory candidate for a theory of future contingency. First of all, the system fails to represent many common-sense notions of time, which are arguably reasonable. This is due to the fact that the idea of a plain future as a ‘middle ground’ between possible future and necessary future cannot be expressed in the Peircean system. Suppose I say:

“It will be sunny in London tomorrow”

I do not mean that tomorrow perhaps will be sunny in London, or maybe not; I mean that indeed it will be the case; but on the other hand I do not mean that there is no other option, or that it must be so. One should be aware that in adopting the Peircean system, one would have to consider this everyday intuition illusory — there really is only the ‘possibly’, or the ‘necessarily’ (corresponding to fp and Fp mentioned in the (g) and (d) clauses in section 4.2). In fact, logically speaking, in this system “it will be sunny in London tomorrow” would have to be considered as equivalent to either

“Possibly, it will be sunny in London tomorrow”


“Necessarily, it will be sunny in London tomorrow”.

In addition, it should be noticed that it is a crucial feature of the Pericean system that the expressions F(x)~q and ~F(x)q are non-equivalent. This certainly gives rise to a serious challenge when confronted with everyday intuition. In fact, it is rather difficult to make a clear distinction between the two expressions in terms of natural language. E.g. it is doubtable whether a distinction between “tomorrow it will not be sunny in London” and “it is not the case that tomorrow will be sunny in London” will be accepted as sufficiently clear.

For such reasons many scholars have found it rather problematic to reject (P5). Instead they have focused on systems accepting (P5) but rejecting (P3). In the following we shall consider five such theories.

5.1 Prior's Ockhamist Solution

In Past, Present and Future Prior presented his so-called Ockhamist system, which accepts (P5) but rejects (P3) (see Prior 1967, p. 126 ff.). This system is inspired by some of the ideas formulated by William of Ockham.

As with the Peircean semantics, it is assumed that there is a truth-function, TRUE, which gives a truth-value (0 or 1) for any propositional constant at any moment in TIME. On this basis, the valuation function of an Ockhamist model, Ock(t,c,p) can be defined recursively for any wff p, any moment of time t, and any chronicle c with tc:

(a) Ock(t,c,p) = 1 iff TRUE(p,t) = 1, where p is any propositional constant.
(b) Ock(t,c,pq) = 1 iff both Ock(t,c,p) = 1 and Ock(t,c,q) = 1
(c) Ock(t,c,~p) = 1 iff not Ock(t,c,p) = 1
(d) Ock(t,c,Fp) = 1 iff Ock(t′,c,p) = 1 for some t′ ∈ c with t < t
(e) Ock(t,c,Pp) = 1 iff Ock(t′,c,p) = 1 for some t′ ∈ c with t′ < t
(f) Ock(t,c,◊p) = 1 iff Ock(t,c′,p) = 1 for some c′ ∈ C(t)

Here C(t) is defined as the set of chronicles through t, i.e., C(t) = {c| tc}.

We define the dual operators, H, G, and □ in the usual manner as ~P~, ~F~, and ~ ◊ ~ respectively.

Ock(t,c,p) = 1 can be read ‘p is true at t in the chronicle c’. A formula p is said to be Ockham-valid if and only if Ock(t,c,p) = 1 for any t in any c in any branching time structure, (TIME,≤,C) and any valuation function TRUE. Here C should not be taken as an independent parameter. In this case C is just the set of all maximally ordered linear subsets in (TIME,≤). Furthermore, it should be noted that relative to a single chronicle, (a) – (e) are exactly the same definitions as those used in linear tense-logic (i.e. the tense-logic which follows if (TIME,≤) is a linear structure).

Prior himself did not accept the view represented in the Ockhamist system, but as many later researchers he was interested in the exploration of the system. It should be mentioned that the basic views held by Belnap et al. (2001) are in fact rather close to Priorean Ockhamism, although there are certainly many further developments of the theory in Belnap's philosophical writings on the subject (Belnap 1992, 2001, 2003, 2005). Belnap has strongly emphasized the distinction between what he calls ‘plain truth’ and ‘settled truth’. Whereas plain truth corresponds to the branch-dependent truth used in the Ockhamistic model, settled truth will be branch-independent, i.e., truth at a moment of time. It should also be pointed out that in the definition of Ock, only (d) differs from the corresponding Peircean definition. In fact, Prior (1967, p.130) has pointed out that the Peircean system may be seen as a fragment of the Ockhamistic system in which F does not occur except as immediately preceded by an necessity operator.

To obtain a metric version of the Ockhamist system, a duration function has to be added. Let dur(t1,t2,x) stand for the statement ‘t1 is x time units before t2’. Using this formalism, (d) and (e) are replaced by:

(d′) Ock(t,c,F(x)p) = 1 iff Ock(t′,c,p) = 1 for some t′ ∈ c with dur(t,t′,x)
(e′) Ock(t,c,P(x)p) = 1 iff Ock(t′,c,p) = 1 for some t′ ∈ c with dur(t′,t,x)

It can be verified that neither P(x)q ⊃ □P(x)q nor Pq ⊃ □Pq are Ockham-valid for all q. Let for instance q stand for F(y)p. It is easy to verify that P(x)F(y)p ⊃ □P(x)F(y)p will not in general hold in an Ockhamistic branching time model. This may be illustrated using the following diagram, in which it is easily seen that Ock(t, c1, P(x)F(y)p) = 1, whereas Ock(t, c1, □P(x)F(y)p) = 0 since Ock(t, c2, P(x)F(y)p) = 0.

Figure 3

This does away with (P3) in the formal version of the medieval argument discussed above. Still, both formulas, P(x)q ⊃ □P(x)q and Pq ⊃ □Pq, will hold if the truth of q does not depend on what the future brings.

If (P3) does not hold in general, one may reject (2) in the argument in section 2. According to Ockham, (P3) (that is, its verbal analogue as he could formulate it with the means then available) should only be accepted for statements which are genuinely about the past, i.e., which do not depend on the future. According to this view, (P3) may be denied precisely because the truth of statements like P(x)F(x)F(y)q has not been settled yet — since they depend on the future.

In this way, one can make a distinction between “soft facts” and “hard facts” regarding the past (see Plantinga 1986). Following the Ockhamist position, a statement like P(x)q would correspond to a hard fact, if q does not depend on the future, whereas statements like P(x)F(x)F(y)q would represent soft facts. Critics of the Ockhamist position, however, may still say that if F(x)F(y)q was true x time units ago, then there must have been something making it true at that time, and that something must have been a hard fact. On the other hand, supporters of the position hold that it is fully conceivable and acceptable that what makes a statement true could also be a soft fact, i.e., something which depends on the future.

The rationality of Ockham's suggestion according to which future happenings can (in a very limited sense) influence the past, has been defended by Alvin Plantinga (1986). It should also be mentioned that Ockham's theory is relevant for the conceptual analysis of the idea of prophecy (see the entry on prophecy).

However, it may be disputed that Prior's Ockhamist system fits the ideas formulated by William of Ockham completely. Although many of Ockham's original ideas are satisfactorily modelled in Prior's Ockhamist system, Prior's system lacks a proper representation of the notion of ‘the true future’. This was in fact one of the most basic ideas in Ockham's world view. Ockham believed that there is truth (or falsity) also of statements about the contingent future, which human beings cannot know, but which God knows. Prior's Ockhamist system cannot be said to include more than the idea of a proposition being true relative to a moment of time and a chronicle. A proper theory in accordance with William of Ockham's ideas would have to include the idea of a proposition being true relative to a moment of time (without any specification of a chronicle). Let us therefore investigate a truth-theory which includes the idea of a true future in this sense.

5.2 The Leibnizian Theory

An alternative approach to the semantics for future contingents is inspired by the works of Leibniz and has been called a Leibnizian semantics (see Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995). According to this view the set of possible histories is not seen as a traditional tree structure, but as a system of ‘parallel lines’. On the set of ‘parallel lines’ a relation corresponding to qualitative identity up to a certain instant is defined. In such a model it will be straightforward to introduce truth-values for future contingents.

The idea can be introduced in terms of Prior's Ockhamistic model. As mentioned above any maximally ordered linear subset in (TIME,≤) will be accepted as a chronicle in the Ockhamistic model. However, in the Leibnizian model only some of these subsets will be accepted as chronicles, although the union of all chronicles will still be the full set TIME, i.e., any moment will belong to at least one Leibnizian chronicle. The set of ‘parallel lines’ in the system may just be a subset of the set of all chronicles considered in the Ockhamistic model. Formally, each temporal moment in the Leibnizian semantics corresponds to a pair of a moment of time, m, and a chronicle, c, with mc. This means that any Leibnizian time can be written as a structured formal object temp(m,c), where mc. The Leibnizian valuation function can be defined in terms of Prior's Ockhamistic model in the following way:

Leib(temp(m,c),p) = Ock(m,c,p)

Formally, this means that in the Leibnizian semantics the truth-value of a proposition only depends on the Leibnizian time. According to this semantics (P3) is obviously not valid in general.

A semantics introduced in this manner also fits with models defined in terms of so-called bundled trees (see Zanardo 2003), and it is similar to the approach taken by David K. Lewis in his On the Plurality of Worlds (1986).

On the Leibnizian view pP(x)F(x)p holds, whereas pP(x)□F(x)p does not hold. This may be illustrated in the following way:

Figure 4



This diagram illustrates that chronicles may be represented as parallel lines up to a certain temporal instant (containing both t1 = temp(m1,c) and t1′ = temp(m1,c′)), from where they diverge. Until the ‘branching point’ the chronicles are indistinguishable.

According to a Leibnizian semantics propositions without modal operators, such as pP(x)F(x)p, will have to be evaluated within the sub-model defined by the chronicle (i.e., in fact a linear model). The point is that to determine the truth-value of a formula without modals at a Leibnizian time defined as t = temp(m,c), one need not look at other chronicles than c if the evaluation is going to take place on the basis of Leibnizian semantics. However, in the above model the proposition p ⊃ P(x)□F(x)p will not be true at t2 = temp(m2,c) since even if p is true at t2 and t1 = temp(m1,c) is a time x time units earlier earlier than t2, the proposition □F(x)p will be false at t1, since there is a co-temporal moment t1′ at which F(x)p is false.

From a formal point of view the semantics of the Leibnizian theory may be seen as an alternative interpretation of the semantics of the Ockhamist theory with the only difference that in the Leibnizian theory not all maximal linear subsets have to be accepted as proper chronicles in the model.

Some philosophers have argued that the Leibnizian theory at least in some cases seem to be more plausible from an intuitive point of view than the Ockhamistic theory. The reason is that there exist some rather intricate propositions which some hold to be intuitively invalid, which they are according to the Leibnizian theory, although they are valid according to the Ockhamist theory. One such example can be given in terms of these two statements:

p1: “Inevitably, if today there is life on earth, then either this is the last day (of life on earth), or the last day will come.”
p2: “At any possible day on which there is life on earth, it is possible that there will be life on earth the following day.”

Hirokazu Nishimura (1979) has argued that if time is assumed to be discrete, then an Ockhamist cannot consistently accept the conjunction of p1 and p2, whereas a Leibnizian can maintain such a view without contradicting himself. The purpose of the following figure is to clarify the difference between these two views.

Figure 5

As indicated in the above figure, an infinite number of ovals named i1, i2, i3, i4,… represent a series of instants i.e., equivalence classes of co-temporaneous moments, as mentioned in section 3. The cronicles are named c1, c2, c3, c4,… . For n∈{1,2,3,4,…} the moment corresponding to in on cn will be the last day of life on earth. The totality of this infinity of chronicles represents the acceptance of p1. At the last day on each of these chronicles, cj, it would in fact be possible that life on earth could have continued yet another day. This is evident because of the existence in the model of cj+1. Taken together this means that the statement p2 holds at any possible day in the model. This is what a Leibnizian would say. However, an Ockhamist would say, that given this model it would be possible to construct a chronicle c*, as shown on the above figure for which the last day of life on earth would never come. According to the Leibnizian, this construction of c* may not be permitted at all, since c* may in fact be a maximal linear subset which does not belong to C.

The point is that in the Ockhamist semantics, any maximal linear subset of TIME is accepted as a chronicle. In the Leibnizian semantics, the set of chronicles is an independent parameter. In a Leibnizian model, any subset of the set of all maximal linear subsets could be accepted as the set of chronicles, C, as long as all moments in TIME belong to at least one chronicle.

Belnap et al. have argued that it is implausible to assume that there could be some property which could “justify treating some maximal chains as real possibilities and others as not” (Belnap et al. 2001, p. 205). On the other hand, Nishimura's example is in fact a rather remarkable argument suggesting that not all maximal chains have to be accepted as chronicles in the semantics for future contingents. The example also speaks in favor of the view that the Leibnizian theory is more plausible than Prior's Ockhamistic theory, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995, p. 268).

The Leibnizian and Prior's Ockhamistic views seem to be very similar, and most differences between them seem to be nuances of metaphysical interpretation. In fact, the Leibnizian way of introducing truth-values for future contingents seems somewhat tricky. It should also be mentioned that if the idea of chronicles as ‘parallel lines’ is taken seriously, then there is no proper branching in the Leibnizian model. For this reason, it can be argued that this model is incompatible with objective indeterminism, since the alternative lines should not be counted as proper possibilities, see e.g. (MacFarlane 2003, p. 325). On the other hand, it may be argued that all the conceivable chronicles in the Leibnizian model represent logical possibilities. Obviously, only some of them are chosen, but from a logical point of view any of them could in principle have been chosen. Still, it may be objected that the Leibnizian model is rather sophisticated and speculative, and that it may be more attractive to look for other ways of defining “truth at a moment of time”.

5.3 The True Futurist Theory: The Thin Red Line

The medieval assumption of the true future can in terms of modern logic and a branching time model be rendered as meaning that there is a privileged branch (i.e., a specific chronicle) in the model. If b is this privileged branch, then the truth-value of a proposition, p, at a moment of time, t, may be defined in terms of the Ockhamistic valuation function as Ock(t,b,p). This solution has been studied in (Øhrstrøm 1981). Consider, for instance, the following model, in which the arrows indicate the true future at any moment.

Figure 6

In this model, F(x)q is true at t2 and F(x+y)q is true at t1, although none of the propositions are necessary, since F(x)~q is possible at t2. The reason why F(x)q is true at t2 is just that the evaluation of a proposition according to the true futurist theory should be based on the specified branch through t2 representing ‘the future’ at t2 within the model. However, as we shall see in the following, it turns out that the idea of a specified branch at every moment can be integrated into the semantics in several ways. But first of all some comments on the very idea of a specified branch.

What makes the specified branch privileged? Is it just that it represents what is going to happen? Is there anything in the present situation, t2, which makes one branch ontologically special as opposed to the other branches? It might be tempting to refer to some sort of a ‘wait-and-see’ status of the privileged branch, since we have no way of knowing which branch is the specified one representing ‘the future’ except by waiting.

Some authors have held that the idea of a privileged branch is incompatible with indeterminism. Hence Rich Thomason (1970, 1984) has argued that from an indeterministic point of view no special branch deserves to be called the true future. Of course, the problem is what exactly the idea of indeterminism implies. According to MacFarlane, it is problematic to give one future branch a special status, if we want to hang on to objective indeterminism regarding the future (MacFarlane 2003, p. 325). On the other hand, although the true futurist theory does contain some intricate notions, it has not been shown to be inconsistent, and a supporter of the theory may still hold that the theory correctly explains what reality is like. It should be borne in mind that true futurist theory was introduced exactly to avoid what many have held to be counter-intuitive tenets, e.g. that all future contingents are false now (the Peircean view), or that they have no chronicle-independent truth-values now (the Ockhamistic view). Therefore, it should be carefully considered which approach ultimately leads to the fewest problems.

According to Belnap and Green a true futurist theory should include the idea that at any moment of time – including any counterfactual moment – there is a true future, a so-called ‘thin red line’ (Belnap and Green 1994), passing through that moment. Formally, this means that there must be a function, TRL, which gives the true future for any moment of time, t. More precisely, TRL(t) yields the linear past as well as the true future of t, extended to a maximal set.[3]

In fact, the idea of adding a function like TRL to the semantical model had earlier been suggested by (McKim and Davis 1976) and by (Thomason and Gupta 1980). But unlike Belnap and Green these authors did not name the function in any spectacular way.

It would of course be fatal for the true futurist theory if it could be demonstrated that it contradicts assumptions which we for other reasons should accept. Belnap and Green (1994) have argued that there are in fact such fundamental problems related to the true futurist picture. They have argued that it is not sufficient for the model to specify a preferred branch corresponding to the true history (past, present, and future): it must be assumed that there is a preferred branch at every counterfactual moment. They have illustrated their view using the following statement:

“The coin will come up heads. It is possible, though that it will come up tails, and then later it will come up tails again (though at this moment it could come up heads), and then, inevitably, still later it will come up tails yet again.” (Belnap & Green 1994, p. 379)

This statement may be represented in terms of tense logic with τ representing tails and η heads, respectively:

F(1)η ∧ ◊F(1)(τ ∧ ◊F(1)ηF(1)(τ ∧ □F(1)τ))

and in terms of the following branching time structure:

Figure 7

The example shows that if we want to take this kind of everyday reasoning into account, we need to be able to speak not only about the future, but also about what would be the future at any counterfactual moment. As mentioned above this is formally done in terms of the TRL-function. But what are the constraints on this function? Belnap and Green have argued that:

(TRL1)   tTRL(t)

should hold in general. Moreover, they have also maintained that:

(TRL2)   t1 < t2TRL(t1) = TRL(t2)

should hold for the TRL-function. On the other hand, they have argued that the combination of (TRL1) and (TRL2) is inconsistent with the very idea of branching time. The reason is that if (TRL1) and (TRL2) are both accepted, it follows from t1 < t2 that t2 ∈ TRL(t1) i.e., that all moments of time after t1 would have to belong to the thin red line through t1, which means that there will in fact be no branching at all. However, it is very hard to see why a true futurist would have to accept (TRL2), which seems to be too strong a requirement. Rather than (TRL2), the weaker condition (TRL2′) can be employed:

(TRL2′)   (t1 < t2t2TRL(t1)) ⊃ TRL(t1) = TRL(t2)

This seems to be much more natural in relation to the notion of a true futurist branching time logic. Belnap has later accepted that (TRL2′) is a plausible alternative to (TRL2) (see Belnap et al. 2001, p. 169).

We can inductively define a chronicle-independent valuation function, using TRUE, which as mentioned in section 4.2 gives a truth-value (0 or 1) for any propositional constant at any moment in TIME, and using the TRL-function. On this basis, the valuation function, T(t,p) can be defined recursively for any wff p, and any moment of time t:

(a) T(t, p) = 1 iff TRUE(p,t) = 1, where p is any propositional constant.
(b) T(t, pq) = 1 iff both T(t,p) = 1 and T(t,q) = 1
(c) T(t,~p) = 1 iff not T(t,p) = 1
(d) T(t,Pq) = 1 iff there is some t′ with t′<t and T(t′,q) = 1
(e) T(t,Fq) = 1 iff there is some t′ ∈ TRL(t) with t<t′ and T(t′,q) = 1

T(t,q) = 1 can be read ‘q is true at t’. As in section 4.2 the valuation function has the range {0,1}. A formula q is said to be T-valid if and only if T(t,q) = 1 for any t in any branching time structure (TIME,≤,C), any valuation function TRUE, and any TRL-function defined on TIME.

This means that sentences only involving tenses are what Belnap (in honor of Carnap) has called ‘moment-determinate’ (Belnap 1991, p. 163), indicating that their truth-value doesn′t vary with the chronicle. The advantage of this view is that it corresponds with everyday reasoning and natural language understanding as it is most commonly conceived.

As in sections 4.2 and 5.1, it is possible to extend the language in order to take metrical notions into consideration:

T(t,P(x)q) = 1 iff t′: dur(t′,t,x) & T(t′,q) = 1
T(t,F(x)q) = 1 iff t′: dur(t,t′,x) & t′ ∈ TRL(t) & T(t′,q) = 1

Belnap and Green have argued that the constraints on the TRL-function should give rise to a logic in which the following theorems hold:

(T1)   PPqPq

(T2)   FFqFq

(T3)   qPFq

If we accept the constraints (TRL1) and (TRL2′), and use the above recursive definition of the valuation function T(t,p), we obtain a semantics according to which (T1) and (T2) are valid.

However, with the semantics presented above, (T3) will not be valid. To see why this is the case, consider a situation with a moment of time t1 such that t1TRL(t0) for any t0<t1. Assume that t1 is the only moment at which q is true. Then PFq, hence also qPFq, will be false at t1.

Even the formula

(T3′)   qP(x)F(x)q

is false when evaluated with semantics of this kind.

The rejection of (T3′) can be illustrated by the following diagram, in which the arrow on the upper branch indicates the thin red line. (The vertical line in this diagram represents a set of co-temporaneous moments, i.e., what is sometimes called an instant.)

Figure 8

According to this diagram q holds at the counterfactual moment of time, t. However, as indicated in the diagram F(x)q was false x time units earlier than t, since at that time t′ would be the true future x time units later.

The rejection of (T3) and (T3′) is not the only problem related to a TRL-semantics defined in this way. It should also be pointed out that it is somewhat complicated to state the semantics of modal expressions if we follow this procedure, since it may involve the quantification over possible TRL-functions. This approach has been further investigated in (Braüner et al. 1998).

There is, however, a simpler strategy which makes it possible to ensure the validity of (T3) and (T3′) even if one wants to insist on the assumption of the thin red line. This can be done by defining “true at time t ” in terms of “true at time t and chronicle c”, as it is defined in the Ockhamist semantics:

T(t,p) = Ock(tTRL(t),p)

where p is an arbitrary propositional expression. T(t,p) = 1 can be read ‘p is true at t’. This idea of obtaining a thin red line semantics by introducing a unique historical parameter has been discussed in (MacFarlane 2003, 330–331, cf. n. 10).

As in Prior's Ockhamistic model it is straightforward to introduce metrical tense operators in this system.

As in the Leibniz-theory we should not necessarily assume that all maximal linear subsets in the branching time structure should be taken into account as chronicles in the semantics. It may be reasonable to assume various restrictions regarding the set of chronicles and its use in the semantical model. In fact, it has turned out to be interesting to consider the possibilities of modifying the definition of C(t) used in (f) of the Ock definition in section 5.1.

The following validity definition may be suggested:

(V) A formula p is said to be TRL-valid if and only if Ock(t,TRL(t),p)  = 1 for any t in any branching time structure, (TIME,≤,C), any valuation function TRUE, any definition of C(t) with TRL(t) ∈ C(t) and C(t) ⊆ {cC| tc} for all t, and any TRL-function for which (TRL1) and (TRL2′) hold.

Given this definition it is easily seen that (T1–3) and (T3′) are all TRL-valid. Regarding the interplay between the tense operators and the modal operator, it is straightforward to verify that the following is TRL-valid:

(T4)   F(x)p ⊃ ◊F(x)p

whereas (P3) in section 2 will not be TRL-valid for propositions depending on the future. However, the notion of validity suggested above may also allow for the following definition of C(t), which has been discussed in (Braüner et al. 2000):

C(t) = {c | tc & TRL(t′)=c, for all t′ ∈ c with t < t′}

Note that with this definition (TRL1) and (TRL2′) together say exactly that TRL(t) ∈ C(t). Also note that C(t) may contain more branches than just TRL(t).

However, it should be mentioned that the possibility operator in this model is somewhat surprising. In the obvious metrical extension of the system the following formula is invalidated:

(T5)   F(x)◊F(y)p ⊃ ◊F(x)F(y)p

According to the usual Ockhamist semantics (T5) is valid. The rejection of (T5) in the system presented in (Braüner et al. 2000) may be illustrated with reference to the following model:

Figure 9

Here it is assumed that TRL(t)=c2 for all t on c2 after t2 and that TRL(t)=c3 for all t on c3 after t2. Clearly, this means that C(t2)={c2,c3}. In consequence, the proposition ◊F(y)p holds at t2. This means that F(x)◊F(y)p is true at t1. However, the proposition ◊F(x)F(y)p is false at t1, since c2 is not included in C(t1). According to the definition, C(t1) should include exactly the chronicles which pass through t1 and which immediately after t1 are specified by the TRL-function. This means that C(t1)={c1,c3}, and then (T5) turns out to be false at t1.

This rejection of (T5) amounts to the following idea: a chronicle may not be available as a possibility now, although it may later become available. That is, new possibilities may show up.

This example illustrates that true futurist logics satisfying requirements which correspond to Belnap's and Green's semantical criteria may differ significantly from Prior's Ockhamism. Even if we assume that (T1–4) should be valid and that (TRL1) and (TRL2′) should hold, we cannot be sure that (T5) is valid. On the other hand, some might of course intuitively find (T5) just as plausible as (T1–4), for which reason they would insist on a definition of C(t) according to which (T5) is valid. This, of course, means that the validity notion in (V) should be modified introducing further restrictions on the acceptable definitions of C(t). In order to ensure the validity of (T5) one might require that C(t′) ⊆ C(t) for all t and t′ with t <t′. Another possibility is of course to insist on the Ockhamistic definition of C(t), i.e., C(t) = {c | t ∈ c}, in which case TRL-validity would give the same result as Ockham-validity.

It should be added that although it is still an open question how TRL-validity should be defined, this uncertainty does not influence the most important property of the true futurist theory, i.e., the fact that it suggests a semantical definition of what it means for a future contingent to be true. Given a TRL-function, this definition works even at counterfactual moments of time. In this way, the introduction of the TRL-function may be seen as a formalization of Molina's notion of middle knowledge mentioned in section 1.

5.4 The Supervaluationist Theory

Some logicians have argued that the notion of true future is unacceptable on philosophical grounds or that it is at least unnecessary, since it is possible to establish a semantic model accepting (P5) but rejecting (P3) without involving any idea of a true future. Richmond H. Thomason (1970, 1981, 1984) has formulated a theory based on so-called supervaluations. According to this theory a proposition p is true at a moment t if and only if it is true at t for every chronicle c passing through t, and a proposition p is false if and only if it is false for every chronicle c passing through t. Formally speaking, we may again use the Ock-function to recursively define truth at a moment t and a chronicle c. Then we may define truth at a moment of time by supervaluating. This means that p is true at t if and only if Ock(t,c,p) = 1 for all c with t ∈ c. Future contingent propositions will not meet that condition, nor will their negations, so they are considered neither true nor false. They are ‘indeterminate’ in the sense that they lack truth-values.

This theory allows the supervaluationist to reject (P3) and to accept future excluded middle, (P5), without accepting the idea of ‘the thin red line’ or ‘the true future’. It should be pointed out, however, that although this theory implies a rejection of (P3), it does in fact accept a related inference principle i.e., if P(x)p is true at a certain moment of time, t, then □P(x)p will also be true at t.

Thomason has shown that the supervaluation theory can in fact meet some of the basic challenges related to the future contingents. He has also shown that the theory can be extended in such a way that it may also incorporate deontic logic i.e., the logic of moral obligation (Thomason 1981, pp. 165 ff.). A crucial question for this approach is, however, whether the idea of truth-value gaps for future contingents is philosophically acceptable. In other words, is it acceptable that some well-formed propositions simply lack truth-values?

A distinctive feature of Thomason's theory is that the usual truth-functional technique breaks down. For instance, if F(1)p is a future contingent, then F(1)p and F(1)~p are both ‘indeterminate’, but the conjunction F(1)pF(1)~p will be false and the disjunction F(1)pF(1)~p will be true. It may be objected that it seems odd that a disjunction could be true when neither of the disjuncts is true, and a conjunction false when neither of the conjuncts is false.

5.5 Relativist Theory

Recently John MacFarlane (2003, 2008) has suggested a new approach to the problem of future contingents. Like Nuel Belnap et al. (2001), MacFarlane challenges the classical notion that the truth-value of a statement or proposition should be determined solely with respect to the context (including the moment) of utterance. He also agrees with Belnap and Green in rejecting the idea of the true future (i.e., the thin red line). But unlike Belnap, MacFarlane does not want to give up all talk of truth in a context. In this way MacFarlane accepts the same definition as Belnap, Green and Thomason of Ock(t,c,p), where t is a moment of time and c is a history (or a chronicle), but differs on “truth at a moment” or “truth at a context”.

According to MacFarlane's theory the truth of a statement should be relativised to both a context of utterance and a context of assessment. The context of utterance is the context in which the speech act is made. The context of assessment is the context in which we assess the speech act. According to the theory, a statement S is true as used in the context C and assessed in the context C′, if and only if S is true at m for every chronicle c passing through m and m′, where m and m′ are moments within the contexts C and C′ with mm′. This means that a statement like “it will be sunny tomorrow” is true as uttered yesterday and assessed from today, given that it is in fact sunny today. But it will not be true assessed from yesterday, given that it was not settled yesterday that today would be sunny.

It turns out that MacFarlane's theory implies an acceptance of the principle of future excluded middle, (P5), and a rejection of the principle of the necessity of the past, (P3). An advocate of the theory (i.e., a relativist) will clearly also agree with supervaluationism in allowing for truth-value gaps. However, in addition a relativist will accept the view that future contingents can be true as assessed from a future context. For criticism of MacFarlane's position see Heck 2006.

6. Conclusion

As we have seen, Lavenham's medieval attempt at systematising the various possible responses to the problem of future contingents gives rise to a classification. This classification is based on the observation that in order to reject the logical argument for determinism we have to reject at least one of the principles, (P3) (necessity of the past) and (P5) (the principle of future excluded middle). It is also clear from Lavenham's analysis that he wanted to focus on the question whether future contingents have determinate truth-values. When formulated in terms of the modern debate, the question is whether future contingents have branch-independent truth-values. Or using Belnap's vocabulary: Is there settled truth about future contingents? Using the reactions on the classical argument mentioned in section 2 and the views on truth-values of future contingents as two classification principles, we may group the solutions considered in the following diagram:

  Some future contingents are neither true nor false All future contingents are either true or false
Rejection of the principle of the necessity of the past (P3) Priorean Ockhamism
(Nuel Belnap)

(Richmond Thomason)

(John MacFarlane)
(Davis Lewis, Alberto Zanardo)

True Futurism
(classical position)
Rejection of the principle of future excluded middle (P5) Three valued logic
(Jan Łukasiewicz)
Priorean Peirceanism
(A.N. Prior)

The classification of Belnap's view in the above diagram is based on the assumption that his ‘settled true’ refers to ‘true’ as it is used in the present context.

Regarding the classification represented in the diagram it should be noted that from a logical point of view the two rows are not mutually exclusive. However, although it would in principle be possible to reject both (P3) and (P5), we do not know any important theory of that kind.

It should also be noted that the theories in the first row all formally make use of the Ockhamist recursive semantics, although they differ in how or whether truth at a moment of time is defined in terms of Ock(t,c,p).

As we have seen, there are ongoing philosophical debates regarding future contingents. There is still a focus on the questions represented in the diagram, but other problems are also discussed. One problem which has attracted much attention is the study of future contingents as seen in relation to branching space-time and various ideas within physics. Here Belnap (1992, 2003, 2005), Müller (2007, Müller et al. 2008), and Placek (2000) have contributed significantly.


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compatibilism | free will | free will: divine foreknowledge and | future contingents: medieval theories of | incompatibilism: (nondeterministic) theories of free will | incompatibilism: arguments for | logic: temporal | Prior, Arthur | prophecy


Thanks to Saul Kripke, Nuel Belnap, Jørgen Albretsen, Torben Braüner, Alex Malpass, Jacek Wawer, and the anonymous reviewers of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for very helpful comments on earlier drafts.